Notes to Possible Worlds
1. For important applications of possible worlds, see the SEP entries on supervenience, rigid designators, two-dimensional semantics, conditionals, the logic of belief revision, common knowledge, and belief. A particularly illustrative possible worlds analysis of the concept of prudence is found in Bricker 1980.
2. A logic is often (quite legitimately) defined more generally to be a language together with either a semantic theory or some sort of deductive apparatus, as in the definition found in the Encyclopedia entry on classical logic. However, as the distinction between extensional and intensional logics drawn here is a purely semantic one, it is convenient for our purposes to use the more limited, semantically-oriented definition.
3. A word about the corner quotes, or “quasi-quotes”, around the 2-element expressions ‘◇φ’ and ‘□φ’ here. Poss and Nec are metalinguistic statements, statements of a language — in this case, English enhanced with a bit of logical apparatus — made about the statements in (typically) some other language — in this case, the statements of some (unspecified) modal language ℒ. We need some type of quotation marks around ‘◇φ’ and ‘□φ’ in Poss and Nec because ‘◇’ is not itself a part of our English metalanguage; rather, we are referring to certain statements of ℒ that contain it, viz., those that begin with it. Ordinary single quotation marks will not do, as they create names for the very expressions they enclose and our intent here is to refer, not to the strings ‘□φ’ and ‘◇φ’ themselves but, rather, in each case, to sentences of ℒ that have the forms those expressions indicate. This is the purpose of the quasi-quotes. Thus, Nec can be read as follows: For any sentence φ of ℒ, the sentence that results from prefixing the symbol ‘□’ to φ is true if and only if φ is true in every possible world. Similarly for Poss. (Readers familiar with the programming language Lisp will recognize the similarity between quasi-quotes and the Lisp backquote operator.) For more on this topic, see Washington 1998 as well as the entry Quotation.
4. Tarski's own early work on the semantics of predicate logic was much more informal than the account here, which for the most part reflects the development found in modern expositions that came to full flower in, notably, Kemeny 1956a and 1956b. The account here differs from both Tarski's approach and its typical modern incarnations in that interpretations assign values to variables directly, much as if they were names. On the more typical approach, interpretations do not assign values to variables; rather, variables can be assigned different values within one and the same interpretation. (See §4 of the entry on classical logic for details.) The chief advantage of the approach adopted here (which does not alter the critical notions of validity and logical consequence in any significant way) is that it enables one to define the notion of truth under an interpretation directly (and rather more simply). For Tarski's own approach, see §2 of the entry on Tarski and §2.1 of the entry on Tarski's truth definitions. See also the seminal work of Etchemendy (1990) for a more philosophical examination of Tarski's work.
5. Bayart 1958 and 1959 are surprisingly unfamiliar to contemporary philosophers and logicians. In these papers, Bayart — working largely independently, it appears — developed a possible world semantics for first-order modal languages and proved the soundness and completeness of first-order S5. The articles are translated and given a very informative introduction by Cresswell (2015), whom the author thanks for introducing him to Bayart's work. See the entry Modern Origins of Modal Logic as well as Copeland 2002 and Goldblatt 2003 for a comprehensive overview of the historical development of possible world semantics in the 20th century.
6. We follow Kripke (1963) in taking names to be “rigid”, i.e., to have a fixed denotation that is independent of worlds. A more general (but, for purposes here, needlessly more complicated) approach, following Carnap 1947, is to assign intensions, not only to predicates, but to names as well. See, e.g., ch. 13 of Garson 2006, esp. §13.2, as well as §3 of the entry on intensional logic, especially §§3.3–3.5. See §3.6 of the entry for a discussion of problems arising from the assumption that names are rigid.
7. We again follow Kripke (1963) here and adopt a variable domain semantics for quantified modal logic to capture the intuition that, “under different circumstances, fewer, more, or other things might have existed”. A common alternative is simply to let the quantifiers range over the single fixed domain D of all “possible objects” and, instead, introduce a primitive existence predicate ‘E!’ whose extension varies from world to world. Aside from the fact that Kripke's treatment of the quantifiers arguably yields an intuitively more correct semantics of quantification in modal contexts, formally, unlike a fixed domain semantics, it prevents certain controversial modal principles — most notably, the so-called Barcan Formula ⌈◇∃νφ → ∃ν◇φ⌉ (Barcan 1946) — from being logical truths. See the articles on actualism (especially §2 and §3) and modal logic (especially §13) for detailed discussion.
