Notes to Pornography and Censorship

1. Apparently, the quotation in fact comes from Beatrice Hall, The Friends of Voltaire, 1986.

2. It is worth noting that not everyone thinks that pornography is properly regarded as a form of speech: intentional acts of communicative expression aimed primarily to express ideas or to communicate opinions to others. Frederick Schauer 1982, for example, thinks that pornography is better viewed as a sex aid. If pornography is not speech or intentional communicative expression, then presumably pornography cannot be defended on free speech grounds. Others have suggested that pornography is speech, but not of a form that is protected by liberal principles. Pornography is not "mentally-intermediated" or "persuasive" speech: pornography does not communicate its ideas in such a way that those ideas can be rationally evaluated or resisted by consumers. (See MacKinnon 1995:11; Sunstein 1986; Scoccia 1996.)

3. Note that this conception of ‘positive freedom’ is different from the classic conception introduced by Berlin 1969, who defines ‘positive freedom’ as freedom from inner constraints such as false consciousness, addiction, unworthy desires and such like.

4.Careful readers may notice that the Mac-Dworkin definition defines ‘pornography’ as the graphic sexually explicit subordination of women, rather than as material that depicts or causes the subordination of women. Whether the former, constitutive claim-that pornography is, in and of itself, the subordination of women-is coherent and defensible has been a matter of controversy. For two excellent discussions, see Vadas, 1987 and Langton 1993, both of whom seek in different ways to defend the coherence of the constitutive claim. See also the reply by Parent 1990.

5.For those interested in some of the legal dimensions of the debate, this was also the attitude that the U.S. Supreme Court took in ruling the Indianapolis Ordinance unconstitutional. Judge Easterbrook said: "We accept the premises of this legislation. Depictions of subordination tend to perpetuate subordination. The subordinate status of women in turn leads to affront and lower pay at work, insult and injury at home, battery and rape on the streets…but…this simply demonstrates the power of pornography as speech." (Judge Easterbrook, 771 F.2nd 329 (7th Cir. 1985)).

6.Of course, the consumption of a specific piece of pornography may be a necessary condition for a particular act of rape. Some anti-pornography feminists point to cases of imitative or "copycat" sexual assaults, where rapists have acted out rape-scenes from the pornography that they have consumed on their real life victims (See MacKinnon 1987:184-186; 188-189; Pornography and Sexual Violence: Evidence of the Links, 1988; Easton 1993: 14-19). In these cases, MacKinnon claims, specific pornography directly causes the sexual assault: the rapist would not have raped in the particular way he did, had he not consumed the specific piece of pornography on which he modelled the rape. MacKinnon may be right. But it might be questioned whether this is relevant, if the rapist would have raped anyway, at some other time and place, whether or not he consumed pornography. For in that case, consumption of pornography would make no difference to the overall incidence of rape.

Copyright © 2012 by
Caroline West <>

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