Notes to Emergent Properties

1. In the early twentieth century, the vitalist view was championed by Hans Driesch (1908-9) and (1914).

2. See McLaughlin 1992, section IV, for further discussion of Mill on this point.

3. Broad supposed the case for emergence is generally empirical in character, based on the strikingly different form of confirmed high-level laws and the inability of theorists to derive them from lower-level laws, or even conceive how this might in principle be done. However, he also believed there is a good a priori argument for the emergent status of secondary qualities, such as color:

The concepts of the various colours -- red, blue, green, etc. -- are not contained in the general concept of Colour in the sense in which we might quite fairly say that the concepts of all possible motions are contained in the general concepts of Space and of Motion. We have no difficulty in conceiving and adequately describing determinate possible motions which we have never witnessed and which we never shall witness. We have merely to assign a determinate direction and a determinate velocity. But we could not possibly have formed the concept of such a colour as blue or such a shade as sky-blue unless we had perceived instances of it, no matter how much we had reflected on the concept of Colour in general or on the instances of other colours and shades which we had seen. It follows that, even when we know that a certain kind of secondary quality (e.g., colour) pervades or seems to pervade a region when and only when such and such a kind of microscopic event (e.g., vibrations) is going on within the region, we still could not possibly predict that such and such a determinate event of the kind (e.g., a circular movement of a certain period) would be connected with such and such a determinate shade of colour (e.g., sky-blue). The trans-physical laws are then necessarily of the emergent type. (1925, pp. 80)

4. The major source for Alexander is his series of Gifford Lectures, Space, Time, and Deity (1920). He cites Morgan's Instinct and Experience (1912), though Morgan's most important work came just after - his own series of Gifford Lectures, the crucial first volume of which is Emergent Evolution (1923).

5. Note that Alexander's view of causation, discussed explicitly in Vol. I (Book II, Chapter VI, sect. B), is probably reductionistic, though the discussion is quite obscure.

6. Jerry Fodor, “Special Sciences” (1974).

7. Silberstein and McGeever (1999) might share this view of the failure of supervenience for emergent properties, but they do not address this point explicitly. Here is what they do say:

By [ontological emergence] we mean features of systems or wholes that possess causal capacities not reducible to any of the intrinsic causal capacities of the parts nor to any of the (reducible) relations between the parts. Emergent properties are properties of a system taken as a whole which exert a causal influence on the parts of the system consistent with, but distinct from, the causal capacities of the parts themselves. Ontological emergence therefore entails the failure of part-whole reductionism, as well as the failure of mereological supervenience. ( p.182)

8. Humphreys writes that usually the fusion operation results in a mere concatenation of properties; of course, concatenated properties do not lose their identity. Concatenation is denoted by ‘+’. To simplify matters, we will assume that fusion only produces emergents. To that end we distinguish fusion from concatenation.

9. This picture obviously draws its inspiration from relational holist interpretations of quantum mechanical 'superpositional' states. (See Teller 1986, 1992, and also Richard Healey's entry holism and nonseparability in physics.) But Humphreys appears to allow that it may have application outside this microscopic domain.

10. An important reply to Pepper is Meehl and Sellars (1956).

11. Shoemaker first suggested this move in correspondence to one of us (TO), and it is discussed in O'Connor 1994 and 2000b. Shoemaker has since set out this picture as a way of explicating the concept of emergence in “Kim on Emergence.” We do not take Shoemaker's proposal to be a friendly amendment to the emergentist picture, for reasons indicated in O'Connor and Wong [forthcoming].

12. Some agree with this assessment for qualitative features of conscious experience only, whereas others will extend it to intentional features as well. On qualitative character, see Jackson (1982) and Chalmers (1996). On intentional properties, see Searle (1992), whose exact view, however, is difficult to pin down.

13. See Hasker (1999) and O'Connor (2000).

14. On illusory beliefs concerning conscious experience, see Dennett (1988). On illusions of direct control over action, see Thomas Nagel (1986), pp.114-15 and John Searle (1984), pp.87-88.

15. Harman (1990), Tye (1995), and Dretske (1995).

16. Sydney Shoemaker (1994).

17. This is the view of a great many contemporary philosophers.

18. Daniel Dennett, Elbow Room (1984).

19. See, e.g., Nicolis and Prigogine (1977) and Prigogine and Stengers (1984).

20. R. B. Laughlin and Pines (2000) and Laughlin et al., (2000).

Copyright © 2012 by
Timothy O'Connor <>
Hong Yu Wong <>

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