Notes to Action at a Distance in Quantum Mechanics

1. Intuitively, the spin-component of a particle in a certain direction can be thought of as its intrinsic angular momentum along that direction. But, as we shall see in section 5, the nature of spin properties depends on the interpretation of quantum mechanics. In any case, the exact nature of this quantity will not be essential for what follows in sections 1-4. The important thing is that in various quantum states the properties of distant physical systems may be curiously correlated.

2. Recall Bell's (1981) example of Bertlmann's socks. ‘Dr. Bertlmann likes to wear two socks of different colours. Which colour he will have on a given foot on a given day is quite unpredictable. But when you see that the first sock is pink you can already be sure that the second sock will not be pink. Observation of the first, and experience of Bertlmann, gives immediate information about the second.’

3. Two comments:

(i) In some Bell-type models of the EPR/B experiment, it is assumed that in addition to the pair's state and the settings of the measurement apparatuses, there are other factors that may be relevant for the probabilities of measurement outcomes. In particular, in his presentation of stochastic, local models of the EPR/B experiment Bell (1971, p. 37) assumes that the setting of the apparatuses need not specify their entire relevant states. The outcomes may also be influenced by some other aspects of the apparatus microstates, which may be different for the same settings (see also Jarrett 1984). More generally, in addition to the state of the L- (R-) particle and the setting of the L- (R-) measurement apparatus, there may be some other (local) physical quantities that are relevant for the probability of the L- (R-) measurement outcome. That is, letting α and β denote all the relevant local physical quantities (other than the settings) that are relevant for the probability of the L- and the R-outcome respectively, in such models the single and joint probabilities of outcomes will be: Pλ l α(xl), Pλ r β(xl) and Pλ lr α β(xl & yr). We shall refer to this type of models in section 7. But, for the sake of simplicity, in the rest of this entry we shall focus on the simpler models above.

(ii) There are two different approaches to modeling the probabilities in Bell-type models of the EPR/B experiment: The many-spaces and the big-space approaches (see Butterfield 1989, 1992a). In the many-space approach, which we use in this review, each triple of pair's state, L- and R-setting labels a different probability space of measurement outcomes. For example, letting l and l′ be different L-apparatus settings, the probability Pλ lr(xl & yr) belongs to one probability space, whereas the probability Pλ l′r(xl′ & yr) belongs to another. By contrast, in the big-space approach, all the probabilities of a Bell-type model belong to one big probability space. In this approach the probabilities of outcomes are expressed in terms of conditional probabilities. For example, the probabilities P(xl & yr / λ & l & r) and P(xl′ & yr / λ & l′ & r) correspond to Pλ l r(xl & yr) and Pλ l′ r(xl′ & yr), respectively. (Note that in contrast to the above notation, in the literature probabilities of spin-measurement outcomes in the big-space approach are frequently expressed as conditional probabilities of non-specific spin-outcomes, i.e. the non-specific outcomes ‘up’ or ‘down’, given certain settings: P(x & y / λ & l & r), where ‘x’ and ‘y’ denote non-specific outcomes.) Mathematically, the two approaches can easily be related to each other. In particular, one can construct a big-probability space in which the conditional probabilities of outcomes, given a pair's state and apparatus settings, are equal to the corresponding unconditional probabilities in the many-spaces approaches: P(xl & yr / λ & l & r) = Pλ l r(xl & yr), P(xl′ & yr / λ & l′ & r) = Pλ l′ r(xl′ & yr), etc. But, conceptually the two approaches are different. First, in contrast to the many-spaces approach, in the big-space approach it is presupposed that settings always have definite probabilities (Butterfield 1989, p. 118, 1992a, section 2). Secondly, some of the probabilities of the big-space approach, e.g. P(xl / λ & r), have no correspondence in the many-spaces approach. Third, as we shall see in the next section, factorizability can be analyzed into two conditions: parameter independence and outcome independence. Berkovitz (2002) argues that the meaning of parameter independence need not be the same in the two different approaches. That is, in some circumstances the parameter independence of the big-space approach expresses different properties than the parameter independence of the many-spaces approach. Indeed, in these circumstances the parameter independence of the many-spaces approach fails, whereas the parameter independence of the big-space approach holds. For arguments for the superiority of the many-spaces approach over the big-space approach, see Butterfield (1989, p. 118), and Berkovitz (2002, section 4.2).

4. Or when the range of the values of λ is discrete,

Pψ l r(xl & yr) = ∑λ Pλ l r(xl & yr) · ρψ l r(λ),
Pψ l (xl) = ∑λ Pλ l (xl) · ρψ l(λ), and
Pψ r(yr) = ∑λ Pλ r(yr) · ρψ r(λ).

