# Prisoner's Dilemma

*First published Thu Sep 4, 1997; substantive revision Mon Oct 22, 2007*

Tanya and Cinque have been arrested for robbing the Hibernia Savings Bank and placed in separate isolation cells. Both care much more about their personal freedom than about the welfare of their accomplice. A clever prosecutor makes the following offer to each. “You may choose to confess or remain silent. If you confess and your accomplice remains silent I will drop all charges against you and use your testimony to ensure that your accomplice does serious time. Likewise, if your accomplice confesses while you remain silent, they will go free while you do the time. If you both confess I get two convictions, but I'll see to it that you both get early parole. If you both remain silent, I'll have to settle for token sentences on firearms possession charges. If you wish to confess, you must leave a note with the jailer before my return tomorrow morning.”

The “dilemma” faced by the prisoners here is that, whatever the other does, each is better off confessing than remaining silent. But the outcome obtained when both confess is worse for each than the outcome they would have obtained had both remained silent. A common view is that the puzzle illustrates a conflict between individual and group rationality. A group whose members pursue rational self-interest may all end up worse off than a group whose members act contrary to rational self-interest. More generally, if the payoffs are not assumed to represent self-interest, a group whose members rationally pursue any goals may all meet less success than if they had not rationally pursued their goals individually. A closely related view is that the prisoner's dilemma game and its multi-player generalizations model familiar situations in which it is difficult to get rational, selfish agents to cooperate for their common good. Much of the contemporary literature has focused on identifying conditions under which players would or should make the “cooperative” move corresponding to remaining silent. A slightly different interpretation takes the game to represent a choice between selfish behavior and socially desirable altruism. The move corresponding to confession benefits the actor, no matter what the other does, while the move corresponding to silence benefits the other player no matter what that player does. Benefiting oneself is not always wrong, of course, and benefiting others at the expense of oneself is not always morally required, but in the prisoner's dilemma game both players prefer the outcome with the altruistic moves to that with the selfish moves. This observation has led David Gauthier and others to take the Prisoner's Dilemma to say something important about the nature of morality.

Puzzles with the structure of the prisoner's dilemma were devised and discussed by Merrill Flood and Melvin Dresher in 1950, as part of the Rand Corporation's investigations into game theory (which Rand pursued because of possible applications to global nuclear strategy). The title “prisoner's dilemma” and the version with prison sentences as payoffs are due to Albert Tucker, who wanted to make Flood and Dresher's ideas more accessible to an audience of Stanford psychologists. Although Flood and Dresher didn't themselves rush to publicize their ideas in external journal articles, the puzzle attracted widespread attention in a variety of disciplines. Christian Donninger reports that “more than a thousand articles” about it were published in the sixties and seventies. A bibliography (Axelrod and D'Ambrosio) of writings between 1988 and 1994 that pertain to Robert Axelrod's research on the subject lists 209 entries. Since then the flow has shown no signs of abating.

The sections below provide a variety of more precise characterizations of the prisoner's dilemma, beginning with the narrowest and survey some connections with similar games and some applications in philosophy and elsewhere. Particular attention is paid to “evolutionary” versions of the game in which members of a population play one another repeatedly and those who get higher payoffs “reproduce” more rapidly than those who get lower payoffs. ‘Prisoner's dilemma’ is abbreviated as ‘PD’.

- 1. Symmetric 2×2 PD With Ordinal Payoffs
- 2. Asymmetry
- 3. Multiple Moves
- 4. Multiple Players
- 5. Single Person Interpretations
- 6. Cardinal Payoffs
- 7. The PD with Replicas and Causal Decision Theory
- 8. The Stag Hunt and the PD
- 9. Asynchronous Moves
- 10. Transparency
- 11. Finite Iteration
- 12. The Centipede and the Finite IPD
- 13. Infinite Iteration
- 14. Indefinite Iteration
- 15. Iteration With Error
- 16. Evolution
- 17. Spatial PDs
- 18. PDs and Social Networks
- 19. Group Selection and the Haystack PD
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Symmetric 2×2 PD With Ordinal Payoffs

In its simplest form the PD is a game described by the payoff matrix:

CDCR,RS,TDT,SP,P

satisfying the following chain of inequalities:

PD1) T>R>P>S

There are two players, Row and Column. Each has two possible moves,
“cooperate” or “defect,” corresponding,
respectively, to the options of remaining silent or confessing in the
illustrative anecdote above. For each possible pair of moves, the
payoffs to Row and Column (in that order) are listed in the
appropriate cell. *R* is the “reward” payoff that
each player receives if both cooperate. *P* is the
“punishment” that each receives if both defect. *T*
is the “temptation” that each receives if he alone defects
and *S* is the “sucker” payoff that he receives if
he alone cooperates. We assume here that the game is symmetric, i.e.,
that the reward, punishment, temptation or sucker payoff is the same
for each player, and payoffs have only ordinal significance, i.e.,
they indicate whether one payoff is better than another, but tell us
nothing about how much better. It is now easy to see that we have the
structure of a dilemma like the one in the story. Suppose Column
cooperates. Then Row gets *R* for cooperating and *T*
for defecting, and so is better off defecting. Suppose Column
defects. Then Row gets *S* for cooperating and *P* for
defecting, and so is again better off defecting. The move
**D** for Row is said to *strictly dominate* the
move **C**: whatever his opponent does, he is better off
choosing **D** than **C**. By symmetry
**D** also strictly dominates **C** for
Column. Thus two “rational” players will defect and
receive a payoff of *P*, while two “irrational”
players can cooperate and receive greater payoff *R*. In
standard treatments, game theory assumes rationality and common
knowledge. Each player is rational, knows the other is rational, knows
that the other knows he is rational, etc. Each player also knows how
the other values the outcomes. But since **D** strictly
dominates **C** for both players, the argument for
dilemma here requires only that each player knows his own payoffs.
(The argument remains valid, of course, under the stronger standard
assumptions.) It is also worth noting that the outcome
(**D**, **D**) of both players defecting is
the game's only strong nash equilibrium, i.e., it is the only outcome
from which each player could only do worse by unilaterally changing
its move. Flood and Dresher's interest in their dilemma seems to have
stemmed from their view that it provided a counterexample to the claim
that the nash equilibria of a game constitute its natural
“solutions”.

If there can be “ties” in rankings of the payoffs, condition PD1 can be weakened without destroying the nature of the dilemma. For suppose that one of the following conditions obtains:

PD2) T>R>P≥S, orT≥R>P>S

Then, for each player, although **D** does not strictly
dominate **C**, it still *weakly dominates* in the
sense that each player always does at least as well, and sometimes
better, by playing **C**. Under these conditions it still
seems rational to play **D**, which again results in the
payoff that neither player prefers. Let us call a game that meets PD2
a *weak PD*. Note that in a weak PD that does not satisfy PD1
mutual defection is no longer a nash equilibrium in the strong sense
defined above. It is still, however, the only nash equilibrium in the
weaker sense, that neither player can improve its position by
unilaterally changing its move. Again, one might suppose that if there
is a unique nash equilibrium of this weaker variety, rational
self-interested players would reach it.

## 2. Asymmetry

Without assuming symmetry, the PD can be represented by using
subscripts *r* and *c* for the payoffs to Row and Column.

CDCR_{r},R_{c}S_{r},T_{c}DT_{r},S_{c}P_{r},P_{c}

If we assume that the payoffs are ordered as before for each player,
i.e., that
*T*_{i}>*R*_{i}>*P*_{i}>*S*_{i}
when *i*=*r*, *c*, then, as before,
**D** is the strictly dominant move for both players, but
the outcome (**D**, **D**) of both players
making this move is worse for each than (**C**,
**C**). The force of the dilemma can now also be felt
under weaker conditions, however. Consider the following three pairs
of inequalities:

PD3) a. T_{r}>R_{r}andP_{r}>S_{r}b. T_{c}>R_{c}andP_{c}>S_{c}c. R_{r}>P_{r}andR_{c}>P_{c}

If these conditions all obtain the argument for dilemma goes through
as before. Defection strictly dominates cooperation for each player,
and (**C**, **C**) is strictly preferred by
each to (**D**, **D**). If one of the two
> signs in each of the conditions a - c is replaced by a weak
inequality sign ≥ we have a weak PD. **D** weakly
dominates **C** for each player (i.e., **D**
is as good as **C** in all cases and better in some) and
(**C**, **C**) weakly better than
(**D**, **D**) (i.e., it is at least as good
for both players and better for one). Since none of the clauses
requires comparisons between *r*'s payoffs and *c*'s, we
need not assume that > has any “interpersonal”
significance.

Now suppose we drop the first inequality of either *a* or
*b* (but not both). A game that meets the resulting conditions
might be termed a *common knowledge PD*. As long as each player
knows that the other is rational and each knows the other's ordering
of payoffs, we still feel the force of the dilemma. For suppose a
holds. Then **D** is the dominant move for Row. Column,
knowing that Row is rational, knows that Row will defect, and so, by
the remaining inequality in *b*, will defect
himself. Similarly, if *b* holds Column will defect, and Row,
realizing this, will defect herself. By *c*, the resulting
(**D**, **D**) is again worse for both than
(**C**, **C**).

## 3. Multiple Moves

Speaking generally, one might say that a PD is a game in which a “cooperative” outcome obtainable only when every player violates rational self-interest is unanimously preferred to the “selfish” outcome obtained when every player adheres to rational self-interest. We can characterize the selfish outcome either as the result of each player pursuing its dominant (strongly dominant) strategy, or as the unique weak (strong) nash equilibrium. In a two move game the two characterizations come to the same thing — a dominant move pair is a unique equilibrium and a unique equilibrium is a dominant move pair. As the payoff matrix below shows, however, the two notions diverge in a game with more than two moves.

CDNCR,RS,TT,SDT,SP,PR,SNS,TS,RS,S

Here each player can choose “cooperate”,
“defect” or “neither” and the payoffs are
ordered as before. Defection is no longer dominant, because each
player is better off choosing **C** than
**D** when the other chooses *N*. Nevertheless
(**D**, **D**) is still the unique
equilibrium. Let us label a game like this in which the selfish
outcome is the unique equilibrium an *equilibrium PD*, and one
in which the selfish outcome is a pair of dominant moves a
*dominance PD*. As will be seen below, attempts to
“solve” the PD by allowing conditional strategies can
create multiple-move games that are themselves equilibrium PDs.

## 4. Multiple Players

Most of those who maintain that the PD illustrates something important
about morality seem to believe that the basic structure of the game is
reflected in situations that larger groups, perhaps entire societies,
face. The most obvious generalization from the two-player to the
many-player game would pay each player *R* if all cooperate,
*P* if all defect, and, if some cooperate and some defect, it
would pay the cooperators *S* and the defectors *T*. But
it is unlikely that we face many situations of this structure.

A common view is that a multi-player PD structure is reflected in what
Garret Hardin popularized as “the tragedy of the commons.”
Each member of a group of neighboring farmers prefers to allow his cow
to graze on the commons, rather than keeping it on his own inadequate
land, but the commons will be rendered unsuitable for grazing if it is
used by more than some threshold number use it. More generally, there
is some social benefit *B* that each member can achieve if
sufficiently many pay a cost *C*. We might represent the payoff
matrix as follows:

more thann

choose Cnor fewer

choose CCC+BCDB0

The cost *C* is assumed to be a negative number. The
“temptation” here is to get the benefit without the cost,
the reward is the benefit with the cost, the punishment is to get
neither and the sucker payoff is to pay the cost without realizing the
benefit. So the payoffs are ordered *B* >
(*B*+*C*) > 0 > *C*. As in the two-player
game, it appears that **D** strongly dominates
**C** for all players, and so rational players would
choose **D** and achieve 0, while preferring that
everyone would choose **C** and obtain
*C*+*B*.

Unlike the more straightforward generalization, this matrix does
reflect common social choices — between depleting and conserving
a scarce resource, between using polluting and non-polluting means of
manufacture or disposal, and between participating and not
participating in a group effort towards some common goal. When
*n* is small, it represents a version of what has been called
the “volunteer dilemma”. A group needs a few volunteers,
but each member is better off if others volunteer. (Notice, however,
that in a true volunteer dilemma, where only one volunteer is needed,
*n* is zero and the top right outcome is impossible. Under
these conditions **D** no longer dominates
**C** and the game loses its PD flavor.) A particularly
vexing manifestation of this game occurs when a vaccination known to
have serious risks is needed to prevent the outbreak of a fatal
disease. If enough of her neighbors get the vaccine, each person may
be protected without assuming the risks.

