# The Uncertainty Principle

*First published Mon Oct 8, 2001; substantive revision Mon Jul 3, 2006*

Quantum mechanics is generally regarded as the physical theory that is our best candidate for a fundamental and universal description of the physical world. The conceptual framework employed by this theory differs drastically from that of classical physics. Indeed, the transition from classical to quantum physics marks a genuine revolution in our understanding of the physical world.

One striking aspect of the difference between classical and quantum physics is that whereas classical mechanics presupposes that exact simultaneous values can be assigned to all physical quantities, quantum mechanics denies this possibility, the prime example being the position and momentum of a particle. According to quantum mechanics, the more precisely the position (momentum) of a particle is given, the less precisely can one say what its momentum (position) is. This is (a simplistic and preliminary formulation of) the quantum mechanical uncertainty principle for position and momentum. The uncertainty principle played an important role in many discussions on the philosophical implications of quantum mechanics, in particular in discussions on the consistency of the so-called Copenhagen interpretation, the interpretation endorsed by the founding fathers Heisenberg and Bohr.

This should not suggest that the uncertainty principle is the only aspect of the conceptual difference between classical and quantum physics: the implications of quantum mechanics for notions as (non)-locality, entanglement and identity play no less havoc with classical intuitions.

- 1. Introduction
- 2. Heisenberg
- 3. Bohr
- 4. The Minimal Interpretation
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Introduction

The uncertainty principle is certainly one of the most famous and important aspects of quantum mechanics. It has often been regarded as the most distinctive feature in which quantum mechanics differs from classical theories of the physical world. Roughly speaking, the uncertainty principle (for position and momentum) states that one cannot assign exact simultaneous values to the position and momentum of a physical system. Rather, these quantities can only be determined with some characteristic ‘uncertainties’ that cannot become arbitrarily small simultaneously. But what is the exact meaning of this principle, and indeed, is it really a principle of quantum mechanics? (In his original work, Heisenberg only speaks of uncertainty relations.) And, in particular, what does it mean to say that a quantity is determined only up to some uncertainty? These are the main questions we will explore in the following, focusing on the views of Heisenberg and Bohr.

The notion of ‘uncertainty’ occurs in several different meanings in the physical literature. It may refer to a lack of knowledge of a quantity by an observer, or to the experimental inaccuracy with which a quantity is measured, or to some ambiguity in the definition of a quantity, or to a statistical spread in an ensemble of similary prepared systems. Also, several different names are used for such uncertainties: inaccuracy, spread, imprecision, indefiniteness, indeterminateness, indeterminacy, latitude, etc. As we shall see, even Heisenberg and Bohr did not decide on a single terminology for quantum mechanical uncertainties. Forestalling a discussion about which name is the most appropriate one in quantum mechanics, we use the name ‘uncertainty principle’ simply because it is the most common one in the literature.

## 2. Heisenberg

### 2.1 Heisenberg's road to the uncertainty relations

Heisenberg introduced his now famous relations in an article of
1927, entitled "*Ueber den anschaulichen Inhalt der
quantentheoretischen Kinematik und Mechanik*". A (partial)
translation of this title is: "On the *anschaulich* content of
quantum theoretical kinematics and mechanics". Here, the term
*anschaulich* is particularly notable. Apparently, it is one of
those German words that defy an unambiguous translation into other
languages. Heisenberg's title is translated as "*On the physical
content* …" by Wheeler and Zurek (1983). His collected works
(Heisenberg, 1984) translate it as "*On the perceptible content*
…", while Cassidy's biography of Heisenberg (Cassidy, 1992),
refers to the paper as "*On the perceptual content* …".
Literally, the closest translation of the term *anschaulich* is
‘visualizable’. But, as in most languages, words that make
reference to vision are not always intended literally. Seeing is widely
used as a metaphor for understanding, especially for immediate
understanding. Hence, *anschaulich* also means
‘intelligible’ or
‘intuitive’.^{[1]}

Why was this issue of the *Anschaulichkeit* of quantum
mechanics such a prominent concern to Heisenberg? This question has
already been considered by a number of commentators (Jammer, 1977;
Miller 1982; de Regt, 1997; Beller, 1999). For the answer, it turns
out, we must go back a little in time. In 1925 Heisenberg had developed
the first coherent mathematical formalism for quantum
theory (Heisenberg, 1925). His leading idea was that only those
quantities that are in principle observable should play a role in the
theory, and that all attempts to form a picture of what goes on inside
the atom should be avoided. In atomic physics the observational data
were obtained from spectroscopy and associated with atomic transitions.
Thus, Heisenberg was led to consider the ‘transition
quantities’ as the basic ingredients of the theory. Max Born,
later that year, realized that the transition quantities obeyed the
rules of matrix calculus, a branch of mathematics that was not so
well-known then as it is now. In a famous series of papers Heisenberg,
Born and Jordan developed this idea into the matrix mechanics version
of quantum theory.