5. For a dissenting view, see Fine (1981, 1982a), Cartwright (1989) and Chang and Cartwright (1993). We shall discuss this view in section 9.

6. While the fullest analysis of factorizability is due to Jarrett, precursors are Suppes and Zanotti (1976) and van Fraassen (1982).

7. See van Fraassen (1982) and Jarrett (1984, 1989).

8. As we shall see below, in the literature the term ‘interpretation’ is frequently used to refer to alternative quantum theories. The question of whether this use is justified and the criteria for distinguishing between an interpretation of orthodox quantum mechanics and an alternative quantum theory will be insubstantial for the considerations below.

9. For a history of the notion of action at a distance, see Hesse (1969).

10. In reality, the position of different particles will be different: |upi>pi (|downi>pi). But this is immaterial for the analysis below.

11. This is a variant of the so-called ‘tails problem’ (see the entry on collapse theories, section 12, and Albert 1992, chapter 5).

12. For a recent interesting discussion of Newton's view of action at a distance, see Henry (1994), and references therein.

13. For the Clarke-Leibniz correspondence, see Alexander (1956).

14. Of course, here ‘field’ is not intended to mean a field in the sense of quantum field theory.

15. For discussions of this version of Bohm's theory, see for example Dürr, Goldstein and Zanghì (1992a), Albert (1992) and Cushing (1994).

16. The wave function propagates according to the Schrödinger equation in the ‘configuration’ space of the particles, which for an N-particle system is a 3N-dimensional space, coordinatized by the 3N position coordinates of the particles. For more details, see the entry on Bohmian mechanics.

17. Here follows a more technical account of the above experiment according to the minimal Bohm theory. Let the wave function, i.e. the state of the guiding field, before any measurement occurs be:

ψ = 1/√2f1(z1) f2(z2) ( |z-up>1 |z-down>2 − |z-down>1 |z-up>2),

where f1(z1) and f2(z2) are non-overlapping Gaussian wavepackets; z1 and z2 are respectively the positions of particle 1 and particle 2 along the z-direction; and |z-up> and |z-down> are z-spin eigenstates (i.e. z-spin ‘up’ and z-spin ‘down,’ respectively). Suppose that we perform a z-spin measurement on particle 1, and switch off the R-apparatus. Then (suppressing for simplicity's sake the free time evolution of the two wavepackets as they move towards their respective Stern-Gerlach devices and the states of the Stern-Gerlach devices), the state of the guiding field during the L-measurement will be:

1/√2 f2(z2) ( f1(z1 + g1T) |z-up>1 |z-down>2f1(z1g1T) |z-down>1 |z-up>2)

where g1 is the coupling constant for the spin measurement on particle 1 (coupling the position and the spin degrees of freedoms that are related to the guidance of particle 1); and T is the duration of the measurement. Since the guiding field of the particle pair factorizes into f2(z2) and ( f1(z1 + g1T) |z-up>1 |z-down>2f1(z1g1T) |z-down>1 |z-up>2), it follows from the guiding equation that particle 2's velocity along the z-axis does not depend on particle 1's position.

18. See Bohm, Schiller and Tiomno (1955), Dewdney, Holland and Kyprianidis (1987), Bohm and Hiley (1993, chapter 10), and Holland (1993).

19. While in the minimal and the non-minimal Bohm theories, the wave function is interpreted as a field, Dürr, Goldstein and Zanghì (1997, section 12) propose that the wave function should be interpreted as a parameter of a physical law. This, they argue, may explain why there is no action of configurations of particles on wave functions.

20. For discussions of the above experiment in the non-minimal theory, see Dewdney, Holland and Kyprianidis (1987), Bohm and Hiley (1993, section 10.6), and Holland (1993, section 11.3).

21. For discussions of the prospects of relativistic modal interpretations, see Dickson and Clifton (1998), Arntzenius (1998), Myrvold (2002a), Earman and Ruetsche (2005) and Berkovitz and Hemmo (2005, 2006a,b). We shall discuss this issue at the end of this section and in section 10.2.

22. If some of the ci are degenerate, the Schmidt biorthogonal decomposition is not unique, and the properties assigned by the above rule are projections onto multi-dimensional subspaces.

23. Note the difference between |ψ9> and the singlet state |ψ3>. In |ψ9>, the coefficients of the two branches of the superposition are unequal. And while EPR/B-like experiments can be prepared with both the state |ψ3> and the state |ψ9>, the difference between these states is significant for the above interpretation. For unlike |ψ3>, |ψ9> has a unique factorization. Accordingly, the L- and the R-particle each have definite spin properties in the state |ψ9> but not in |ψ3>.