The tragedy of the commons game diagramed above has a somewhat
different character than the two-player PD. First, even if each
player's moves are entirely independent of the others, the
alternatives represented by the columns in the commons matrix above
are no longer independent of the alternatives represented by the
rows. My choosing **C** necessarily increases the chances
that more than *n* people will choose **C**. To
ensure independence we should really redraw the matrix as follows:

more thannothers

choose Cnothers

choose Cfewer thannothers

choose CCC+BC+BCDB0 0

But now we see that move **D** does *not* dominate
**C**. When we are at the threshold of adequate
cooperation, where exactly *n* others choose **C**, I am
better off cooperating. Provided that *n* is large, however, it
would seem that this effect could be ignored and we could assume, for
practical purposes, that the payoff matrix is like the previous one.

Similarly, whereas we saw in the original PD that mutual defection was
the only nash equilibrium, this game has two equilibria. One is
universal defection, since any player unilaterally departing from that
outcome will move from payoff 0 to *C*. But a second is the
state of *minimally effective* cooperation, where the number of
cooperators just exceeds the threshold. A defector who unilaterally
departs from that outcome will move from *B* to
*B*+*C* and a cooperator who unilaterally departs will
move from *B*+*C* to 0. This might suggest that the
tragedy of the commons is less tragic than the PD, but in real life
situations, it would seem unlikely that the participants would know
when they are at the equilibrium point of minimally effective
cooperation.

Furthermore, in the ordinary PD, universal cooperation is a pareto-optimal outcome, i.e., there is no outcome in which each player is at least as well off and some are better off. But in the commons game the only pareto optimal outcomes are those of minimally effective cooperation. Whether universal cooperation is nevertheless desirable may depend on the nature of the choices involved. In the medical example it may seem best to vaccinate everyone. In the agricultural example, however it seems foolish to stipulate that nobody use the commons. Someone who avoids vaccination in the former case is seen as a “free rider”. An underused commons in the latter seems to exemplify “surplus cooperation.”

The two-person version of the tragedy of the commons game (with threshold of one) produces a matrix presenting considerably less of a dilemma.

CDCB+C,B+CC,0D0, C0,0

This game captures David Hume's example of a boat with one oarsman on the port side and another on the starboard (provided we assume that Hume's oarsmen must make their choices between rest and exertion simultaneously). Mutual cooperation is identical to minimally effective cooperation and therefore is both an equilibrium outcome and a pareto optimal outcome. Games of this sort will be discussed below under the label “Stag Hunt.”

The above representations of the tragedy of the commons make the
simplifying assumptions that the costs and benefits of cooperation are
the same for each player, that the cost of cooperation is independent
of the number of players who cooperate, and that the size of the
benefit (0 or *B*) depends only on whether the number of
cooperators exceeds the threshold. A somewhat more general account
would replace *C* and *B* by functions
*C*(*i*, *j*) and *B*(*i*,
*j*) representing the cost of cooperation to player *i*
when he is one of exactly *j* players who cooperate and the
benefit to player *i* when exactly *j* players
cooperate. We suppose that there is some threshold *t* for
minimally effective cooperation so that *B*(*i*,
*j*) is not defined unless *j*>*t*. We may
also assume additional cooperation never reduces the benefit
*i* gets from effective cooperation, i.e.,
*B*(*i*, *j*+1)≥*B*(*i*,
*j*) when *j*>*t* and that additional
defection never reduces the cost *i* bears in cooperating,
i.e., *C*(*i*, *j*+1)≥*C*(*i*,
*j*). Now suppose, in addition, that, once the threshold of
effective cooperation has been exceeded, any benefit one gets from
from the presence of an additional cooperator is exceeded by one's
cost of cooperation and that the costs of ineffective cooperation are
genuine, i.e., for all players *i*, *B*(*i*,
*j*)>(*B*(*i*,
*j*+1)+*C*(*i*, *j*+1)) when *j* is
greater than *t* and 0>*C*(*i*, *j*)
when *j* is less than or equal to *t*. Finally, suppose
that the benefits to each player *i*, of effective cooperation
exceed the costs, i.e., for *j*>*t*,
*B*(*i*, *j*)+*C*(*i*,
*j*)>0 We then have a tragedy of the commons game, which
presents a familiar dilemma: defection benefits an individual in every
circumstance (except the one where exactly *t* others
cooperate) but everybody is better off in any state of effective
cooperation than in any state without it. This account could be
easily be modified to allow threshold of minimally effective
cooperation to differ from one individual to another (*i*'s
clean water requirements might be more stringent than *j*'s for
example) or to allow *B* to be defined everywhere (thus
eliminating the threshold, so that we always benefit from another's
cooperation). The resulting game would still have its PD flavor.

Phillip Pettit has pointed out that examples that might be represented
as many-player PDs come in two flavors. The examples discussed above
might be classified as free-rider problems. My temptation is to enjoy
some benefits brought about by burdens shouldered by others. The other
flavor is what Pettit calls “foul dealer” problems. My
temptation is to benefit myself by hurting others. Suppose, for
example, that a group of people are applying for a single job, for
which they are equally qualified. If all fill out their applications
honestly, they all have an equal chance of being hired. If one lies,
however, he can ensure that he is hired while, let us say, incurring a
small risk of being exposed later. If everyone lies, they again have
an equal chance for the job, but now they all incur the risk of
exposure. Thus a lone liar, by reducing the others' chances of
employment from slim to none, raises his own chances from slim to
sure. As Pettit points out, when the minimally effective level of
cooperation is the same as the size of the population, there is no
opportunity for free-riding (everyone's cooperation is needed), and so
the PD must be of the foul-dealing variety. But (Pettit's contrary
claim notwithstanding) not all foul-dealing PDs seem to have this
feature. Suppose, for example, that two applicants in the story above
will be hired. Then everyone gets the benefit (a chance of employment
without risk of exposure) unless two or more players
lie. Nevertheless, the liars seem to be foul dealers rather than free
riders. A better characterization of the foul-dealing dilemma might be
that every defection from a generally cooperative state strictly
reduces the payoffs to the cooperators, i.e., for every player
*i* and every *j* greater than the threshold, either
*B*(*i*, *j*+1)+ *C*(*i*,
*j*+1)>*B*(*i*,
*j*)+*C*(*i*, *j*). A free-rider's
defection benefits himself but does not, by itself, hurt the
cooperators. A foul-dealer's defection benefits himself and hurts the
cooperators.

The game labeled a many-person PD in Schelling, Molander 1992 and
elsewhere requires that the payoff to each co-operator and defector
increases strictly with the number of cooperators and that the sum of
the payoffs to all parties increases with the number of cooperators
(so that one party's switching from defection to cooperation always
raises the sum). Neither of these conditions is met by the formulation
and the examples discussed above. They may, however, hold
“locally,” i.e., for *j* close to the threshold
*t* for minimally effective cooperation, it may be reasonable
to assume that:

- for every individual
*i*,*B*(*i*,*j*+1)+*C*(*i*,*j*+1)>*B*(*i*,*j*)+*C*(*i*,*j*) for*j*>*t*, - for every individual
*i*,*C*(*i*,*j*+1)>*C*(*i*,*j*) for*j*≤*t*, and -
*B*(1,*j*+1)+*C*(1,*j*+1)+…+*B*(*j*+1,*j*+1)+*C*(*t*+1,*j*+1)+*B*(*j*+2,*j*+1))+…+*B*(*n*,*j*+1) >*B*(1,*j*)+*C*(1,*j*)+…+*B*(*j*,*j*)+*C*(*j*,*j*)+*B*(*j*+1,*j*)+…+*B*(*n*,*j*).

By requiring that cooperation of others always benefits each and all,
the Schelling and Molander formulations of the *n*-person PD
fail to model the surplus cooperation/free rider phenomenon that seems
to infuse “Tragedy of the Commons” situations. Their
conditions might, however be a plausible model for certain *public
good* dilemmas. It is not unreasonable to suppose that
*any* contribution towards public health, national defense,
highway safety, or clean air is valuable to everybody, no matter how
little or how much we already have, but that the cost to each
individual for his own contribution to those goods always exceeds the
benefit that he derives from that contribution. This outlook has the
advantage of focusing attention on the PD quality of the
game. Defection dominates cooperation, while universal cooperation is
unanimously preferred to universal defection. Michael Taylor goes
even further in this direction. His version of the many-person PD
requires only the two PD-conditions just mentioned and the one
additional condition that defectors are always better off when some
cooperate than when none do. (Taylor's main concern is with the
iterated version of this game, a topic that will be addressed in
future editions of this entry.)

## 5. Single Person Interpretations

The PD is usually thought to illustrate conflict between individual and collective rationality, but the multiple player form (or something very similar) has also been interpreted as demonstrating problems within standard conceptions of individual rationality. One such interpretation, elucidated in Quinn, derives from an example of Parfit's. A medical device enables electric current to be applied to a patient's body in increments so tiny that there is no perceivable difference between adjacent settings. You are attached to the device and given the following choice every day for ten years: advance the device one setting and collect a thousand dollars, or leave it where it is and get nothing. Since there is no perceivable difference between adjacent settings, it is apparently rational to advance the setting each day. But at the end of ten years the pain is so great that a rational person would sacrifice all his wealth to return to the first setting.

We can view the situation here as a multi-player PD in which each “player” is the temporal stage of a single person. So viewed, it has at least two features that were not discussed in connection with the multi-player examples. First, the moves of the players are sequential rather than simultaneous (and each player has knowledge of preceding moves). Second, there is the matter of gradation. Increases in electric current between adjacent settings are imperceptible, and therefore irrelevant to rational decision-making, but sums of a number such increases are noticeable and highly relevant. Neither of these features, however, is peculiar to one-person examples. Consider, for example, the choice between a polluting and non-polluting means of waste disposal. Each resident of a lakeside community may dump his or her garbage in the lake or use a less convenient landfill. It is reasonable to suppose that each acts in the knowledge of how others have acted before. (See “Asynchronous Moves” below.) It is also reasonable to suppose that addition of one can of garbage to the lake has no perceptible effect on water quality, and therefore no effect on the welfare of the residents. The fact that the dilemma remains suggests that PD-like situations sometimes involve something more than a conflict between individual and collective rationality. In the one-person example, our understanding that we care more about our overall well-being than that of our temporal stages does not (by itself) eliminate the argument that it is rational to continue to adjust the setting. Similarly, in the pollution example, a decision to let collective rationality override individual rationality may not eliminate the argument for excessive dumping. It seems appropriate, however, to separate this issue from that raised in the standard PD. Gradations that are imperceptible individually, but weighty en masse give rise to intransitive preferences. This is a challenge to standard accounts of rationality whether or not it arises in a PD-like setting.

A second one-person interpretation of the PD is suggested in Kavka, 1991. On Kavka's interpretation, the prisoners are not temporal stages, but rather “subagents” reflecting different desiderata that I might bring to bear on a decision. Let us imagine that I am hungry and considering buying a snack. The options open to me are:

- Buy a scoop of chocolate gelato.
- Buy a scoop of orange sherbet.
- Buy a granola bar.
- Buy nothing.

My health-conscious side, “Arnold,” orders these options
in the following order: *c*, *b*, *d*,
*a*. My taste-conscious side, “Eppie,” ranks them:
*a*, *b*, *d*, *c*. Such inner conflict
among preferences might often be resolved in ways consistent with
standard views about individual choice. My overall preference
ordering, for example, might be determined from a weighted average of
the utilities that Arnold and Eppie assign to each of the options. It
is also possible, Kavka suggests, that my inner conflicts are resolved
as if they were a result of strategic interaction among rational
subagents. In this case, Arnold and Eppie can each choose either to
*insist* on getting their way (**I**) or to
*acquiesce* to a compromise (**A**). The
interaction between subagents can then be represented by the following
payoff matrix, where Arnold plays row and Eppie plays column.

AIAbaIcd

Examination of the table and preference orderings confirms that we again have an intrapersonal PD. Kavka argues that a story like this might “provide a psychologically plausible picture of how internal conflict can lead to suboptimal action.” It also undermines a standard view that choices reflect values in favor of one that they partially reflect, “the structure of inner conflict”.

## 6. Cardinal Payoffs

If the game specifies absolute (as opposed to relative) payoffs, then
universal cooperation may not be a pareto optimal outcome even in the
two person PD. For under some conditions both players do better by
adopting a *mixed* strategy of cooperating with probability
*p* and defecting with probability (1-*p*). This point
is illustrated in the graphs below.