8. Some possible world semantic theories (e.g., Menzel 1991 and (in its own way) Jager 1982) impose the additional condition that Iπ(w) contain only (n-tuples of) things that exist in w. This condition reflects the thesis of serious actualism that exemplification entails existence, i.e., that it is not possible to exemplify a property at a possible world without existing in that world. For more on serious actualism, see the entry actualism, especially, §2.2.3 and note 6.
9. In a more comprehensive exposition of possible world semantics, the definition of a possible world interpretation would include a binary accessibility relation R on the set W of worlds and the modal clause would say that ⌈◻ψ⌉ is true at w if and only if ψ is true at all worlds u that are accessible from w i.e., all worlds u such that Rwu. (See §§7–8 of the entry on modal logic.) Our semantics here is essentially the special case of this approach where all worlds accessible to each other.
10. For examples of the use of intensional entities in more sophisticated developments of possible world semantics, particularly with regard to the semantics of natural language, see, e.g., Lewis 1970, Montague 1974, Kaplan 1979, and Cresswell 1973, 1985a/b, 1988, 1990, 1994, 1996 as well as the Encyclopedia entry on intensional logic.
11. The de re/de dicto distinction traces back to Aristotle (see Nortmann 2002) and was a matter of robust discussion in the medieval period (see the Encyclopedia entry on medieval theories of modality).
12. More exactly, φ exhibits modality de re if there is a subformula of φ of the form ⌈◻ψ⌉ or ⌈◇ψ⌉ containing either an occurrence of a name or a free occurrence of a variable. Thus, for example, ‘◇∃xFx → ∃x◇Fx’ — an instance of the controversial Barcan Formula — is de re because ‘x’ occurs free in the subformula ‘◇Fx’. This definition corresponds to Fine's notion of modality de re in the strict sense (1978, 143). Sentences are de re in the loose sense if they simply contain a free variable in a modal context. As he notes, the strict sense is appropriate if names are understood semantically (as they are in this exposition) to be rigid designators. (Fine defines strictness and looseness for modality de dicto, but it amounts to the same thing.)
13. This is of course not to deny that there are robust alternatives to these three. Two notable recent examples are found in McDaniel 2006 and Yagisawa 2010. Both develop detailed theories of worlds that bear important similarities to concretism but depart from it sharply on several counts, in particular in their answers to QW.
14. Note that ‘part’ here does not mean ‘proper part’, nor does “any two parts” mean “any two distinct parts”. Even if there are (as Lewis seemed to hold) simple objects like spatiotemporal points that have no proper parts, they are still parts of themselves. Moreover, such objects bear spatio-temporal relations to themselves — coexisting at some time, for example — and hence are connected by the given definition.
15. It is worth commenting on the fact that, the rubric “concretism” notwithstanding, the notion of concreteness is not actually part of the definition of a world. Lewis (1986, §1.7) himself acknowledges that his worlds are concrete according to several ways of understanding the notion, but is skeptical about whether the abstract/concrete distinction could be clearly made. Concrete objects, for example, are often defined to be objects whose parts all bear spatiotemporal relations to other parts. But there are conceptions of certain abstract objects (notably, sets of spatiotemporally located objects (Maddy 1980) and physical universals (Armstrong 1986b)) that arguably satisfy this description as well. Nonetheless, we are sticking with the “concretism” label for Lewis's view — albeit “advisedly” (Bricker 2008) — because it still has a good bit of traction in the philosophical literature (due in large measure to the influential van Inwagen 1986).
16. Let Rxy mean that x and y are spatiotemporally related and suppose w1 and w2 overlap, i.e., that they share a common part c. Let a be a part of w1 and b a part of w2. Then, as w1 and w2 are both connected, we have Rca and Rcb. Hence, on the reasonable assumption that R is Euclidean, Rab. Hence, by maximality, b is a part of w1. A parallel argument shows that a must be a part of w2. Hence, our two worlds have the same parts and, hence, by basic principles of mereology, they are identical.
