Supplement to Possible Worlds
The Extensionality of Possible World Semantics
As noted, possible world semantics does not make modal logic itself extensional; the substitutivity principles all remain invalid for modal languages under (basic) possible worlds semantics. Rather, it is the semantic theory itself — more exactly, the logic in which the theory is expressed — that is extensional. Specifically, basic possible world semantics for a given modal language ℒ, when formalized, is expressed in a (non-modal) first-order language ℒ_{PWS} that contains the set membership predicate ‘∈’ supplemented with appropriate predicates, function symbols, constants, and sorted variables for talking about the expressions of ℒ and their possible world interpretations, notably:
World(w): | w is a world | |
T(φ,w): | (formula) φ is true at (world) w | |
dom(w): | the domain of world w | |
ext(π,w): | the extension of (n-place predicate) π at world w | |
den(τ): | the denotation of (constant or variable) τ | |
@: | the actual world |
Thus, for example, by formalizing the definition of truth simpliciter as truth in the actual world:
- True(φ) =_{def} T(φ,@)
the complete statement of the truth conditions for (6), expressed more formally in ℒ_{PWS}, take on the following form:
- True(‘◻∀x(Px → Mx)’) ↔ ∀w∀x((World(w) ∧ x ∈ dom(w)) → (x ∉ ext(‘ P’,w) ∨ x ∈ ext(‘M’,w))).
The semantic theory for this language ℒ_{PWS}, of course, is just our Tarskian semantics above. Thus, the logic of possible world semantics is simply an extensional first-order logic in a dedicated language. It is in this clear sense that basic possible world semantics is an extensional semantic theory for modal languages. It can therefore be said that modal logic with a basic possible world semantics is itself extensional in a derivative sense: the logic that gives full expression to the meanings of modal sentences is extensional in the primary sense that, in that logic, all substitutivity principles are valid.