Figure 1

Here the *x* and *y* axes represent the utilities of Row
and Column. The four outcomes entered in the matrix of the second
section are represented by the labeled dots. Conditions PD3a and PD3b
ensure that (**C**, **D**) and
(**D**, **C**) lie northwest and southeast
of (**D**, **D**), and PD3c is reflected in
the fact that (**C**, **C**) lies northeast
of (**D**, **D**). Suppose first that
(**D**, **D**) and (**C**,
**C**) lie on opposite sides of the line between
(**C**, **D**) and (**D**,
**C**), as in the graph on the left. Then the four
points form a convex quadrilateral, and the payoffs of the feasible
outcomes of mixed strategies are represented by all the points on or
within this quadrilateral. Of course a player can really only get one
of four possible payoffs each time the game is played, but the points
in the quadrilateral represent the *expected values* of the
payoffs to the two players. If Row and Column cooperate with
probabilities *p* and *q* (and defect with probabilities
*p**=1-*p* and *q**=1-*q*), for example,
then the expected value of the payoff to Row is
*p***q**T*+*p**q**R*+*p***q***P*+*p**q***S*. A
rational self-interested player, according to a standard view, should
prefer a higher expected payoff to a lower one. In the graph on the
left the payoff for universal cooperation (with probability one) is
pareto optimal among the payoffs for all mixed strategies. In the
graph on the right, however, where both (**D**,
**D**) and (**C**, **C**) lie
southwest of the line between (**C**, **D**)
and (**D**, **C**), the story is more
complicated. Here the payoffs of the feasible outcome lie within a
figure bounded on the northeast by three distinct curve segments, two
linear and one concave. Notice that (**C**,
**C**) is now in the interior of the region bounded by
solid lines, indicating that there are mixed strategies that provide
both players a higher expected payoff than (**C**,
**C**). It is important to note that we are talking about
independent mixed strategies here. Row and Column use private
randomizing devices and have no communication. If they were able to
correlate their mixed strategies, so as to ensure, say
(**C**, **D**) with probability *p*
and (**D**, **C**) with probability
*p**, the set of feasible solutions would extend up to (and
include) the dotted line between (**C**,
**D**) and (**D**, **C**). The
point here is that, even confined to independent strategies, there are
some games satisfying PD3 in which both players can both do better
than they do with universal cooperation. A PD in which universal
cooperation is pareto optimal may be called a pure PD. (This
phenomenon is identified in Kuhn and Moresi and applied to moral
philosophy in Kuhn 1996.) A pure PD is characterized by adding to PD3
the following condition.

P)( T_{r}-R_{r})(T_{c}-R_{c})≤(R_{r}-S_{ r})(R_{c}-S_{c})

In a symmetric game *P* reduces to the simpler condition

RCA) R≥1/2(T+S)

(named after the authors Rapoport, Chammah and Axelrod who employed it).

## 7. The PD with Replicas and Causal Decision Theory

One controversial argument that it is rational to cooperate in a PD
relies on the observation that my partner in crime is likely to think
and act very much like I do. (See, for example, Davis 1977 and 1985
for a sympathetic presentation of one such argument and Binmore
1994,Chapters 3.4 and 3.5, for a reformulation and extended rebuttal.)
In the extreme case, my accomplice is an exact *replica* of me
who is wired just as I am so that, of necessity, we do the same thing.
It would then seem that the only two possible outcomes are where both
players cooperate and where both players defect. Since the reward
payoff exceeds the punishment payoff, I should cooperate. More
generally, even if my accomplice is not a perfect replica, the odds of
his cooperating are greater if I cooperate and the odds of his
defecting are greater if I defect. When the correlation between our
behaviors is sufficiently strong or the differences in payoffs is
sufficiently great, my *expected* payoff (as that term is
usually understood) is higher if I cooperate than if I defect. The
counter argument, of course, is that my action is *causally
independent* of my replica's. Since I can't affect what my
accomplice does and since, whatever he does, my payoff is greater if I
defect, I should defect. These arguments closely resemble the
arguments for two positions on the *Newcomb Problem*, a puzzle
popularized among philosophers in Nozick. (The extent of the
resemblance is made apparent in Lewis.) The Newcomb Problem asks us to
consider two boxes, one transparent and one opaque. In the transparent
box we can see a thousand dollars. The opaque box may contain either a
million dollars or nothing. We have two choices: take the contents of
the opaque box or take the contents of both boxes. We know before
choosing that a reliable predictor of our behavior has put a million
dollars in the opaque box if he predicted we would take the first
choice and left it empty if he predicted we would take the second. To
see that each player in a PD faces a Newcomb problem, consider the
following payoff matrix.

CDCm,m0, m+tDm+t,0t,t

By “cooperating” (choosing the opaque box), each player
ensures that the other gets a million dollars (and a thousand extra
for defecting). By “defecting” (choosing both boxes) each
player ensures that he will get thousand dollars himself (and a
million more if the other cooperates). As long as
*m*>*t*>0, the structure of this game is an
ordinary two-player, two-move PD (and any such PD can be represented
in this form). Furthermore, the arguments for “one-boxing”
and “two-boxing” in a Newcomb problem are the same as the
arguments for cooperating and defecting in a Prisoner's dilemma where
there is positive correlation between the moves of the players. Two
boxing is a *dominant* strategy: two boxes are better than one
whether the first one is full or empty. On the other hand, if the
predictor is reliable, the *expected* payoff for one-boxing is
greater than the expected payoff for two-boxing. [See Hurley, however,
for an argument that the two puzzles are significantly different. In a
PD (of either the ordinary or the Newcombized variety) each player
knows that the other is rational and that the other ranks the outcomes
in the ways described. This, Hurley argues, opens a possibility for
cooperative joint action that is absent in the original Newcomb
problem.]

The intuition that two-boxing is the rational choice in a Newcomb
problem, or that defection is the rational choice in the PD with
positive correlation between the players' moves, seems to conflict
with the idea that rationality requires maximizing expectation. This
apparent conflict has led some to suggest that standard decision
theory needs to be refined in cases in which an agent's actions
provide *evidence* for, without *causing*, the context
in which he is acting. In the case of the PD, standard (evidential)
decision theory asks Player One to compare his expected utilities of
cooperation and defection, which can be written as
*p*(**C**_{2}|**C**_{1})×*R*
+*p*(**D**_{2}|**C**_{1})×*S*
and
*p*(**C**_{2}|**D**_{1})×*T*
+
*p*(**D**_{2}|**D**_{1})×*P*
(where, for example,
*p*(**C**_{2}|**C**_{1})
is the conditional probability that player Two cooperates given that
Player One cooperates). If the players' moves are strongly correlated
then
*p*(**C**_{2}|**C**_{1})
and
*p*(**D**_{2}|**D**_{1})will
be close to one and
*p*(**C**_{2}|**D**_{1})
and
*p*(**D**_{2}|**C**_{1})
will be close to zero. On the suggested revision, these conditional
probabilities should be replaced by some kind of causally conditional
probabilities, which might (on some accounts) be expressed by phrases
like “the probability that if One were to cooperate, Two would
also cooperate.” When the moves are causality independent this
would just be the probability that Two cooperates.

The rather far-fetched scenario described in Newcomb's Problem initially led some to doubt the importance of the distinction between causal and evidential decision theory. Lewis argues that the link to the PD suggests that situations where the two decisions diverge are not so unusual, and recent writings on causal decision theory contain many examples far less bizarre than Newcomb's problem. (See Joyce, for example.)

It might be noted that what is here called “PD between
replicas” is usually called “PD with twins” in the
literature. One reason for the change in nomenclature is to
distinguish these ideas from an experimental literature reporting on
PD games played with real (identical or fraternal) twins. (See, for
example, Segal and Hershberger.) It turns out that twins *are*
more likely to cooperate in a PD than strangers, but there seems to be
no suggestion that the reasoning that leads them to do so follows the
controversial arguments presented above.

## 8. The Stag Hunt and the PD

The idea mentioned in the introduction that the PD models a problem of cooperation among rational agents is sometimes criticized because, in a true PD, the cooperative outcome is not a nash equilibrium. Any “problem” of this nature, the critics contend, would be an unsolvable one. (See for example, Sugden or Binmore 2005, Chapter 4.5.) By changing the payoff structure of the PD slightly, so that the reward payoff exceeds the temptation payoff, we obtain a game where mutual cooperation, as well as mutual defection, is a nash equilibrium. This game is known as the Stag Hunt. It might provide a better model for situations where cooperation is difficult, but still possible, and it may also be a better fit for other roles sometimes assigned to the PD. More specifically, a Stag Hunt is a two player, two move game with a payoff matrix like that for the PD pictured above where the conditions PD1 are replaced:

SH) a. R>Tb. R>Pc. P>S.

The fable dramatizing the game and providing its name, gleaned from a
passage in Rousseau's *Discourse on Inequality*, concerns a
hunting expedition rather than a jail cell interrogation. Two hunters
are are looking to bag a stag. Success is uncertain and, if it comes,
require the efforts of both. On the other hand, either hunter can
forsake his partner and catch a hare with a good chance of success. A
typical payoff matrix is shown below.

CDC4,4 0,3 D3,0 3,3

Here the “cooperative” move is hunting stag with one's
partner and “defection” is hunting hare by oneself. The
“temptation” payoff in a Stag Hunt is no longer much of a
temptation, but we retain the payoff terminology for ease of
exposition. In this case the temptation and punishment penalties are
identical, perhaps reflecting the fact that my partner's actions have
no effect on my hunt for hare. Alternatively we could have temptation
exceeding punishment, perhaps because hunting hare is more rewarding
together than alone (though still less rewarding, of course, than
hunting stag together), or we could have punishment exceeding
temptation, perhaps because a second hare hunter represents unhelpful
competition. Either way, the essence of the Stag Hunt remains. There
are two equilibria, one unanimously preferred to the other. The Stag
Hunt becomes a “dilemma” when rationality dictates that
both players choose the action leading to the inferior equilibrium. It
is clear that if I am certain that my partner will hunt stag I should
join him and that if I am certain that he will hunt hare I should hunt
hare as well. For this reason games with this structure are sometimes
called games of “assurance” or “trust.” If I
do not know what my partner will do, standard decision theory tells me
to maximize expectation. This requires, however, that I estimate the
probability of my partner playing **C** or
**D**. If I lack information to form any such estimates,
then one putative principle of rationality
(“indifference”) suggests that I ought to treat all
options as equally likely. By this criterion I ought to hunt hare if
and only if the following condition is met:

SHD)T+P>R+S

When SHD obtains, hare hunting is said to be the “risk-dominant”
equilibrium. Let us call a Stag Hunt game where this condition is met a
*Stag Hunt Dilemma*. The matrix above provides one example.

Another proposed principle of rationality (“maximin”)
suggests that I ought to consider the worst payoff I could obtain
under any course of action, and choose that action that maximizes this
value. Since the sucker payoff is the worst payoff in a Stag Hunt,
this principle suggests that *any* Stag Hunt presents a
dilemma. Maximin, however, makes more sense as a principle of
rationality for zero sum games, where it can be assumed that a
rational opponent is trying to minimize my score, than for games like
Stag Hunt, where a rational opponent may be quite happy to see me do
well, as long as he does so as well.

The Stag Hunt can be generalized in the obvious way to accommodate asymmetric and cardinal payoffs. The quadrilateral formed by the games' graphical representation is convex, so the pure/impure distinction no longer applies. (I.e., in a Stag Hunt no mixed strategies are ever preferred to mutual cooperation.) The most obvious way to generalize the game to many players would retain the condition that there be exactly two equilibria, one unanimously preferred to the other. This might be a good model for cooperative activity in which success requires full cooperation. Imagine, for example, that a single polluter would spoil a lake, or a single leak would thwart an investigation. If many agents are involved and, by appeal to indifference or for other reasons, we estimate a fifty-fifty chance of cooperation from each, then these examples would represent Stag Hunt Dilemmas in an extreme form. Everyone would benefit if all cooperate, but only a very trusting fool would think it rational to cooperate himself. Perhaps some broader generalization to the many-person case would also be useful, but that matter will not be taken up here.

The cooperative outcome in the Stag Hunt can be assured by many of the same means as are discussed here for the PD. As might be expected, cooperation is somewhat easier to come by in the two person Stag Hunt than in the two person PD. Details will not be given here, but the interested reader may consult Skyrms 2004, which is responsible for a recent resurgence of interest in this game.

## 9. Asynchronous Moves

It has often been argued that rational self-interested players can
obtain the cooperative outcome by making their moves conditional on
the moves of the other player. Peter Danielson, for example, favors a
strategy of *reciprocal cooperation*: if the other player would
cooperate if you cooperate and would defect if you don't, then
cooperate, but otherwise defect. Conditional strategies like this are
ruled out in the versions of the game described above, but they may be
possible in versions that more accurately model real world situations.
In this section and the next, we consider two such versions. Here we
eliminate the requirement that the two players move simultaneously.
Consider the situation of a firm whose sole competitor has just
lowered prices. Or suppose the buyer of a car has just paid the agreed
purchase price and the seller has not yet handed over the title. We
can think of these as situations in which one player has to choose to
cooperate or defect after the other player has already made a similar
choice. The corresponding game is an *asynchronous* or
*extended* PD.