17. For this reason concretism is often referred to as modal realism. That rubric is avoided here for two reasons. First, it is arguably tendentious, insofar as it suggests that abstractionist (§2.2 below) and (some) combinatorial (§2.3 below) alternatives to concretism are somehow less than robust forms of realism about possible worlds. (Indeed, Lewis (1986, 136) labels such views “ersatz” modal realism; see notes 23 and 34 for more on ersatzism.) Second, the rubric is arguably misleading. Some uses of ‘realism’ are intended to indicate that the fundamental locutions in a relevant body of discourse are semantically primitive and, hence, cannot be reduced to more fundamental notions. Some forms of scientific realism, for example, hold that discourse about the theoretical entities of physics is not simply shorthand for discourse about, say, meter readings and patterns on cloud chamber photographs. As discussed in §2.1.3, however, Lewis is a reductionist about modal discourse — the modal operators, in particular, are not semantically primitive but, rather, are to be unpacked semantically in non-modal terms. See Plantinga 1987 for more on this point.
18. In his well known 1968 paper, Lewis axiomatizes the three predicates below (and a fourth) that express the primitives of his translation scheme explicitly, and calls the result counterpart theory. Hazen (1979) raises several challenges to the theory against which Hunter and Seager (1981) mount a defense that is tightened up formally by Forbes (1982). Notable more recent critiques of counterpart theory are found in Merricks 2003, Cresswell 2004, Fara and Williamson 2005, and Fara 2009.
19. It should be noted that, in Lewis's mature theory of 1986, resemblance relations are very fluid and contextually-dependent, and such relations can actually vary even within the semantics of a single sentence. See, for example, Lewis's response (ibid., 254–5) to the “there but for the grace of God” examples of Feldman (1971) and others.
20. These are of course first-order intensions. Lewis does in fact allow for higher-order intensions as well, e.g., properties of properties of individuals like being a property possessed by every great general. Egan (2004) argues, however, that Lewis cannot generalize the definitions here and define, e.g., a property to be any set but, instead, must take intensions generally to be functions from worlds to extensions, much like the original definition above.
21. We use only the conditional rather than the biconditional here because there is no reason to think that every sentence φ* that is the translation of a modal sentence and happens to be true in Lewis's metaphysics should be the translation of an intuitive modal truth. Certain specifics of Lewis's metaphysics might well decide the truth values of sentences that are undecided by ordinary modal intuitions.
22. Lewis (1986, 86) himself makes this point; van Inwagen (1986, 197), to whom Lewis credits the observation, makes the point as well.
23. DeRosset (2009a, 1003) argues that “pushing down” to the microphysical level to account for possibilities that do not seem to be the product of macrophysical recombination still leaves possibilities at the micro-level that seem unaccounted for by R. For more on the question of the success of Lewis's reductionism, see e.g., Shalkowski 1994 and Bricker 2008.
24. See Efird and Stoneham 2008 and Darby and Watson 2010 for a particularly interesting and sophisticated exchange.
25. I am indebted to Phillip Bricker for suggesting this line of response.
26. As noted already, Lewis (1973, 86) originally identified his concrete worlds with “ways things could have been” and realized later that the identification was vacuous. Even earlier, however, Stalnaker (1976, 68) had called him out about the use of ‘the way things are’ to indicate the concrete actual world: “If possible worlds are ways things might have been, then the actual world ought to be the way things are rather than I and all my surroundings. The way things are is a property or a state of the world, not the world itself.”
27. See van Inwagen 1986 for an especially clear and illuminating comparison of the two approaches and Plantinga 1987 for his own rather more tendentious comparison. See Lewis 1986 (§3.4) for an extended critique of abstractionism. Lewis (no less tendentiously) refers to abstractionism as magical ersatzism — “ersatzism” because, in Lewis's view, concrete worlds constitute the most natural ontology for modality and abstractionists seek to replace them with (inferior) abstract substitutes; “magical” because it is mysterious exactly how these abstract entities, as understood by the abstractionist, manage to represent possible worlds at all.