24. In fact, as we shall see later in this section (in the discussion of ‘property composition’), this claim needs some qualification.

25. In the original modal interpretations, the question of the relation between the dynamics of properties of systems and the dynamics of the properties of their subsystems has been largely overlooked. For a discussion of this issue, see Vermaas (1997, 1999), Berkovitz and Hemmo (2005, 2006a,b).

26. Similarly to any other physical object, the brain of a human observer has many different sets of relational properties, i.e. sets of properties that are related to different systems. Brain properties that are defined relative to different systems are generally different. Thus, the question arises as to which of these different brain properties are correlated to our beliefs about the properties of physical systems that figure in our experience. For a discussion of this question, see Berkovitz and Hemmo (2005, section 6, 2006b, section 6).

27. The challenge is to explicate the nature of such holistic properties and to relate them to our experience.

28. That is, the property of a system is given by the spectral decomposition of its so-called ‘reduced state’ (a statistical operator obtained by a partial tracing). For example, the reduced state of the L-particle in the state |ψ9> is obtained by a partial tracing of |ψ9> over the Hilbert space of the R-particle.

29. The above formulation of screening off is motivated by the fact that we work in the framework of the many-spaces approach to the probabilities of outcomes in Bell-type models of the EPR/B experiment. In the literature, the formulation of screening off is slightly different:

P(x/y & CC(x,y)) = P(x / CC(x,y)) P(y / CC(x,y)) ≠ 0
P(y/x & CC(x,y)) = P(y / CC(x,y)) P(x / CC(x,y)) ≠ 0

30. In his celebrated theorem, Bell did not mention Reichenbach's principle or FactorUCP. But it is reasonable to assume that he had in mind some similar principles.

31. There are some obvious candidates for superluminal signaling. First, the potentials in the Schrödinger equation are Newtonian. Therefore, if one is allowed to vary the potential somewhere, this will be felt instantaneously throughout space. But, in the context of this entry such superluminal signaling is less interesting because it will be due to Newtonian effects rather than quantum effects. Second, wave functions can spread instantaneously: If you have a particle confined to a box (so that its wave function is zero outside the box) and open the box, the wave function will instantaneously be non-zero everywhere, and superluminal signaling will be possible. It is noteworthy, however, that the preparation of such state requires the existence of an infinite potential barrier—a state that is impossible. In any case, in what follows we shall focus on the question of whether the non-locality in the EPR/B experiment, as depicted by various interpretations of quantum mechanics, can be exploited to give rise to superluminal signaling.

32. Note that according to this suggestion, the statistical predictions of Bohm's theory slightly deviate from the statistical predictions of orthodox quantum mechanics.

33. It is noteworthy, however, that while separability does not imply OI, the prospects of separable models that violate OI are dim. To see why, let us consider Maudlin's (1994, p. 98) criticism of Howard's claim that OI follows from spatiotemporal separability. Maudlin invites us to consider the following model for the EPR/B experiment. Suppose that each particle had some means of superluminal communication, which may be realized by a tachyon. Suppose also that each of the particles carries the same instructions: If it arrives at a measurement apparatus without having received a message from its partner, and the measurement apparatus is in a state of being ready to measure z-spin, its state of not having definite z-spin evolves with equal chance to either the state of having z-spin ‘up’ or the state of having z-spin ‘down.’ It then communicates to its partner the setting of its measurement apparatus and the outcome of the measurement. If it receives a message from its partner, its state is modified accordingly, so that the new chance of spin outcomes agrees with the predictions of orthodox quantum mechanics. Such a model will involve a violation of OI, but by construction it is separable: The particles and the tachyons have separable states at all times, and the joint state of any two systems is just the product of their individual states. Yet, the model will be separable in the intended sense only if the above set of communication instructions could be encoded into the qualitative, intrinsic properties of each of the particles, and each of the particles could keep an open line of communication with its partner and no other particles. But a little reflection on the grave difficulties involved with that task suggests that the physical feasibility and plausibility of any such separable model of the EPR/B experiment will be highly questionable.

34. Friedman (1983, sections 4.6-4.7) holds that special relativity per se does not prohibit superluminal signaling, but that such signaling will lead to paradoxes of time travel. Maudlin (1994, pp. 112-116) argues that superluminal signaling need not imply such paradoxes, as the conditions for them are much more complex than merely the existence of superluminal signaling.

35. As Maudlin (1996, pp. 292-293) notes, it is not clear that a general criterion for identifying a structure of spacetime as intrinsic could be found.

Copyright © 2007 by
Joseph Berkovitz <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free