Careful discussion of an asynchronous PD example, as Skyrms (1998) and Vanderschraaf recently note, occurs in the writings of David Hume, well before Flood and Dresher's formulation of the ordinary PD. Hume writes about two neighboring grain farmers:

Your corn is ripe today; mine will be so tomorrow. ’Tis profitable for us both, that I shou'd labour with you to-day, and that you shou'd aid me to-morrow. I have no kindness for you, and know you have as little for me. I will not, therefore, take any pains on your account; and should I labour with you upon my own account, in expectation of a return, I know I shou'd be disappointed, and that I shou'd in vain depend upon your gratitude. Here then I leave you to labour alone: You treat me in the same manner. The seasons change; and both of us lose our harvests for want of mutual confidence and security.

In deference to Hume, Skyrms and Vanderschraaf refer to this kind of asynchronous PD as the “farmer's dilemma.” It is instructive to picture it in a tree diagram.

Figure 2

Here, time flows to the right. The node marked by a square indicates
Player One's choice point, those marked by circles indicate Player
Two's. The moves and the payoffs to each player are exactly as in the
ordinary PD, but here Player Two can choose his move according to what
Player One does. Tree diagrams like Figure 2 are said to be
*extensive-form* game representations, whereas the payoff
matrices given previously are *normal-form* representations. As
Hume's analysis indicates, making the game asynchronous does not
remove the dilemma. Player One knows that if he were to choose
**C** on the first move, Player Two would choose
**D** on the second move (since she prefers the
temptation to the reward), so he would himself end up with the sucker
payoff. If Player One were to choose **D**, Player Two
would still choose **D** (since she prefers the
punishment to the sucker payoff), and he would end up with the
punishment payoff. Since he prefers the punishment payoff to the
sucker payoff, Player One will choose **D** on the first
move and both players will end up with the punishment payoff. This
kind of “backward” reasoning, in which the players first
evaluate what would happen on the last move if various game histories
were realized, and use this to determine what would happen on
preceding moves applies quite broadly to games in extensive form, and
a more general version of it will be discussed under *finite
iteration* below.

The farmer's dilemma can be represented in normal form by
understanding Player One to be choosing between **C** and
**D** and Player Two to be (simultaneously) choosing
among four conditional moves: cooperate unconditionally
(**Cu**), defect unconditionally (**Du**),
imitate Player One's move (**I**), and do the opposite of
Player One's move (**O**). The result is a two player
game with the following matrix.

CuDuIOCR,RS,TR,RS,TDT,SP,PP,PT,S

The reader may note that this game is a (multiple-move) equilibrium
dilemma. The sole (weak) nash equilibrium results when Player One
chooses **D** and Player Two chooses **Du**,
thereby achieving for themselves the inferior payoffs of *P*
and *P*. The game is not, however, a dominance PD. Indeed,
there is no dominant move for either player. It is commonly believed
that rational self-interested players will reach a nash equilibrium
even when neither player has a dominant move. If so, the farmer's
dilemma is still a dilemma.

To preserve the symmetry between the players that characterizes the
ordinary PD, we may wish to modify the asynchronous game. Let us take
extended PD to be played in stages. First each player chooses a first
move (**C** or **D**) and a second move (
**Cu**, **Du**, **I** or
**O**). Next a referee determines who moves first, giving
each player an equal chance. Finally the outcome is computed in the
appropriate way. For example, suppose Row plays (**D**,
**O**) (meaning that he will defect if he moves first and
do the opposite of his opponent if he moves second) and Column plays
(**C**, **Du**). Then Row will get
*P* if he goes first and *T* if he goes second, which
implies that his expected payoff is 1/2(*P*+*T*). Column
will get *S* if she goes first and *P* if she goes
second, giving her an expected payoff of
1/2(*P*+*S*). It is straightforward, but tedious, to
calculate the entire eight by eight payoff matrix. After doing so, the
reader may observe that, like the farmer's dilemma, the symmetric form
of the extended PD is an equilibrium PD, but not a dominance PD. The
sole nash equilibrium occurs when both players adopt the strategy
(**D**, **Du**), thereby achieving the
inferior payoffs of (*P*, *P*).

It may be worth noting that an asynchronous version of the Stag Hunt, unlike the PD, presents few issues of interest. If the first player does his part in the hunt for stag on day one, the second should do her part on day two. If he hunts hare on day one, she should do likewise on day two. The first player, realizing this, should hunt stag on day one. So rational players should have no difficulty reaching the cooperative outcome in the asynchronous Stag Hunt.

## 10. Transparency

Another way that conditional moves can be introduced into the PD is by
assuming that players have the property that David Gauthier has
labeled *transparency*. A fully transparent player is one whose
intentions are completely visible to others. Nobody holds that we
humans are fully transparent, but the observation that we can often
successfully predict what others will do suggests that we are at least
“translucent.” Furthermore agents of larger scale, like
firms or countries, which may have to publicly deliberate before
acting, may be more transparent than we are. Thus there may be some
theoretical interest in investigations of PDs with transparent
players. Such players could presumably execute conditional strategies
more sophisticated than those of the (non- transparent) extended game
players, strategies, for example that are conditional on the
conditional strategies employed by others. There is some difficulty,
however, in determining exactly what strategies are feasible for such
players. Suppose Row adopted the strategy “do the same as
Column” and Column adopted the strategy “do the opposite
of Row”. There is no way that both these strategies could be
satisfied. On the other hand, if each adopted the strategy
“imitate the other player”, there are two ways the
strategies could be satisfied, and there is no way to determine which
of the two they would adopt. Nigel Howard, who was probably the first
to study such conditional strategies systematically, avoided this
difficulty by insisting on a rigidly typed hierarchy of games. At the
base level we have the ordinary PD game, where each player chooses
between **C** and **D**. For any game
*G* in the hierarchy we can generate two new games
*R**G* and *C**G*. In
*R**G*, Column has the same moves as in game *G*
and Row can choose any function that assigns **C** or
**D** to each of Column's possible moves. Similarly in
*C**G*, Row has the same moves as in *G* and
Column has a new set of conditional moves. For example, if [PD] is the
base level game, then *C*[PD] is the game in which Column can
choose from among the strategies **Cu**,
**Du**, **I** and **O**
mentioned above. Howard observed that in the two third level games
*R**C*[PD] and *C**R*[PD] (and in every
higher level game) there is an equilibrium outcome giving each player
*R*. In particular, such an equilibrium is reached when one
player plays **I** and the other cooperates when his
opponent plays **I** and defects when his opponent plays
**Cu**, **Du** or **O**. Notice
that this last strategy is tantamount to Danielson's *reciprocal
cooperation*.

The lesson of all this for rational action is not clear. Suppose two players in a PD were sufficiently transparent to employ the conditional strategies of higher level games. How do they decide what level game to play? Who chooses the imitation move and who chooses reciprocal cooperation? To make a move in a higher level game is presumably to form an intention observable by the other player. But why should either player expect the intention to be carried out if there is benefit in ignoring it?

Conditional strategies have a more convincing application when we take
our inquiry as directed, not towards playing the PD, but as designing
agents who would play it well with a variety of likely opponents. This
is the viewpoint of Danielson. (See also J.V. Howard for an earlier
enlightening discussion of this viewpoint.) A conditional strategy is
not an intention that a player forms as a move in a game, but a
deterministic algorithm defining a kind of player. Indeed, one of the
lessons of the PD may be that transparent agents are better off if
they can form irrevocable “action protocols” rather than
always following the intentions they may form at the time of action.
Danielson does not limit himself *a priori* to strategies
within Howard's hierarchy. An agent is simply a computer program,
which can contain lines permitting other programs to read and execute
it. We could easily write two such programs, each designed to
determine whether its opponent plays **C** or
**D** and to do the opposite. What happens when these two
play a PD depends on the details of implementation, but it is likely
that they will be “incoherent,” i.e., they will enter
endless loops and be unable to make any move at all. To be successful
a program *should* be able to move when paired with a variety
of other programs, including copies of itself, and it should be able
to get valuable outcomes. Programs implementing **I** and
**O** in a straightforward way are not likely to succeed
because when paired with each other they will be incoherent. Programs
implementing **Du** are not likely to succeed because
they get only *P* when paired with their clones. Those
implementing **Cu** are not likely to succeed because
they get only *S* when paired with programs that recognize and
exploit their unconditionally cooperative nature. There is some
vagueness in the criteria of success. In Howard's scheme we could
compare a conditional strategy with all the possible alternatives of
that level. Here, where any two programs can be paired, that approach
is senseless. Nevertheless, certain programs seem to do well when
paired with a wide variety of players. One is a version of the
strategy that Gauthier has advocated as *constrained
maximization*. The idea is that a player *j* should
cooperate if the other would cooperate if *j* did, and defect
otherwise. As stated, this appears to be a strategy for the
*R**C*[PD] or *C**R*[PD] games. It is not
clear how a program implementing it would move (if indeed it does
move) when paired with itself. Danielson is able to construct an
approximation to *constrained maximization*, however, that does
cooperate with itself. Danielson's program (and other implementations
of *constrained maximization*) cannot be coherently paired with
everything. Nevertheless it does move and score well against familiar
strategies. It cooperates with **Cu** and itself and it
defects against **Du**. If it is coherently paired it
seems guaranteed a payoff no worse than *P*.

A second successful program models Danielson's *reciprocal
cooperation*. Again, it is not clear that the strategy (as
formulated above) allows it to cooperate (or make any move) with
itself, but Danielson is able to construct an approximation that does.
The (approximate) *reciprocal cooperation* does as well as
(approximate) *constrained maximization* against itself,
**Du** and *constrained maximization*. Against
**Cu** it does even better, getting *T* where
*constrained maximization* got only *R*.

## 11. Finite Iteration

Many of the situations that are alleged to have the structure of the PD, like defense appropriations of military rivals or price setting for duopolistic firms are better modeled by an iterated version of the game in which players play the PD repeatedly, retaining access at each round to the results of all previous rounds. In these iterated PDs (hence forth IPDs) players who defect in one round can be “punished” by defections in subsequent rounds and those who cooperate can be rewarded by cooperation. Thus the appropriate strategy for rationally self-interested players is no longer obvious. The theoretical answer to this question, it turns out, depends strongly on the definition of IPD employed and the knowledge attributed to rational players.

An IPD can be represented in extensive form by a tree diagram like the one for the farmer's dilemma above.

Figure 3

Here we have an IPD of length two. The end of each of the two rounds of the game is marked by a dotted vertical line. The payoffs to each of the two players (obtained by adding their payoffs for the two rounds) are listed at the end of each path through the tree. The representation differs from the previous one in that the two nodes on each branch within the same division mark simultaneous choices by the two players. Since neither player knows the move of the other at the same round, the IPD does not qualify as one of the game theorist's standard “games of perfect information.” If the players move in succession rather than simultaneously (which we might indicate by removing the dotted vertical lines), the resulting game is an iterated farmer's dilemma, which does meet the game theorist's definition and which shares many of the features that make the IPD interesting.

Like the farmer's dilemma, an IPD can, in theory, be represented in
normal form by taking the players' moves to be *strategies*
telling them how to move if they should reach any node at the end of a
round of the game tree. The number of strategies increases very
rapidly with the length of the game so that it is impossible in
practice to write out the normal form for all but the shortest
IPD's. Every pair of strategies determines a “play” of the
game, i.e., a path through the extensive-form tree.

In a game like this, the notion of nash equilibrium loses some of its
privileged status. Recall that a pair of moves is a nash equilibrium
if each is a best reply to the other. Let us extend the notation used
in the discussion of the asynchronous PD and let **Du**
be the strategy that calls for defection at every node of an IPD. It
is easy to see that **Du** and **Du** form a
nash equilibrium. But against **Du**, a strategy that
calls for defection unless the other player cooperated at, say, the
fifteenth node, would determine the same play (and therefore the same
payoffs) as **Du** itself does. The components that call
for cooperation never come into play, because the other player does
not cooperate on the fifteenth (or any other) move. Similarly, a
strategy calling for cooperation after the second cooperation by
itself does equally well. Thus these strategies and many others form
nash equilibria with **Du**. There is a sense in which
these strategies are clearly not equally rational. Although they yield
the same payoffs at the nodes along the path representing the actual
play, they would not yield the same payoffs if other nodes had been
reached. If Player One *had* cooperated in the past, that would
still provide no good reason for him to cooperate now. A nash
equilibrium requires only that the two strategies are best replies to
each other as the game actually develops. A stronger solution concept
for extensive-form games requires that the two strategies would still
be best replies to each other no matter what node on the game tree
were reached. This notion of *subgame-perfect equilibrium* is
defined and defended in Selten 1975. It can be expressed by saying
that the strategy-pair is a nash equilibrium for every subgame of the
original game, where a subgame is the result of taking a node of the
original game tree as the root, pruning away everything that does not
descend from it.