28. Indeed, Plantinga acknowledges that states of affairs might just be propositions, but finds it more natural to distinguish them. See Plantinga 1974, 45.
29. Note that the qualification that a world be a possible SOA is required, as every impossible SOA satisfies the definition of totality. For suppose s is impossible and let t be any SOA. Then it is not possible that s obtain and, hence, trivially, it is not possible both that s obtain and t fail to obtain. Hence, s includes t and, hence, trivially, s either includes or precludes t, i.e., s is total.
30. Merrill (1978) argues quite forcefully that the strict circularity of such analyses does not preclude their being semantically enlightening.
31. Thus Plantinga (1987, 207):
Clearly [Lewis] is partly right: there is much about the nature of propositions we don't pretheoretically know....But we do know something about the nature of propositions, prior to theory. Conceivably they could turn out to be idealized sentences or divine thoughts; but they couldn't turn out to be just anything—donkeys, or fleas, or tables, for example. We know that no propositions are donkeys, and we know that none are fleas.
The concretist would likely agree. But Plantinga (ibid., 208) continues:
Even as we can see that a proposition can't be a donkey or a flea, so we can see that a proposition can't be the unit set of a flea, or any other set of fleas or donkeys,....or a set of concrete objects of any sort. The problem, fundamentally, is that sets, like donkeys, obviously lack the relevant intentional properties — the intentional properties propositions have.
Here the concretist would balk. The reason it seems obvious that donkeys or, for that matter, individual concrete worlds, are not propositions, or any other type of intensional entity, is that it is difficult imagine a coherent, let alone natural, theory in which concrete individuals play the sorts of philosophical and logical roles that propositions are often invoked to play — exhibiting closure under boolean operations, for example. By contrast, sets of worlds (and perhaps more elaborately structured sets built up from individuals generally) are able to play those roles. As to the charge that propositions so construed lack the relevant intentional properties, the concretist would likely argue that the charge is question-begging, insofar as (a) the properties in question are not available within the concretist framework and (b) are not obviously doing any genuine theoretical work. (Cf. the responses of Hazen (1979, 322ff) to similar arguments of Plantinga's against Lewis's analysis of de re modality.)
32. Note, importantly, that actualism is not the thesis that there couldn't have been anything other than the things that are, in fact, actual. Most every actualist believes there could have been. For instance, assuming his lifelong chastity, the Pope (as of April 2013), Jorge Bergoglio, has no children. However, most actualists would agree that he could have had children, i.e., that there are possible worlds in which that is the case. What the actualist denies is that there is a definite (non-actual) individual a such that a could have been Bergoglio's child; that there is a possible world in which it is true that a is Bergoglio's child.
33. This is an important qualification, as there is a clear sense in which concretists are not possibilists at all. One way to formulate actualism is say that there is no more general kind of being than that enjoyed by actually existing things. On this formulation, concretists are actualists. For, according to the concretist, all individuals in non-actual possible worlds exist in precisely the same way that individuals in the actual world do. They are simply not here (in the broadest possible sense). van Inwagen (2008, 40–41) makes essentially this point.
35. In fact, new actualists generally tend to opt for fixed domain semantics for modal logic (as discussed briefly in note 6 above) and a modal language that contains a dedicated predicate ‘C!’ to express the property of concreteness. Thus, the intuition that there could have been something that does not actually exist is understood as the claim that there are non-concrete things that could have been concrete: ∃x(¬C!x ∧ ◇C!x).
36. More exactly, a haecceity is a type of individual essence, i.e., a property P such that (i) P is possibly exemplified, (ii) necessarily, if an individual s exemplifies P, then s exemplifies P essentially and, moreover, (iii) necessarily, nothing other than s could exemplify P. (s exemplifies a property P essentially if it is not possible that s exist and fail to exemplify P.) That haecceities are considered individual essences is enough for them to play the role Plantinga intends for them but, intuitively, haecceities can be thought of as purely non-qualitative individual essences.
