#### Supplement to Propositions

## The Multiple Relation Theory

For defenders of the Russellian Multiple Relation Theory, a standard belief-ascription, ‘S believes that p’ is understood to state the holding of a certain cognitive relation between S and the designata of the components of ‘p’, rather than a relation to a proposition.

We will discuss two questions for the Russellian: (1) Does it have the problems of standard conceptualist theories? and (2) Does it really avoid the Substitution Problem and the Objectivization Effect?

Because Moltmann's theory is the most detailed Russellian theory in the literature, it will be our chief focus.

*Problem 1.* Conceptualist theories of a kind of entity, the
Fs, etc. conceive of the Fs as in some way dependent on the mind. Such
theories encounter problems, then, when the entities in question seem
to have properties that are incompatible with mind-dependence. Russell
conceded that “you have to say you believe propositions.”
(1918, 223) You have to say, in other words, that many ordinary
statements using special NPs or nominals for propositions can be true
(these include nominal relative clauses, quantifiers, and nominal
complements of the form ‘the proposition that p’). But how
can the likes of “S believes the proposition that p” be
true, unless belief is a relation to propositions?

The Russellian answer is that propositions exist as derived objects.
Moltmann develops the idea in following way. Propositions are
“attitudinal objects”. An attitudinal object is an object
of the form f(R, p, x), where R is a kind of attitude, p is a
“structured proposition” (essentially, an ordered n-tuple
of the appropriate sort), and x is an agent or kind of agent. This
attitudinal object exists iff the agent x (or an agent of the kind x)
stands in R to the constituents of p. The attitudinal object's
existence, then, is derived from attitudes in a clear sense. Moreover,
it derives its key semantic features from those of the structured
proposition it is, in part, derived from. It is a *qua-object,*
in the terminology of Fine (1980).

Moltmann introduces kinds of agents in order to explain how
sentences such as ‘I believe what Mary believes’ can be
true. The relevant attitudinal object (“proposition”)
won't be my standing in the belief relation to certain
individuals and properties, but rather there being some agent of kind A
standing in the belief relation to these things. To explain how
sentences such as ‘I accept what Mary just denied’ may be
true, Moltmann allows the relation component R in some attitudinal
objects to shrink to something as thin as “entertaining.”
So the relevant attitudinal object would be there being some agent of
kind A standing in the entertaining relation to such and such things.
Or, in Moltmann's notation, the relevant attitudinal object is
f(R_{ent}, p, A), where f is a function taking the entertaining
relation, R_{ent}, a structured proposition p, and a kind of
agent A as arguments and returning there being an agent of kind A
standing in R_{ent} to the constituents of p.

Now for the possible problem. Moltmann's attitudinal objects
may not be as plentiful as one might like. Consider the sentence
‘There are truths that no one has or will entertain’. This
is presumably true. But there cannot be appropriate attitudinal objects
to make it true. To make it true, an attitudinal object
f(R_{ent}, p, A) would have to exist despite the fact that no
agent of kind A (or any other kind) entertains the components of p. And
Moltmann-propositions will presumably not satisfy intuitive general
principles about propositions. For example, propositionhood will not be
closed under elementary logical operations (conjunction, disjunction),
and true propositions may sometimes lack instances witnessing to their
truth.

In effect, Problem 1 merely brings out the force of the Easy Arguments for mind-independence and abstractness, which are discussed in Section 7.

*Problem 2.* Does the Russellian theory avoid the
Substitution Problem and the Objectivization Effect? Compare these two
inferences:

1. S believes that p.

2. S believes the proposition that p.

If 1 is true, then 2 is true. Compare:

3. S holds that p.

4. S holds the proposition that p.

If 3 is true, 4 will not be true. What accounts for the difference?

Let us examine how Moltmann's theory treats these inferences.
Her full account requires technical resources which we do not have
space to discuss. Our treatment of it will therefore be rather rough.
Why does the inference from 1 to 2 succeed, for Moltmann? The answer is
as follows. If 1 is true, then there is an attitudinal object
f(R_{bel}, p, S). Moreover, context supplies a function
f_{c}, which, in effect, “thins” this attitudinal
object. f_{c} takes <R_{bel}, p, S> into
<R_{ent}, p, A>. Applying f to the latter gives us a
proposition, f(R_{ent}, p, A). 2 is therefore true because it
states that there is an attitudinal object f(R_{ent}, p, A)
such that it is a thinning of some attitudinal object
f(R_{bel}, p, S). But why does the inference from 3 to 4 fail?
Why doesn't context provide an f_{c} that thins the
attitudinal object f(R_{holds}, p, S) into f(R_{ent},
p, A), thus insuring that from the truth of 3, the truth of 4 follows?
Presumably, this can only be explained by positing that
‘holds’ in 4 means something different than it does in 3,
and in particular that ‘holds’ exhibits objectivization in
4. And we will want to be told why objectivization occurs in 4 but not
in 3. The interested reader should consult Moltmann (2003, 2004).