Given this new, stronger solution concept, we can ask about the
solutions to the IPD. There is a significant theoretical difference on
this matter between IPDs of fixed, finite length, like the one
pictured above, and those of infinite or indefinitely finite
length. In games of the first kind, one can prove by an argument known
as *backward induction* that **Du**,
**Du** is the only subgame perfect equilibrium. Suppose
the players know the game will last exactly *n* rounds. Then,
no matter what node have been reached, at round *n*-1 the
players face an ordinary (“one-shot”) PD, and they will
defect. At round *n*-2 the players know that, whatever they do
now, they will both defect at the next round. Thus it is rational for
them to defect now as well. By repeating this argument sufficiently
many times, the rational players deduce that they should defect at
every node on the tree. Indeed, since at every node defection is a
best response to any move, there can be no other subgame-perfect
equilibria.

In practice, there is not a great difference between how people behave
in long fixed-length IPDs (except in the final few rounds) and those
of indeterminate length. This suggests that some of the rationality
and common knowledge assumptions used in the backward induction
argument (and elsewhere in game theory) are unrealistic. There is a
considerable literature attempting to formulate the argument
carefully, examine its assumptions, and to see how relaxing
unrealistic assumptions might change the rationally acceptable
strategies in the PD and other games of fixed length. (For a small
sample, see Bovens, Kreps *et al*, Kreps and Wilson, Pettit and
Sugden, Sobel 1993 and Binmore 1997).

Player One's belief that there is a slight chance that Two might
pursue an “irrational” strategy other than continual
defection could make it rational for her to cooperate frequently
herself. Indeed, even if One were certain of Two's rationality, One's
belief that there was some chance that Two believed she harbored such
doubts could have the same effect. Thus the argument for continual
defection in the IPD of fixed length depends on complex iterated
claims of certain knowledge of rationality. An even more unrealistic
assumption, noted by Rabinowicz and others, is that each player
continue to believe that the other will choose rationally on the next
move even after evidence of irrational play on previous moves. For
example, it is assumed that, at the node reached after a long series
of moves (**C**, **C**),
…,(**C**, **C**), Player One will
choose **D** despite never having done so before.

Some have used these kinds of observation to argue that the backward induction argument shows that standard assumptions about rationality (with other plausible assumptions) are inconsistent or self-defeating. For (with plausible assumptions) one way to ensure that a rational player will doubt one's own rationality is to behave irrationally. In the fixed-length IPD, for example, Player One may be able to deduce that, if she were to follow an appropriate “irrational” strategy, Player Two would rationally react so that they can achieve mutual cooperation in almost all rounds. So our assumptions seem to imply both that Player One should continually defect and that she would do better if she didn't. (See Skyrms 1990, pp. 125-139 and Bicchieri 1989.)

## 12. The Centipede and the Finite IPD

Many of the issues raised by the fixed-length IPD can be raised in
even starker form by a somewhat simpler game. Consider a PD in which
they punishment payoff is zero. Now iterate the asynchronous version
of this game a fixed number times. Imagine that both players are
restricted to highly “punitive” strategies according to
which, they must always defect against a player who has ever
defected. (One important strategy of this variety is discussed below
under the label **GRIM**.) The result is a
*centipede* game. A particularly nice realization is given by
Sobel 2005. A stack of *n* one-dollar bills lies on a
table. Players take turns taking money from the stack, one or two
bills per turn. The game ends when the stack runs out or one of the
players takes two bills (whichever comes first). Both players keep
what they have taken to that point. The extensive form of the game
with for *n*=4 is pictured below.

Figure 4

Presumably the true centipede would contain 100 “legs” and
the general form discussed here should really be called the
“*n*-tipede.” The game appears to be discussed
first in Rosenthal.

As in the fixed-length PD, a backward induction argument easily
establishes that a rational player should take two bills on his first
move, giving her a payoff of $2 or $3 dollars, depending on whether
she moves first or second, and leaving the remainder of the *n*
dollars undistributed. In more technical terms, the only nash
equilibria of the game are those where the first player takes two
dollars on the first move and the only subgame perfect equilibrium is
the one in which both players take $2 on any turn they should
get. Again, common sense and experimental evidence suggest that real
players rarely act in this way and this leads to questions about
exactly what assumptions this kind of argument requires and whether
they are realistic. (In addition to the sample mentioned in the
section on finitely iterated PDs, see, for example, Aumann 1998,
Selten 1978, and Rabinowicz.) The centipede also raises the same
questions about cooperation and socially desirable altruism as does
the PD and it is a favorite tool in empirical investigations of game
playing.

## 13. Infinite Iteration

One way to avoid the dubious conclusion of the backward induction argument without delving too deeply into conditions of knowledge and rationality is to consider infinitely repeated PDs. No human agents can actually play an infinitely repeated game, of course, but the infinite IPD has been considered an appropriate way to model a series of interactions in which the participants never have reason to think the current interaction is their last. In this setting a pair of strategies determines an infinite path through of the game tree. If the payoffs of the one-shot game are positive, their total along any such path is infinite. This makes it somewhat awkward to compare strategies. If we confine ourselves to those strategies that can be implemented by mechanical devices (with finite memories and speeds of computation), however, it turns out that the sequence of payoffs to each player will always, after a finite number of rounds, cycle repeatedly through a particular finite sequence of payoffs. The relative value of such infinite sequences of payoffs can then be identified with the average value of the payoffs in one cycle. This value reflects the limit of average payoff per round as the number of rounds increases. (See Binmore 1992, page 365 for further justification.) Since there is no last round, it is obvious that backward induction does not apply to the infinite IPD.

## 14. Indefinite Iteration

Most contemporary investigations the IPD take it to be neither
infinite nor of fixed finite length but rather of indeterminate
length. This is accomplished by including in the game specification a
probability *p* (the “shadow of the future”) such
that at each round the game will continue with probability
*p*. Alternatively, a “discount factor” *p*
is applied to the payoffs after each round so that present payoffs are
valued more highly than future. Mathematically, it makes little
difference whether *p* is regarded as a probability of
continuation or a discount on payoffs. The value of cooperation at a
given stage in an IPD clearly depends on the odds of meeting one's
opponent in later rounds. (This has been said to explain why the level
of courtesy is higher in a village than a metropolis and why customers
tend leave better tips in local restaurants than distant ones.) As
*p* approaches zero, the IPD becomes a one-shot PD, and the
value of defection increases. As *p* approaches one the IPD
becomes an infinite IPD, and the value of defection decreases. It is
also customary to insist that the game has the property labeled RCA
above, so that (in the symmetric game) players do better by
cooperating on every round than they would do by “taking
turns” — you cooperate while I defect and then I cooperate
while you defect.

There is an observation, apparently originating in Kavka, 1983, and
given more mathematical form in Carroll, that the backward induction
argument applies as long as an upper bound to the length of the game
is common knowledge. For if *b* is such an upper bound, then,
if the players were to get to stage *b*, they would know that
it was the last round and they would defect; if they were to get to
stage *b*-1, they would know that their behavior on this round
cannot affect the decision to defect on the next, and so they would
defect; and so on. It seems an easy matter to compute upper bounds on
the number of interactions in real-life situations. For example, since
shopkeeper Jones cannot make more than one sale a second and since he
will live less than a thousand years, he and customer Smith can
calculate (conservatively) that they cannot possibly conduct more than
10^{12} transactions. It is instructive to examine this
argument more closely in order to dramatize the assumptions made in
standard treatments of the indefinite IPD and other indefinitely
repeated games. Note first that, in an indefinite IPD as described
above, there can be no upper bound on the length of the game. There
is, instead, some fixed probability *p* that, at any time in
which the game is still being played, it will continue to be played
with probability *p*. If the interaction of Smith and Jones
were modeled as an indefinite IPD, therefore, the probability of their
interacting in a thousand years would not be zero, but rather some
number greater than *p*^{k} where *p*
is the probability of their interacting again now and *k* is
the number of seconds in a thousand years. A more realistic way to
model the interaction might be to allow the value of *p* to
decrease as the game progressed. As long as *p* always remains
greater than zero, however, it remains true that there can be no upper
bound on the number of possible interactions, i.e., no time at which
the probability of future interactions becomes zero. Suppose, on the
other hand, that there *was* a number *n* such that that
there was zero probability of the game's continuing to stage
*n*. Let *p*_{1}, …,
*p*_{n} be the probabilities that game
continues after stage 1, …, stage *n*. Then there must
be a smallest *i* such that *p*_{i}
becomes 0. (It would happen at *i*=*n* if not sooner.)
Given the standard common knowledge assumptions that we have been
making, the players would know this value of *i*, and the IPD
would be one of fixed length, and not an indefinite IPD at all. In the
case of the shopkeeper and his customer, we are to suppose that both
know today that their last interaction will occur, let's say, at noon
on June 10th, 2020. The very plausible idea that we began with, viz.,
that *some* upper bounds on the number of interactions are
common knowledge, even though the smallest upper bound is not, is
incompatible with the assumption that we know all the continuation
probabilities *p*_{i} from the start.

As Becker and Cudd astutely observe, we don't need an upper bound on
the number of possible iterations to make a backward induction
argument for defection possible. If the players know all the values of
*p*_{i} from the outset, then, as long as the
value of *p*_{i} becomes and remains
sufficiently small, they (and we) can compute a stage *k* at
which the risk of future punishment and the chance of future reward no
longer outweighs the benefit of immediate defection. So they know
their opponent will defect at stage *k*, and the induction
begins. This modification of the Kavka/Carroll argument, however, only
further exposes the implausibility of its assumptions. Not only are
Smith and Jones expected to believe that there is non-zero probability
that they will be interacting in a thousand years, each is expected to
be able to compute the precise day on which future interactions will
become and remain so unlikely that their expected future return is
outweighed by that day's payoff. Furthermore each is expected to
believe that the other has made this computation, and that the other
expects him to have made it, and so on.

The iterated version of the PD was discussed from the time the game
was devised, but interest accelerated after influential publications
of Robert Axelrod in the early eighties. Axelrod invited professional
game theorists to submit computer programs for playing IPDs. All the
programs were entered into a tournament in which each played every
other (as well as a clone of itself and a strategy that cooperated and
defected at random) hundreds of times. It is easy to see that in a
game like this no strategy is “best” in the sense that its
score would be highest among any group of competitors. If the other
strategies never consider the previous history of interaction in
choosing their next move, it would be best to defect
unconditionally. If the other strategies all begin by cooperating and
then “punish” any defection against themselves by
defecting on all subsequent rounds, then a policy of unconditional
cooperation is better. Nevertheless, as in the transparent game, some
strategies have features that seem to allow them to do well in a
variety of environments. The strategy that scored highest in Axelrod's
initial tournament, Tit for Tat (henceforth **TFT**),
simply cooperates on the first round and imitates its opponent's
previous move thereafter. More significant than **TFT**'s
initial victory, perhaps is the fact that it won Axelrod's second
tournament, whose sixty three entrants were all given the results of
the first tournament. In analyzing the his second tournament, Axelrod
noted that each of the entrants could be assigned one of five
“representative” strategies in such a way that a
strategy's success against a set of others can be accurately predicted
by its success against their representative. As a further
demonstration of the strength of **TFT**, he calculated
the scores each strategy would have received in tournaments in which
one of the representative strategies was five times as common as in
the original tournament. **TFT** received the highest
score in all but one of these hypothetical tournaments.

Axelrod attributed the success of **TFT** to four
properties. It is *nice*, meaning that it is never the first to
defect. The eight nice entries in Axelrod's tournament were the eight
highest ranking strategies. It is *retaliatory*, making it
difficult for it to be exploited by the rules that were not nice. It
is *forgiving*, in the sense of being willing to cooperate even
with those who have defected against it (provided their defection
wasn't in the immediately preceding round). An unforgiving rule is
incapable of ever getting the reward payoff after its opponent has
defected once. And it is *clear*, presumably making it easier
for other strategies to predict its behavior so as to facilitate
mutually beneficial interaction.