37. A set Γ of sentences in the language ℒ of a logic is (semantically) consistent if it has a model, i.e., if there is an interpretation of ℒ under which every member of Γ is true. Γ is maximally consistent if it is consistent and no proper superset of Γ is consistent. Consistency is also often defined proof theoretically — Γ is (proof theoretically) consistent if there is no proof of a contradiction from Γ — but the definition above comports with the definition of a logic used in §1.1 simply as a language together with a semantics in which truth, validity, etc are definable.
38. Lewis 1986, 142–165. See note 23 above for the explanation of ‘ersatzism’. Carnap's (1947) notion of a state description can be seen as an early version of linguistic ersatzism (see esp. §41). See Roy 1995 and Sider 2002 for particularly sophisticated developments of this approach. Bricker 1987 provides an illuminating account of linguistic ersatzism and a cogent assessment of its prospects.
39. The use of “the complex fact” here assumes that facts with the same conjuncts are identical; nothing terribly important hangs on this principle, but it is a natural one for the combinatorialist and, hence, it will be introduced explicitly below (proposition (29).
40. See Armstrong (1978b, 69ff). Note that, on this definition, “[s]tructural properties may or may not involve certain relations among the part of the particulars having the properties.” Thus, on this definition, properties of, e.g., the form being exactly two Fs appear to count as structural, even for simple universals F. Armstrong gives the example being exactly two electrons, although of course he does not claim that being an electron is a simple). However, in a later incarnation, Armstrong (1997, 32) suggests that, for a property U to count as structural, at least one of the universals constituting U must be a relation that at least two of the simpler parts of any instance of U bear to one another.
41. Armstrong developed this notion of constituency in response to serious objections from Lewis (1986a, §2.3.1) in regard to the notion of a structural universal, understood “pictorially” as isomorphs of their instances in the manner laid out in §2.3.1. Lewis's strongest objection suggests that the notion is ultimately inconsistent. Consider the structural universal Water in Figure 1. As can be seen there, the Water involves the universal hydrogen two times over; likewise for the bonded relation B. Lewis then asks:
But what can it mean for something to have a part [two] times over? What are there [two] of? There are not [two] of the universal hydrogen, or the universal bonded; there is only one. The pictorial conception...has many virtues, but consistency is not one of them.
Armstrong (1997, 119–123) argues in response that the objection presupposes that metaphysical complexity can only be mereological and, hence, that structural universals are simply sums of their constituent universals. To the contrary, as noted, structural universals enjoy a richer “non-mereological mode of composition”. Armstrong illustrates the idea chiefly by pointing to cases of distinct states of affairs with identical constituents. For example, there is obviously more to the state of affairs a's loving b than the sum of a, b, and the universal loving, lest it be identical to the state of affairs b's loving a. The states of affairs must therefore in general exhibit a richer sort of composition than the mere mereological composition of its constituents to explain this difference. As structural universals are simply abstractions from states of affairs, the argument presumably concludes, it is reasonable to appeal to this richer sort of composition to explain their structural complexity. The response is promising but, unfortunately, Armstrong does not develop the concept of non-mereological composition any further.
42. This sense of ‘gunk’ originates in Lewis 1991, 19–21, 133–136. For reasons discussed in §2.3.3, structural facts cannot be identified with the sum or conjunction of the simple facts they are grounded in. Problems that arise when the assumption that the constituency relation is well-founded (and hence that structural facts cannot be infinitely decomposed) is lifted are discussed in the supplemental document Further Problems with Combinatorialism.
43. That is, assuming O is the thin particular o's only intrinsic property, the atom/fact o is a “thick“ particular, i.e., the thin particular o “considered along with all of its intrinsic...properties” (ibid., 434).
44. The example illustrates the sort of thing Armstrong has in mind in suggesting that complex universals enjoy a “non-mereological mode of composition”. If the complexity of the structural universal Water were simple mereological complexity, there would only be just the one universal, hydrogen (H) and the one bonding relation (B) and, hence, the structure of the universal Water could not be isomorphic to that of our molecule M, in which H and B are exemplified twice. The “non-mereological” composition of the structural universal, by contrast, permits there to be, as it were, two “copies” of both H and B in Water so as to reflect accurately the structure of M.
