Supplement to Possible Worlds
The Extensionality of Possible World Semantics
As noted, possible world semantics does not make modal logic itself extensional; the substitutivity principles all remain invalid for modal languages under (basic) possible worlds semantics. Rather, it is the semantic theory itself — more exactly, the logic in which the theory is expressed — that is extensional. Specifically, basic possible world semantics for a given modal language ℒ, when formalized, is expressed in a (non-modal) first-order language ℒPWS that contains the set membership predicate ‘∈’ supplemented with dedicated predicates, function symbols, and constants, as well as mechanisms for talking about the expressions of ℒ and their possible world interpretations, notably:
|World(w):||w is a world|
|T(φ,w):||(formula) φ is true at (world) w|
|dom(w):||the domain of world w|
|ext(π,w):||the extension of (n-place predicate) π at world w|
|den(τ):||the denotation of (constant or variable) τ|
|@:||the actual world|
Thus, for example, by formalizing the definition of truth simpliciter as truth in the actual world:
- True(φ) =def T(φ,@)
the complete statement of the truth conditions for (6), expressed more formally in ℒPWS, take on the following form:
- True(‘◻∀x(Px → Mx)’) ↔ ∀w∀x((World(w) ∧ x ∈ dom(w)) → (x ∉ ext(‘ P’,w) ∨ x ∈ ext(‘M’,w))).
The semantic theory for this language ℒPWS, of course, is just our Tarskian semantics above. Thus, the logic of possible world semantics is simply an extensional first-order logic in a dedicated language. It is in this clear sense that basic possible world semantics is an extensional semantic theory for modal languages. It can therefore be said that modal logic with a basic possible world semantics is itself extensional in a derivative sense: the logic that gives full expression to the meanings of modal sentences is extensional in the primary sense that, in that logic, all substitutivity principles are valid.