Suggestive as Axelrod's discussion is, it is worth noting that the
ideas are not formulated precisely enough to permit a rigorous
demonstration of the supremacy of **TFT**. One doesn't
know, for example, the extent of the class of strategies that might
have the four properties outlined, or what success criteria might be
implied by having them. It is true that if one's opponent is playing
**TFT** (and the shadow of the future is sufficiently
large) then one's maximum payoff is obtained by a strategy that
results in mutual cooperation on every round. Since
**TFT** is itself one such strategy this implies that
**TFT** forms a nash equilibrium with itself in the space
of all strategies. But that does not particularly distinguish
**TFT**, for **Du**, **Du** is
also a nash equilibrium. Indeed, a “folk theorem” of
iterated game theory (now widely published — see, for example,
Binmore 1992, pp. 373-377) implies that, for any *p*,
0≤*p*≤1 there is a nash equilibrium in which *p*
is the fraction of times that mutual cooperation occurs. Indeed
**TFT** is, in some respects, *worse* than many of
these other equilibrium strategies, because the folk theorem can be
sharpened to a similar result about subgame perfect
equilibria. **TFT** is, in general, *not* subgame
perfect. For, were one **TFT** player (*per
impossible*) to defect against another in a single round, the
second would have done better as an unconditional cooperator.

## 15. Iteration With Error

In a survey of the field several years after the publication of the
results reported above, Axelrod and Dion, chronicle several successes
of **TFT** and modifications of it. They conclude that
“research has shown that many of Axelrod's findings…can
be generalized to settings that are quite different from the original
two-player iterated Prisoner's Dilemma game.” But in several
reasonable settings **TFT** has serious drawbacks. One
such case, noted in the Axelrod and Dion survey, is when attempts are
made to incorporate the plausible assumption that players are subject
to errors of execution and perception. There are a number of ways this
can be done. Bendor, for example, considers “noisy
payoffs.” When a player cooperates while its opponent defects,
its payoff is *S*+*e*, where *e* is a random
variable whose expected value is 0. Each player infers the other's
move from its own payoff, and so if *e* is sufficiently high
its inference may be mistaken. Sugden (pp 112-115) considers players
who have a certain probability of making an error of execution that is
apparent to them but not their opponents. Such players can adopt
strategies by which they “atone” for mistaken defections
by being more cooperative on later rounds than they would be after
intended defection. Assuming that players themselves cannot
distinguish a mistaken move or observation from a real one, however,
the simplest way to model the inevitability of error is simply to
forbid completely deterministic strategies like **TFT**,
replacing them with “imperfect” counterparts, like
“imitate the other player's last move with 99% probability and
oppose it with 1% probability.” **Imperfect TFT**
is much less attractive than its deterministic sibling, because when
two **imperfect TFT** strategies play each other, an
“error” by either one will set off a long chain of moves
in which the players take turns defecting. In a long iterated game
between two **imperfect TFT**'s with any probability
*p* of error, 0 < *p* < 1/2, players will approach
the same average payoffs as in a game between two strategies that
choose randomly between cooperation and defection, namely
1/4(*R*+*P*+*S*+*T*). That is considerably
worse than the payoff of *R*, that results when *p*=0.

The predominant view seems to be that, when imperfection is
inevitable, successful strategies will have to be more forgiving of
defections by their opponents (since those defections might well be
unintended). Molander 1985 demonstrates that strategies that mix
**TFT** with **Cu** do approach a payoff of
*R* as the probability of error approaches zero. When these
mixes play each other, they benefit from higher ratios of
**Cu** to **TFT**, but if they become too
generous, they risk exploitation by “stingy” strategies
that mix **TFT** with defection. Molander calculates that
when the mix is set so that, following a defection, one cooperates
with probability *g*(*R*, *P*, *T*,
*S*)=min{1-(*T*-*R*)/(*R*-*S*),
(*R*-*P*)/(*T*-*P*)}, the generous
strategies will get the highest score with each other that is possible
without allowing stingy strategies to do better against them than TFT
does. Following Nowak and Sigmund, we label this strategy
**generous TFT**, or **GTFT**.

The idea that the presence of imperfection induces greater forgiveness
or generosity is only plausible for low levels of imperfection. As the
level of imperfection approaches 1/2, **Imperfect TFT**
becomes indistinguishable from the random strategy, for which the very
ungenerous **Du** is the best reply. A simulation by
Kollock seems to confirm that at high levels of imperfection, more
stinginess is better policy than more forgiveness. But Bendor, Kramer
and Swistak note that the strategies employed in the Kollock
simulation are not representative and so the results must be
interpreted with caution.

A second idea is that an imperfect environment encourages strategies
to observe their opponent's play more carefully. In a tournament
similar to Axelrod's (Donninger) in which each player's moves were
subject to a 10% chance of alteration, **TFT** finished
sixth out twenty-one strategies. As might have predicted on the
dominant view, it was beaten by the more generous
**Tit-for-Two-Tats** (which cooperates unless defected
against twice in a row). It was also beaten, however, by two versions
of **Downing**, a program that bases each new move on its
best estimate how responsive its opponent has been to its previous
moves. In Axelrod's two original tournaments, **Downing**
had ranked near the bottom third of the programs submitted. Bendor
(1987) demonstrates deductively that against imperfect strategies
there are advantages to basing one's probability of defection on
longer histories than does **TFT**.

One clever implementation of the idea that a strategies in an
imperfect environment should pay attention to their previous
interactions is the family of “Pavlovian” strategies
investigated by Kraines and Kraines. For each natural number
*n*, *n*-Pavlov, or
**P**_{n}, adjusts its probability of
cooperation in units of 1/*n*, according to how well it fared
on the previous round. More precisely, if
**P**_{n} was cooperating with
probability *p* on the last round, then on this round it will
cooperate with probability *p*[+](1/*n*) if it received
the reward payoff on the previous round,
*p*[−](1/*n*) if it received the punishment
payoff, *p*[+](2/*n*)if it received the temptation
payoff, and *p*[−](2/*n*) if it received the
sucker payoff. [+] and [−] are bounded addition and subtraction,
i.e., *x*[+]*y* is the sum *x*+*y* unless
that number exceeds one, in which case it is one (or as close to one
as the possibility of error allows), and *x*[−]*y*
is similarly either *x*-*y* or close to zero. Strictly
speaking, **P**_{n} is not fully
specified until an initial probability of cooperation is given, but
for most purposes the value of that parameter becomes insignificant in
sufficiently long games and can be safely ignored. It may appear that
**P**_{n} requires far more
computational resources to implement than, say,
**TFT**. Each move for the latter depends on only on its
opponent's last move, whereas each move for
**P**_{n} is a function of the entire
history of previous moves of both players.
**P**_{n}, however, can always calculate
its next move by tracking only its current probability of cooperation
and its last payoff. As its authors maintain, this seems like “a
natural strategy in the animal world.” One can calculate that
for *n*>1, **P**_{n} does
better against the random strategy than does
**TFT**. More generally,
**P**_{n} does as well or better than
**TFT** against the generous unresponsive strategies
**Cp** that always cooperate with fixed probability
*p*≥1/2 (because an occasional temptation payoff can teach
it to exploit the unresponsive strategies.) In these cases the
“slow learner” versions of Pavlov with higher values of
*n* do slightly better than the “fast learners”
with low values. Against responsive strategies, like other Pavlovian
strategies and **TFT**,
**P**_{n} and its opponent eventually
reach a state of (almost) constant cooperation. The total payoff is
then inversely related to the “training time,” i.e., the
number of rounds required to reach that state. Since training time of
**P**_{n} varies exponentially with
*n*, Kraines and Kraines maintain that
**P**_{3} or **P**_{4} are
to be preferred to other Pavlovian strategies, and are close to
“ideal” IPD strategies. It should be noted, however, that
when (deterministic) **TFT** plays itself, no training
time at all is required, whereas when a Pavlovian strategy plays
**TFT** or another Pavlov, the training time can be
large. Thus the cogency of the argument for the superiority of Pavlov
over **TFT** depends on the observation that its
performance shows less degradation when subject to imperfections. It
is also worth remembering that no strategy is best in every
environment, and the criteria used in defense of various strategies in
the IPD are vague and heterogeneous. One advantage of the evolutionary
versions of the IPD discussed in the next section is that they permit
more careful formulation and evaluation of success criteria.

## 16. Evolution

Perhaps the most active area of research on the PD concerns evolutionary versions of the game. A population of players employing various strategies play IPDs among themselves. The lower scoring strategies decrease in number, the higher scoring increase, and the process is repeated. Thus success in an evolutionary PD (henceforth EPD), requires doing well with other successful strategies, rather than doing well with a wide range of strategies.

The initial population in an EPD can be represented by a set of pairs
{(*p*_{1}, *s*_{1}),
…(*p*_{n},
*s*_{n})} where *p*_{1},
…, *p*_{n} are the proportions of the
population playing strategies **s _{1}**,
…,

**s**, respectively. The description of EPDs given above does not specify exactly how the population of strategies is to be reconstituted after each IPD. The usual assumption, and the most sensible one for biological applications, is that a score in any round indicates the relative number of “offspring” in the next. It is assumed that the size of the entire population stays fixed, so that births of more successful strategies are exactly offset by deaths of less successful ones. This amounts to the condition that the proportion

_{n}*p*

_{i}* of each strategy

*s*

_{i}in the successor population is determined by the equation

*p*

_{i}*=

*p*

_{i}(

*V*

_{i}/

*V*), where

*V*

_{i}is the score of

*s*

_{i}in the previous round and

*V*is the average of all scores in the population. Thus every strategy that scores above the population average will increase in number and every one that scores below the average will decrease. This kind of evolution is referred to as “replicator dynamics” or evolution according to the “proportional fitness” rule. Other rules of evolution are possible. Bendor and Swistak argue that, for social applications, it makes more sense to think of the players as switching from one strategy to another rather than as coming into and of existence. Since rational players would presumably switch only to strategies that received the highest payoff in previous rounds, only the highest scoring strategies would increase in numbers. A variety of other possible evolutionary dynamics are described and discussed in Kuhn 2004. Discussion here, however, will primarily concern EPDs with the proportional fitness rule.

Axelrod, borrowing from Trivers and Maynard Smith, includes a
description of the EPD with proportional fitness, and a brief analysis
of the evolutionary version of his IPD tournament. For Axelrod, the
EPD provides one more piece of evidence in favor of
**TFT**:

TIT FOR TAT had a very slight lead in the original tournament, and never lost this lead in simulated generations. By the one-thousandth generation it was the most successful rule and still growing at a faster rate than any other rule.

Axelrod's EPD tournament, however, incorporated several features that
might be deemed artificial. First, it permitted deterministic
strategies in a noise-free environment. As noted above,
**TFT** can be expected to do worse under conditions that
model the inevitability of error. Second, it began with only the 63
strategies from the original IPD tournament. Success against
strategies concocted in the ivory tower may not imply success against
all those that might be found in nature. Third, the only strategies
permitted to compete at a given stage were the survivors from the
previous stage. A more realistic model, one might argue, would allow
new “mutant” strategies to enter the game at any
stage. Changing this third feature might well be expected to hurt
**TFT**. For a large growth in the **TFT**
population would make it possible for mutants employing more naive
strategies like **Cu** to regain a foothold, and the
presence of these naifs in the population might favor nastier
strategies like **Du** over **TFT**.

Nowak and Sigmund simulated two kinds of tournaments that avoid the
three questionable features. The first examined the family of
“reactive” strategies. For any probabilities *y*,
*p*, and *q*, **R**(*y*, *p*,
*q*) is the strategy of cooperating with probability *y*
in the first round and thereafter with probability *p* if the
other player has cooperated in the previous round, and with
probability *q* if she has defected. This is a broad family,
including many of the strategies already
considered. **Cu**, **Du**,
**TFT**, and **Cp** are
**R**(1,1,1), **R**(0,0,0),
**R**(1,1,0), and **R**(*p*,
*p*, *p*). To capture the inevitability of error, Nowak
and Sigmund exclude the deterministic strategies, where *p* and
*q* are exactly 1 or 0, from their tournaments. As before, if
the game is sufficiently long (and *p* and *q* are not
integers), the first move can be ignored and a reactive strategy can
be identified with its *p* and *q* values. Particular
attention is paid to the strategies close to Molander's
**GTFT** described above, where *p*=1 and
*q*=min{1-(*T*-*R*)/(*R*-*S*),
(*R*-*P*)/(*T*-*P*). The first series of
Nowak and Sigmund's EPD tournaments begin with representative samples
of reactive strategies. For most such tournaments, they found that
evolution led irreversibly to **Du**. Those strategies
**R**(*p*, *q*) closest to
**R**(0,0) thrived while the others perished. When one of
the initial strategies is very close to **TFT**, however,
the outcome changes.