45. For Armstrong, supervenience has significant ontological heft: “[w]hat supervenes is no addition of being” (Armstrong 1997, 12). That is, in particular, complex states of affairs — whether mere conjunctions of simple, atomic states of affairs or structural states of affairs like our water molecule W — are nothing, ontologically, over and above the states of affairs on which they supervene (see also TLP 2.032; Armstrong 1989, 113; Armstrong 1997, 44ff). Lewis (1992, 216) finds the claim difficult to understand in terms of a standard notion of ontology and, hence, proposes that “[Armstrong's] question is not: what is there? But rather: what does it take to provide truth-makers for all the truths. That way, it makes perfect sense to say that supervenient entities add nothing to our ontology. A supervenient entity is still an entity, but it is altogether superfluous as a truth-maker.”
46. This claim is a bit ambiguous. Non-structural states of affairs do not supervene on their atomic conjuncts individually, but jointly, a claim that, it appears, must be understood via plural quantification: for any non-structural state of affairs s, there are some states of affairs such that (a) s supervenes on them and (b) something is one of them if and only if it is atomic and s includes it.
47. The astute reader will have noticed that we have avoided displaying the exact form of the state of affairs W's being water. The grammatical form suggests that it has the form [Water,W], but that would not be correct, in light of the fact noted in §2.3.1 that the constituent object in states of affairs of this form are thin particulars, and W is, by assumption, thick. Armstrong himself is not terribly clear on this point but, extrapolating from Armstrong 1993 (433–434) and 1997 (34–35) (which are not obviously consistent), the most plausible form of W's being water is [Water,w], where w is the mereological sum o+h1+h2 of the thin particulars underlying the oxygen and hydrogen molecules o, h1, and h2. In fact, the notion of exemplification in constituent ontologies like Armstrong's — or, at least, like our simplified reconstruction here — is a rather tricky business. See, e.g., Moreland 2011 and Pickavance 2014.
48. It is natural to understand spoilers in primitive modal terms, e.g., a is a spoiler for S just in case it is not possible that both a and S exist. But there does not seem to be any reason the combinatorialist cannot simply deny the primitiveness of the modality here and assert instead that it is just a fact about recombination that a and S do not co-exist in any combinatorial possible world, that a world in which a exists is not one where S does and that this non-modal fact is the truthmaker for the modal proposition above. Thus, a world in which a third hydrogen atom bonds to our the oxygen atom o in Figure 1 is simply not a world in which W exists; it is not a world in which o, h1, and h2, even bonded as they are in W, jointly constitute an instance of Water.
49. Notably, §§1.11–1.12: “The world is determined by the facts, and by their being all the facts. For the totality of facts determines what is the case, and also whatever is not the case.”
50. A bit more specifically, Armstrong (2004, 74) takes a totality state of affairs to be a higher-order atomic state of affairs of the form [Tot,T,being a state of affairs], where T is a sum of states of affairs — intuitively, the state of affairs that the sum in question is a totality with regard to the property in question. Heil (2007) argues cogently that the perceived need for totality states of affairs is a confusion based upon a “shady ‘linguisticizing’ tendency to conflate features of descriptions and features of what is described“ (ibid., 233). Keller (2007; 2009, 125–126) argues, more ominously, that the idea of a totality state of affairs is paradoxical and, hence, that such states of affairs simply cannot exist. However, the argument involves the assumption that if there are totality states of affairs, then they, too, form a totality. But, as Armstrong (2007) points out in a reply to Keller, it seems quite consistent to accept the existence of totality states of affairs and deny that they jointly constitute a further totality, much in the way that ZF set theory denies that the sets jointly constitute a further set.
51. That said, Armstrong goes a bit soft on his commitment to modal reductionism in light of, especially, apparently irreducible modal properties of certain relations. See 1997, Ch. 9, esp. 147.
52. Armstrong (1989, 47) adds a further condition on possible worlds: they must not include any (simple) bare particulars, but the requirement stems more from Armstrong's more global metaphysical views and does not seem essential to combinatorialism per se.
