Supplement to Propositional Attitude Reports

Definite Descriptions

Russell's reply to Frege involves his theory of definite descriptions. (See the entry on Bertrand Russell.) According to this theory, sentences with definite descriptions, phrases of the form the F, are to be analyzed so that the definite description is not a unitary part of the sentence or “breaks up under analysis.” (1) below is to be understood as equivalent to (2).

(1) The man wearing a beret is bald.

(2) Some man is wearing a beret, and at most one man is wearing a beret, and he is bald.

There is no unit in (2) that corresponds to the subject phrase ‘the man wearing a beret’ in (1). This facilitates a response to versions of the Fregean puzzle involving definite descriptions, because sentences with co-designating definite descriptions have different contents, in virtue of the different conditions involved.

More complex sentences with definite descriptions will often be ambiguous. For example, (3) below is ambiguous between A version and B version.

(3) George IV believed that the person who wrote Waverly was famous.

A version: George IV believed that some person wrote Waverly, at most one person wrote Waverly, and every person who wrote Waverly is famous.

B version: Some person wrote Waverly, at most one person wrote Waverly, and every person who wrote Waverly is such that George IV believed that he was famous.

The pronoun ‘he’ in B version is bound by a quantifer. If George IV was in doubt about the identity of the author of Waverly, wondering whether it was Sir Walter Scott or someone else, then the A version would be true, but the B version could be false. George IV would be engaged in a general belief, without specific knowledge of any person's writing of Waverly, and that is captured by the A version.

Retaining the definite description, we could distinguish the two readings of the sentence as follows:

A version: George believed that this was true: the author of Waverly was famous.

B version: The author of Waverly was such that George IV believed that he was famous.

This is a distinction in the scope of the definite description. In the A version, the definite description has narrow scope, within the scope of ‘believes’. In the B version, the definite description has wide scope, in effect "picking out" an individual and then ascribing to George IV a belief about that individual. The A version can also be identified as a de dicto ascription of belief (relating him to a dictum, a complete proposition), whereas the B version is a de re ascription of belief (relating him to an individual, a res, that his belief is about). (See the supplementary document on The De Re/De Dicto Distinction.)

Frege's puzzle concerns questions like the following:

How could this be true: Albert believes that the Venus rises in the morning, though this is not true: Albert believes that the evening star rises in the morning?

Since Venus is the evening star, why does substitution of one name for the other affect the correctness of the ascription? Russell’s answer lies in recognizing the ambiguity in the second sentence, which involves a definite description.

Albert believes that the evening star rises in the morning.

A version: Albert believes that this is true: the evening star rises in the morning.

B version: The evening star is such that Albert believes that it rises in the morning.

The falsity of the A version does not conflict with Albert's belief about Venus, that it rises in the morning, since the A version ascribes a belief in a complete dictum and does not relate Albert to an individual. The difference in truth-value between Albert believes that the Venus rises in the morning and Albert believes that the evening star rises in the morning is no longer puzzling. The B version captures what is right: that Albert has a belief about a particular individual (that we are now identifying as the evening star, even though Albert wouldn't so identify it in this context), a belief that it rises in the morning.

This solution requires that we make sense of quantification into belief contexts (the B version), so that we have a real distinction. (See the discussion in the supplementary document, The De Re/De Dicto Distinction, op. cit.) Not all accept this. The solution is also limited, because it applies only to versions of the puzzle that involve definite descriptions. Russell himself would not have found this to be a limitation. He maintained that all thought about individuals other than one’s own sense data (and perhaps oneself) is thought by description. Russell maintained that one can only think directly about that for which a Frege puzzle is impossible. Everything else involves thought under a description. Thus, according to Russell, the only time a Frege-style case can arise is when Russell’s solution in terms of different definite descriptions will be applicable. But Russell is right about this only if he is right about his (severe) limitation on what we can think directly about.

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Copyright © 2010 by
Thomas McKay <tjmckay@syr.edu>
Michael Nelson <mnelson@ucr.edu>

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