TFT and all other reciprocating strategies (near (1,0)) seem to have disappeared. But an embattled minority remains and fights back. The tide turns when ‘suckers’ are so decimated that exploiters can no longer feed on them. Slowly at first, but gathering momentum, the reciprocators come back, and the exploiters now wane. But theTFT-like strategy that caused this reversal of fortune is not going to profit from it: having eliminated the exploiters, it is robbed of its mission and superseded by the strategy closest toGTFT. Evolution then stops. Even if we introduce occasionally 1% of another strategy it will vanish.

On the basis of their tournaments among reactive strategies, Nowak and
Sigmund conjectured that, while **TFT** is essential for
the emergence of cooperation, the strategy that actually underlies
persistent patterns of cooperation in the biological world is more
likely to be **GTFT**.

A second series of simulations with a wider class of strategies,
however, forced them to revise their opinion. The strategies
considered in the second series allowed each player to base its
probability of cooperation on its own previous move as well as its
opponent's. A strategy can now be represented as
**S**(*p*_{1}, *p*_{2},
*p*_{3}, *p*_{4}) where
*p*_{1}, *p*_{2},
*p*_{3}, *p*_{4} are the probabilities
of defecting after outcomes (**C**, **C**),
(**C**, **D**), (**D**,
**C**), and (**D**, **D**),
respectively i.e., after receiving the reward, sucker, temptation and
punishment payoffs. (Again, we can ignore the probability of
defecting on the first move as long as the
*p*_{i}s are not zero or one.) The initial
population in these tournaments all play the random strategy
**S**(.5, .5, .5, .5) and after every 100 generations a
small amount of a randomly chosen (non-deterministic) mutant is
introduced, and the population evolves by proportional fitness. The
results are quite different than before. After 10^{7}
generations, a state of steady mutual cooperation was reached in 90%
of the simulation trials. But less than 8.3% of these states were
populated by players using **TFT** or
**GTFT**. The remaining 91.7% were dominated by
strategies close to **S**(1,0,0,1). This is the just the
Pavlovian strategy **P**_{1} of Kraines and
Kraines, which cooperates after receiving *R* or *T* and
defects after receiving *P* or *S*. Kraines and Kraines
had been somewhat dismissive of **P**_{1}. They
recall that Rapoport and Chammah, who identified it early in the
history of game theory had labeled it “simpleton” and
remark that “the appellation is well deserved”. Indeed,
**P**_{1} has the unfortunate characteristic of
trying to cooperate with **Du** on every other turn, and
against **TFT** it can get locked into the inferior
repeating series of payoffs *T*, *P*, *S*,
*T*, *P*, *S*, … . But Nowak and Sigmund's
simulations suggest that these defects do not matter very much in
evolutionary contexts. One reason may be that
**P**_{1} helps to make its environment
unsuitable for its enemies. **Du** does well in an
environment with generous strategies, like **Cu** or
**GTFT**. **TFT**, as we have seen, allows
these strategies to flourish, which could pave the way for
**Du**. Thus, although **TFT** fares less
badly against **Du** than **P**_{1}
does, **P**_{1} is better at keeping its
environment free of **Du**.

Simulations in a universe of deterministic strategies yield results
quite different than those of Nowak and Sigmund. Bruce Linster (1992
and 1994) suggests that natural classes of strategies and realistic
mechanisms of evolution can be defined by representing strategies as
simple *Moore machines*. For example,
**P _{1}** is represented by the machine pictured
below.

Figure 5

This machine has two states, indicated by circles. It begins in the
leftmost state. The **C** in the left circle means that
the machine cooperates on the first move. The arrow leading from the
left to the right circle indicates that machine defects (enters the
**D**) after it has cooperated (been in the
**C** state) and its opponent has defected (the arrow is
labeled by *d*). Linster has conducted simulations of
evolutionary PD's among the strategies that can be represented by
two-state Moore machines. It turns out that these are exactly the
deterministic versions of the **S** strategies of Nowak
and Sigmund. Since the strategies are deterministic, we must
distinguish between the versions that cooperate on the first round and
those that defect on the first round. Among the first round
cooperators, **S**(0,0,0,0), **S**(0,0,0,1),
**S**(0,0,1,0) and **S**(0,0,1,1) all
represent the strategy **Cu** of unconditional
cooperation. Similarly, four of the first-round defectors all
represent **Du**. Each of the other
**S**(*p*_{1}, *p*_{2},
*p*_{3}, *p*_{4}) where
*p*_{1}, *p*_{2},
*p*_{3}, *p*_{4} are either zero or one
represent unique strategies. By deleting the six duplicates from the
thirty-two deterministic versions of Nowak and Sigmund's strategies,
we obtain the twenty-six “two-state” strategies considered
by Linster.

Linster simulated a variety of EPD tournaments among the two-state
strategies. Some used “uniform mutation” in which each
strategy in the population has an equal probability *m* of
mutating into any of the other strategies. Some used “stylized
mutation” in which the only mutations permitted are those that
can be understood as the result of a single “broken link”
in the Moore machine diagrams. In some, mutations were assumed to
occur to a tiny proportion of the population at each generation; in
others the “mutants” represented an invading force
amounting to one percent of the original population. In some, a
penalty was levied for increased complexity in the form of reduced
payoffs for machines requiring more states or more links. As one might
expect, results vary somewhat depending on conditions. There are some
striking differences, however, between all of Linster's results and
those of Nowak and Sigmund. In Linster's tournaments, no single
strategy ever dominated the surviving populations in the way that
**P**_{1} and **GTFT** did in Nowak
and Sigmund's. The one strategy that did generally come to comprise
over fifty percent of the population was the initially-cooperating
version of **S**(0,1,1,1). This is a strategy whose
imperfect variants seem to have been remarkably uncompetitive for
Nowak and Sigmund. It has been frequently discussed in the game theory
literature under the label **GRIM** or
**TRIGGER**. It cooperates until its opponent has
defected once, and then defects for the rest of the game. According to
Skyrms (1998) and Vanderschraaf, both Hobbes and Hume identified it as
the strategy that underlies our cooperative behavior in important
PD-like situations. The explanation for the discrepancy between
**GRIM's** performance for Linster and for Nowak and
Sigmund probably has to do with its sharp deterioration in the
presence of error. In a match between two imperfect
**GRIM**s, an “erronious” defection by either
leads to a long string of mutual defections. Thus, in the long run
imperfect **GRIM** does poorly against itself. The other
strategies that survived (in lesser numbers) Linster's tournaments are
**TFT**, **P**_{1},
**Cu**, and the initially-cooperative
**S**(0,1,1,0). (Note that imperfect
**GRIM** is also likely to do poorly against imperfect
versions of these.) The observation that evolution might lead to a
stable mix of strategies (perhaps each serving to protect others
against particular types of invaders) rather than a single dominant
strategy is suggestive. Equally suggestive is the result obtained
under a few special conditions in which evolution leads to a recurring
cycle of population mixes.

One might expect it to be possible to predict the strategies that will
prevail in EPDs meeting various conditions, and to justify such
predictions by formal proofs. Until recently, however, mathematical
analyses of the EPD have been plagued by conceptual confusions about
“evolutionary stability,” the condition under which, as
Nowak and Sigmund say, “evolution stops”. Axelrod and
Axelrod & Hamilton claim to show that **TFT** is
evolutionarily stable. Selten 1983, includes an example of a game
with no evolutionarily stable strategy, and Selten's argument that
there is no such strategy clearly applies to the **EPD**
and other evolutionary games. Boyd and Lorberbaum and Farrell and Ware
present still different proofs demonstrating that no strategies for
the **EPD** are evolutionarily stable. Unsurprisingly,
the paradox is resolved by observing that the three groups of authors
each employ slightly different conceptions of evolutionary
stability. The conceptual tangle is unraveled in a series of papers by
Bendor and Swistak. Two stability concepts are described and applied
to the EPD below. Readers who wish to compare these with some others
that appear in the literature may consult the following brief
guide:

Concepts of Stability in Evolutionary Games.

A strategy **s** for an evolutionary game has
*universal strong narrow stability*
(“usn-stability”) if a population playing strategy
**s** will, under any rule of evolution, drive to
extinction any sufficiently small group of invaders all of which play
the same strategy. An evolutionary game has usn-stability just in case
it meets a simple condition on payoffs identified by Maynard
Smith:

MS) For all strategies j,V(i,i) >V(j,i) or bothV(i,i)=V(j,i) andV(i,j)>V(j,j)

(Here, and in what follows, the notation
*V*(**i**, **j**) indicates the
payoff to strategy **i** when **i** plays
**j**.) MS says that any invaders do strictly worse
against the natives than the natives themselves do against the natives
or else they get exactly the same payoff against the natives as the
natives themselves do, but the native does better against the invader
than the invader himself does.

For any strategy **i** in the IPD (or indeed in any
iterated finite game), however, there are strategies
**j** different from **i** such that
**j** mimics the way **i** plays when it
plays against **i** or **j**. The existence
of these “neutral mutants” implies that MS cannot be
satisfied and so no EPD has usn-stability. This argument, of course,
uses the assumption that any strategy in the iterated game is a
possible invader. There may be good reason to restrict the available
strategies. For example, if the players are assumed to have no
knowledge of previous interactions, then it may be appropriate to
restrict available strategies to the unconditional ones. Since a pair
of players then get the same payoffs in every round of an iterated
game, we may as well take each round of the evolutionary game to be
one-shot games between every pair of players rather than iterated
games. Indeed, this is the kind of evolutionary game that Maynard
Smith himself considered. In this framework, any strategy
**S** such that (**S**, **S**)
is a strict nash equilibrium in the underlying one-shot game
(including unconditional defection in the PD) meets the MS
condition. Thus MS and usn-stability are non-trivial conditions in
some contexts.

A strategy **s** has *restricted weak broad
stability)* (rwb-stability) if, when evolution proceeds according
to the proportional fitness rule and the native population is playing
**s**, any (possibly heterogeneous) group of invaders of
sufficiently small size will fail to drive the natives to
extinction. This condition turns out to be equivalent to a weakened
version of MS identified by Bendor and Swistak.

BS) For all strategies j,V(i,i) >V(j,i) or bothV(i,i)=V(j,i) andV(i,j)≥V(j,j)

BS and rwb-stability are non-trivial conditions in the more general
evolutionary framework: strategies for the EPD that satisfy
rwb-stability do exist. This does not particularly vindicate any of
the strategies discussed above, however. Bendor and Swistak prove a
result analogous to the folk theorem mentioned previously: If the
shadow of the future is sufficiently large, there are rwb-stable
strategies supporting any degree of cooperation from zero to one. One
way to distinguish among the strategies that meet BS is by the size of
the invasion required to overturn the natives, or, equivalently, by
the proportion of natives required to maintain stability. Bendor and
Swistak show that this number, the *minimal stabilizing
frequency*, never exceeds 1/2: no population can resist every
invading group as large as itself. They maintain that this result does
allow them to begin to provide a theoretical justification for
Axelrod's claims. They are able to show that, as the shadow of the
future approaches one, any strategy that is nice (meaning that it is
never first to defect) and retaliatory (meaning that it always defects
immediately after it has been defected against) has a minimal
stabilizing frequency approaching one half. **TFT** has
both these properties and, in fact, they are the first two of the four
properties Axelrod cited as instrumental to **TFT**'s
success. There are, of course, many other nice and retaliatory
strategies, and there are strategies (like
**P**_{1}) that are not retaliatory but still
satisfy rwb-stability. But Bendor and Swistak are at least able to
show that any “maximally robust” strategy, i.e., any
strategy whose minimum stabilizing frequency approaches one half,
chooses cooperation on all but a finite number of moves in an
infinitely repeated PD.

Bendor and Swistak's results must be interpreted with some care.
First, one should keep in mind that no probabilistic or noise-
sensitive strategies can fit the definitions of either
“nice” or “retaliatory”
strategies. Furthermore, imperfect versions of **TFT** do
not satisfy rwb-stability. They can be overthrown by arbitrarily small
invasions of deterministic **TFT** or, indeed, by
arbitrary small invasions of any less imperfect
**TFT**. Second, one must remember that the results about
minimal stabilizing frequencies only concern weak stability. If the
number of generations is large compared with the original population
(as it often is in biological applications), a population that is
initially composed entirely of players employing the same maximally
robust strategy, could well admit a sequence of small invading groups
that eventually reduces the original strategy to less than half of the
population. At that point the original strategy could be
overthrown.