53. Totality states of affairs and so-called law states of affairs, among others, are “higher-order” for Armstrong, insofar as they involve properties of, or relations among, properties. Law states of affairs in particular are causal relations between universals (Armstrong 1986, §15.2).
54. As Armstrong (1997, 169) notes, on the combinatorialist picture, animal bodies and other large, complex, highly structured physical objects can only be “loosely” identified with similar objects in other possible worlds (or, for that matter, at other times (ibid., 104–7)), as any difference in the internal structure of complex objects o and o′ entails that o ≠ o′. Cf. the discussion of loose and strict identity (ibid., 14–17).
55. Armstrong himself argues from more or less these premises to the conclusion that O must be identical to one of its proper parts but it is not entirely clear how to reconstruct the argument. Lewis (1992, 212) questions the reductive adequacy of Armstrong's account of analytic necessities and impossibilities, as the claim of analyticity seems to rest on the modal assumption “that a whole cannot share a universal with its part.” But, Lewis asks, why not? “If something has a mass of [two] kilograms by consisting of [two] one-kilogram parts, how does that prevent it from also having a mass of one kilogram?” See also Eddon 2007 for a detailed and incisive critique of Armstrong's analysis of quantitative properties.
56. Somewhat surprisingly, Armstrong himself does not seem to avail himself of explanations of exactly the sort given in the paragraph containing the reference to this footnote. He does, however, explicitly appeal to the notion of emergence. (Indeed, he defines the notion of an emergent property as a non-structural “anomoeomerous” property, i.e., a non-structural property such that some particular that has it has a part that does not have it; see Armstrong 1978b, 69–71, 171.) In his 1997 (152–3), he uses the notion of emergence with regard to the prospect of a simple property Q of a complex individual a+b that arises nomically from a and b having certain specific properties other than Q and standing in specific simple relations. (It is unclear exactly how such a Q is to be distinguished from a structural property whose constituents are those simple properties and relations, much like the properties B and H of Figure 1.) And in 2004b (14–15) Armstrong again appeals to the notion with regard to complex relations that are, e.g., asymmetric, and, hence, give rise to such impossibilities as: If R is necessarily asymmetric, there can be no state of affairs that includes both [R,a,b] and [R,b,a]. (Recall that, due to the unrestricted nature of recombination, no simple relation can be intrinsically asymmetric.) For more on emergence, see the Encyclopedia entry on emergent properties, especially §3.
57. More complex real-world examples of incompatible states of affairs can be found in molecular biology. The misfolded prions responsible for the class of TSE diseases (Novakofski et al. 2005) constitute a particularly dramatic example of the impossibility of a given complex object simultaneously exemplifying structural properties that it can exemplify serially. Instances p of the normal prion protein, PrP, are routine on the surface of mammalian neurons and consist of a polypeptide sequence s folded into a certain structure. Thus, both the component amino acids of s and the structural relations they bear to one another are constitutive of that instance of the structural property PrP. If that structure is altered in a certain way, s ceases to be such a protein and transforms instead into a pathogenic PrPSc protein p′ with very different causal properties. (The “Sc” suffix here derives from the TSE disease scrapie that affects sheep and goats.) The conjunction [p & p′] of the two component structural states of affairs, therefore, is impossible simply in virtue of the fact that the structure that defines either (and endows it with its particular causal properties) involves relations between the constituents of s that are not part of the structure that defines the other.
58. As with AW3, Armstrong himself (1989, 61–5) adds a proscription against bare particulars. The continuation of the quote above in Armstrong 1989 (579) reflects the modifications of AW3′ that allow for contracted worlds: “Such possible atomic states of affairs may then be combined in all ways to yield possible molecular states of affairs. If such a possible molecular situation is thought of as the totality of being, then it is a possible world.”
59. This is of course the problem of alien universals and alien particulars (Lewis 1986), which is discussed in the context of concretism in the supplemental document Further Problems with Concretism. In a detailed discussion, Schneider (2001) argues that Armstrong (1997) plausibly meets the challenge of alien particulars but fails with regard to alien universals.
60. The problem with possible world fictionalism identified in Rosen 1993 in particular led to the revised account in Armstrong 1997.