Supplement to Propositions

The Multiple Relation Theory

For defenders of the Russellian Multiple Relation Theory, a standard belief-ascription, ‘S believes that p’ is understood to state the holding of a certain cognitive relation between S and the designata of the components of ‘p’, rather than a relation to a proposition.

We will discuss two questions for the Russellian: (1) Does it have the problems of standard conceptualist theories? and (2) Does it really avoid the Substitution Problem and the Objectivization Effect?

Because Moltmann's theory is the most detailed Russellian theory in the literature, it will be our chief focus.

Problem 1. Conceptualist theories of a kind of entity, the Fs, etc. conceive of the Fs as in some way dependent on the mind. Such theories encounter problems, then, when the entities in question seem to have properties that are incompatible with mind-dependence. Russell conceded that “you have to say you believe propositions.” (1918, 223) You have to say, in other words, that many ordinary statements using special NPs or nominals for propositions can be true (these include nominal relative clauses, quantifiers, and nominal complements of the form ‘the proposition that p’). But how can the likes of “S believes the proposition that p” be true, unless belief is a relation to propositions?

The Russellian answer is that propositions exist as derived objects. Moltmann develops the idea in following way. Propositions are “attitudinal objects”. An attitudinal object is an object of the form f(R, p, x), where R is a kind of attitude, p is a “structured proposition” (essentially, an ordered n-tuple of the appropriate sort), and x is an agent or kind of agent. This attitudinal object exists iff the agent x (or an agent of the kind x) stands in R to the constituents of p. The attitudinal object's existence, then, is derived from attitudes in a clear sense. Moreover, it derives its key semantic features from those of the structured proposition it is, in part, derived from. It is a qua-object, in the terminology of Fine (1980).

Moltmann introduces kinds of agents in order to explain how sentences such as ‘I believe what Mary believes’ can be true. The relevant attitudinal object (“proposition”) won't be my standing in the belief relation to certain individuals and properties, but rather there being some agent of kind A standing in the belief relation to these things. To explain how sentences such as ‘I accept what Mary just denied’ may be true, Moltmann allows the relation component R in some attitudinal objects to shrink to something as thin as “entertaining.” So the relevant attitudinal object would be there being some agent of kind A standing in the entertaining relation to such and such things. Or, in Moltmann's notation, the relevant attitudinal object is f(Rent, p, A), where f is a function taking the entertaining relation, Rent, a structured proposition p, and a kind of agent A as arguments and returning there being an agent of kind A standing in Rent to the constituents of p.

Now for the possible problem. Moltmann's attitudinal objects may not be as plentiful as one might like. Consider the sentence ‘There are truths that no one has or will entertain’. This is presumably true. But there cannot be appropriate attitudinal objects to make it true. To make it true, an attitudinal object f(Rent, p, A) would have to exist despite the fact that no agent of kind A (or any other kind) entertains the components of p. And Moltmann-propositions will presumably not satisfy intuitive general principles about propositions. For example, propositionhood will not be closed under elementary logical operations (conjunction, disjunction), and true propositions may sometimes lack instances witnessing to their truth.

In effect, Problem 1 merely brings out the force of the Easy Arguments for mind-independence and abstractness, which are discussed in Section 7.

Problem 2. Does the Russellian theory avoid the Substitution Problem and the Objectivization Effect? Compare these two inferences:

1. S believes that p.
2. S believes the proposition that p.

If 1 is true, then 2 is true. Compare:

3. S holds that p.
4. S holds the proposition that p.

If 3 is true, 4 will not be true. What accounts for the difference?

Let us examine how Moltmann's theory treats these inferences. Her full account requires technical resources which we do not have space to discuss. Our treatment of it will therefore be rather rough. Why does the inference from 1 to 2 succeed, for Moltmann? The answer is as follows. If 1 is true, then there is an attitudinal object f(Rbel, p, S). Moreover, context supplies a function fc, which, in effect, “thins” this attitudinal object. fc takes <Rbel, p, S> into <Rent, p, A>. Applying f to the latter gives us a proposition, f(Rent, p, A). 2 is therefore true because it states that there is an attitudinal object f(Rent, p, A) such that it is a thinning of some attitudinal object f(Rbel, p, S). But why does the inference from 3 to 4 fail? Why doesn't context provide an fc that thins the attitudinal object f(Rholds, p, S) into f(Rent, p, A), thus insuring that from the truth of 3, the truth of 4 follows? Presumably, this can only be explained by positing that ‘holds’ in 4 means something different than it does in 3, and in particular that ‘holds’ exhibits objectivization in 4. And we will want to be told why objectivization occurs in 4 but not in 3. The interested reader should consult Moltmann (2003, 2004).

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Matthew McGrath <>

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