It is likely that both of these caveats play some role in explaining
an apparent discrepancy between the Bendor/Swistak results and the
Nowak/Sigmund simulations. One would expect Bendor/Swistak's minimal
stabilizing frequency to provide some indication of the length of time
that a population plays a particular strategy. A strategy requiring a
large invasion to overturn is likely to prevail longer than a strategy
requiring only a small invasion. A straightforward calculation reveals
that **P**_{1} has a relatively low minimum
stabilizing frequency. It is overturned by invasions of unconditional
defectors exceeding 10% of the population. Yet in the Nowak/Sigmund
simulations, **P**_{1}-like strategies predominate
over **TFT**-like strategies. Since the simulations
required imperfection and since they generated a sequence of mutants
vastly larger than the original population, there is no real
contradiction here. Nevertheless the discrepancy suggests that we do
not yet have a theoretical understanding of EPDs sufficient to predict
the strategies that will emerge under various plausible conditions.

Like usn-stability, the concept of rwb-stability can be more
discriminating if it is relativized to a particular set of strategies.
Molander's 1992 investigation of Schelling's many-person version of
the PD, for example, restricts attention to the family
{**S**_{1}, …,
**S**_{n}} of **TFT**-like
stratgies. A player adopting **S**_{i}
cooperates on the first round and on every subsequent round after at
least *i* others cooperate. By construing stability as
resistance to invasions by other family members, Molander is able to
show that there are conditions under which a particular mix of two of
the **S**_{i}'s (one equivalent to
**Du**) is uniquely stable. The significance of results
like these, however, depends on the plausibility of such limitations
on the set of permissible strategies.

## 17. Spatial PDs

A previous section discussed a controversial argument that cooperation is rational in a PD when each player knows that the other is enough like himself to make it likely that they will choose the same move. An analog of this argument in the evolutionary context is more obviously cogent. If agents are not paired at random, but rather are more likely to play others employing similar strategies, then cooperative behavior is more likely to emerge.

There are at least three mechanisms by which this kind of “association” among players can be achieved. One such mechanism in evolutionary PDs has been widely studied under the label “spatial PD.” Players are arranged in some “geographical” arrangement. This may be an array with a rectangular boundary, for example, or a circle, or surface of a sphere or surface of a torus with no boundary. From the geographical arrangement two (possibly identical) kinds of neighborhoods are identified for each player. Agents meet only those in their “interaction” neighborhood, and the evolutionary dynamics considers only the payoffs to those in their “comparison” neighborhood. Generally, the evolutionary dynamics employed is one of “winner imitation” within the interaction neighborhood. (This can model either the idea that each player is invaded by its most successful neighbor or the idea that each player adopts the most successful strategy that it sees.) Because both evolution and interaction are “local,” players are more likely (after the first round) to meet those playing strategies like their own in an SPD than they would be in an ordinary evolutionary game. In addition to the “association” effects, one should also keep in mind that the outcome of SPDs may be influenced by winner imitation dynamics, which may drive to extinction strategies that might survive—and eventually predominate—with the replicator dynamics more commonly employed in ordinary EPDs.

As usual, the impetus for looking at spatial SPDs seems to come from Axelrod. Four copies of each of the 63 strategies submitted to Axelrod's tournament were arranged on a grid with a spherical geometry so that each cell had four neighbors for both interaction and comparison. For every initial random distribution, the resulting SPD eventually reached a state where the strategy in every cell was cooperating with all its neighbors, at which point no further evolution is possible. Only about ten of the 63 original strategies remained in these end-states, and they were no longer randomly distributed, but segregated into clumps of various sizes. Axelrod also showed that under special conditions evolution in an SPD can create successions of complex symmetrical patterns that do not appear to reach any steady-state equilibrium.

To get an idea of why cooperative behavior might spread in this and
similar frameworks, consider two agents on either side of a frontier
between cooperating and non-cooperating subpopulations. The
cooperative agent sees a cooperative neighbor whose four neighbors all
cooperate, and who therefore gets four times the reward payoff after
playing them all. So he will imitate this neighbor's strategy and
remain cooperative. The non-cooperating agent, on the other hand, sees
his cooperative counterpart, who gets three reward payoffs from his
cooperative neighbors and one sucker payoff. He compares this to the
payoffs of his non-cooperatiave neighbors. The best these can do is to
get three punishments and a temptation. So, as long as
3*R*+*S* exceeds 3*P*+*T*, the
non-coperative agent on the frontier will adopt the strategy of his
cooperative neighbor. Axelrod's payoffs of 5,3,1 and 0 for *T*,
*R*, *P* and *S*, do meet this condition.

Nowak and May have investigated in greater detail SPDs in which the
only permitted strategies are **Cu** and
**Du**. (These are the strategies appropriate among
individuals lacking memory or recognition skills.) They find that, for
a variety of spatial configurations, and distributions of strategies
evolution depends on relative payoffs in a uniform way. When the
temptation payoff is sufficiently high, clusters of
**Du** grow and those of **Cu** shrink; when
it is sufficiently low, the **Du** clusters shrink and
the **Cu** ones grow. For a narrow range of intermediate
values, we get more of the complicated patterns noted above. The
evolving patterns exhibit great variety. For a given spatial
configuration, however, the ratio of the two strategies seems to
approach the same constant value for all initial distributions of
strategies and all payoffs within the special range. More recently,
Nowak, Boenhoeffer and May have observed similar phenomena under a
variety of error-conditions identified by Mukherji and Rajan, although
cooperators seem to require lower relative temptation values to thrive
under these conditions, and the level of error must be sufficiently
low.

Grim, Mar and St Denis report a number of SPD simulations with a
greater variety of initial strategies. In general their observations
confirm the plausible conjecture that cooperative outcomes are more
common in SPDs than ordinary EPDs. Simulations starting with all of
the pure reactive strategies of Nowak and Sigmund (i.e., all of the
strategies **R**(*y*, *p*, *q*)
described above where *y*, *p* and *q* are either
0 or 1.), all ended with **TFT** (i.e., with
**R**(1,1,0)) as the only survivor (though other
outcomes—including one in which **Du** is the sole
survivor and ones in which **Cu** and
**TFT** are intermixed—are clearly possible.)
Simulations of the 64 possible pure strategies in which a move may
depend on the opponent's previous two moves, ended with mixed
populations of survivors all of whom defect after two defections,
cooperate after two cooperations and cooperate in the second round of
the game. (Again, other outcomes are possible.) Simulations with many
(viz., 100) evenly distributed samples of Nowak and Sigmunds mixed
reactive strategies, tended to be taken over by
**R**(.99, .1), which is a version of generous
**TFT** with slightly less generosity than
**GTFT**. Simulations beginning with a random selection
of a few (viz., 8) of these strategies tended to evolve to a mixed
stable or cyclic pattern dominated by a single version of generous
**TFT** with considerably more generosity than
**GTFT**. **R**(.99, .6) seems to have been
a frequent victor.

The “geographical” aspect of SPD's need not be taken too literally. For social applications, and probably even for biological ones, there seems to be no motivation for any particular geometrical arrangement. (Why not a “honeycomb,” for example, where each agent has six neighbors, rather than a grid where each agent has four?) The interest in SPDs presumably lies in the insight that my “neighborhood” of interaction and my “neighborhood” of comparison, is much smaller than the population as a whole even if it turns out not to be limited by details of physical geography. Nevertheless SPD models of the evolution of cooperation in particular geometrical arrangements have given us some suggestive and pretty pictures to contemplate. Several examples are accessible through the links at the end of this entry.

## 18. PDs and Social Networks

One way to make the idea of local interaction more realistic for some
applications is to let the agents *choose* the partners with
whom to interact, based on payoffs in past interactions. Skyrms 2004
considers iterated PDs among a population of unconditional cooperators
and defectors. Initially, as usual, each agent chooses a partner at
random from the remaining members of the population. For subsequent
interactions, however, the odds of choosing that partner are adjusted,
according to either the payoffs from previous times that partner was
chosen, or (more realistically) the payoffs from previous times that
there has been interaction with that partner (regardless of which one
was “chooser”). In a typical PD, where the payoffs for
temptation, reward, punishment and sucker are 3,2,1 and 0, both
cooperators and defectors eventually choose only cooperators. Since
the cooperators are chosen by both cooperators and defectors, they
play more often than the defectors who play only when they are
chosen. If we assume that there is an equal division between
cooperators and defectors, then cooperators can expect a return of two
reward payoffs, while defectors can expect a return of one temptation
payoff. So with payoff structure indicated, cooperators do better,
even with this “one-way” association. The story may
unfold somewhat differently in what Skyrms calls an
“attenuated” PD, where the payoffs are, let us say, 2.01,
2, 1.98, and 0. (We might think of this as the “Just Don't Be a
Sucker” game.) Here, as before, the cooperators quickly learn
not to choose defectors as partners. The defectors get roughly the
same payoffs whether they choose cooperators or defectors as
partners. Since they rapidly cease being chosen by cooperators,
however, their returns from interactions with cooperators will be less
than returns from defectors and they will soon limit their choices to
other defectors. (It is important to understand here that the learning
algorithm that determines the probability I will interact with agent
**a** depends on *total* returns from interacting
with **a** (or total *recent* returns from
interacting with **a**) rather than *average*
returns from interacting with **a**.) So in the
attenuated game we end up with perfect association: defectors play
defectors and cooperators play cooperators. Since the reward payoff
slightly exceeds the punishment payoff, the cooperators again do
better than the defectors.

The social network games considered above are not really evolutionary PDs in the sense described above. The patterns of interaction evolve, but the strategy profile of the population remains fixed. It is natural to allow both strategies and probabilities of interaction to evolve simultaneously as payoffs are distributed. Whether cooperation or defection (or neither) comes to dominate the population under such conditions depends on a multitude of factors: the values of the payoffs, the initial distribution of strategies, the relative speed of the adjustments in strategy and interaction probabilities, and other properties of those two evolutionary dynamics. Skyrms 2004 contains a general discussion and a number of suggestive examples, but it does not provide (or aim to provide) a comprehensive account of social network PDs or a careful analysis of precise formulations to properly model particular phenomena. Much remains unknown.

## 19. Group Selection and the Haystack PD

A third mechanism by which players can be made more likely to meet
those like themselves is to consider a more sophisticated dynamics of
evolution that operates on groups of players as well as on the
individuals within those groups. There has been a heated debate among
biologists and philosophers of biology about the appropriate
“units of selection” on which natural selection
operates. The idea that in many cases it makes sense to take these
units to be groups of individuals (instead of, or in addition to,
genes or individuals) has recently been resuscitated as a respectable
and plausible viewpoint. (See Sober and Wilson or Wilson and Sober for
a history and impassioned defense of this resuscitation.) For cultural
evolution, the idea is equally plausible—within-group behavior
may be in equilibrium, but the equilibria reached by different groups
may be different. Less successful groups may imitate, be replaced by,
or lose members to, more successful groups. Sober and Wilson sometimes
write as if evolutionary game theory is an *alternative*
viewpoint to group selection, but it is important to understand that
this is only true of simple evolutionary models like those presented
above. More sophisticated evolutionary games are possible. Consider,
for example, a simple version of the *haystack model*
originally described by John Maynard Smith. Pairs of players from a
large population pair randomly. Each pair colonizes a single
haystack. The pair plays a prisoners dilemma and the payoffs to an
individual determine the number of offspring of that individual in the
next generation. (Parents die when the children are born.) The members
of the colony pair randomly with other members and play the PD for
some fixed number of generations. Then the haystacks are torn down,
the population mixes and random pairs colonize next season's
haystacks. One simple way to represent the *n*-generation
*haystack PD*, as we might call it is to view it as a game
between the two initial founders of a haystack with the payoff to a
founder being set to the number of living descendants who are using
his strategy. (This idea is suggested in Bergstrom and reported in
Skyrms 2004.) For example, suppose *n*=3 and the temptation,
reward, punishment and sucker payoffs are set to 5,3,1,0. Then, if
Player One cooperates and player Two defects, the payoff to Player One
will be 0, because a cooperator gets 0 offspring in the second, and
any subsequent, generation. The payoff to player Two will be 5 because
the defector has five (like-minded) offspring among the second
generation and each of these has one in the third generation since
there are no cooperators left to meet. The full payoff matrix for the
four generation haystack PD with payoffs 3,2,1, and 0 is given by the
matrix below.

CDC8,8 0,3 D3,0 1,1

As Skyrms 2004 notes, this matrix characterizes an ordinary Stag Hunt
game, as defined above. In fact, Skyrms' observation is generally
true. For any PD game *g*, if *n* is sufficiently
large, the *n*-generation haystack version of *g* is a
Stag Hunt. A simple argument for this result is given in the following
very short document:

Haystack PDs Become Stag Hunts.

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## Other Internet Resources

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- Interactive Prisoner's Dilemma (at the Serendip pages at Bryn Mawr).

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