Formally, matrix mechanics remains close to classical mechanics. The
central idea is that all physical quantities must be represented by
infinite self-adjoint matrices (later identified with operators on a
Hilbert space). It is postulated that the matrices
** q** and

**representing the canonical position and momentum variables of a particle satisfy the so-called canonical commutation rule**

*p*

−qp=pqiℏ(1)

where
ℏ
= *h*/2π,
*h* denotes Planck's constant, and boldface type is used to
represent matrices. The new theory scored spectacular empirical success
by encompassing nearly all spectroscopic data known at the time,
especially after the concept of the electron spin was included in the
theoretical framework.

It came as a big surprise, therefore, when one year later, Erwin
Schrödinger presented an alternative theory, that became known as
wave mechanics. Schrödinger assumed that an electron in an atom
could be represented as an oscillating charge cloud, evolving
continuously in space and time according to a wave equation. The
discrete frequencies in the atomic spectra were not due to
discontinuous transitions (quantum jumps) as in matrix mechanics, but
to a resonance phenomenon. Schrödinger also showed that the two
theories were
equivalent.^{[2]}

Even so, the two approaches differed greatly in interpretation and
spirit. Whereas Heisenberg eschewed the use of visualizable pictures,
and accepted discontinuous transitions as a primitive notion,
Schrödinger claimed as an advantage of his theory that it was
*anschaulich*. In Schrödinger's vocabulary, this meant that
the theory represented the observational data by means of continuously
evolving causal processes in space and time. He considered this
condition of *Anschaulichkeit* to be an essential requirement on
any acceptable physical theory. Schrödinger was not alone in
appreciating this aspect of his theory. Many other leading physicists
were attracted to wave mechanics for the same reason. For a while, in
1926, before it emerged that wave mechanics had serious problems of its
own, Schrödinger's approach seemed to gather more support in the
physics community than matrix mechanics.

Understandably, Heisenberg was unhappy about this development. In a
letter of 8 June 1926 to Pauli he confessed that "The more I think
about the physical part of Schrödinger's theory, the more
disgusting I find it", and: "What Schrödinger writes about the
*Anschaulichkeit* of his theory, … I consider
*Mist* (Pauli, 1979, p. 328)". Again, this last German term is
translated differently by various commentators: as "junk" (Miller,
1982) "rubbish" (Beller 1999) "crap" (Cassidy, 1992), and perhaps more
literally, as "bullshit" (de Regt, 1997). Nevertheless, in published
writings, Heisenberg voiced a more balanced opinion. In a paper in
*Die Naturwissenschaften* (1926) he summarized the peculiar
situation that the simultaneous development of two competing theories
had brought about. Although he argued that Schrödinger's
interpretation was untenable, he admitted that matrix mechanics did not
provide the *Anschaulichkeit* which made wave mechanics so
attractive. He concluded: "to obtain a contradiction-free
*anschaulich* interpretation, we still lack some essential
feature in our image of the structure of matter". The purpose of his
1927 paper was to provide exactly this lacking feature.

### 2.2 Heisenberg's argument

Let us now look at the argument that led Heisenberg to his
uncertainty relations. He started by redefining the notion of
*Anschaulichkeit*. Whereas Schrödinger associated this term
with the provision of a causal space-time picture of the phenomena,
Heisenberg, by contrast, declared:

We believe we have gainedanschaulichunderstanding of a physical theory, if in all simple cases, we can grasp the experimental consequences qualitatively and see that the theory does not lead to any contradictions. Heisenberg, 1927, p. 172)

His goal was, of course, to show that, in this new sense of the
word, matrix mechanics could lay the same claim to
*Anschaulichkeit* as wave mechanics.

To do this, he adopted an operational assumption: terms like ‘the position of a particle’ have meaning only if one specifies a suitable experiment by which ‘the position of a particle’ can be measured. We will call this assumption the ‘measurement=meaning principle’. In general, there is no lack of such experiments, even in the domain of atomic physics. However, experiments are never completely accurate. We should be prepared to accept, therefore, that in general the meaning of these quantities is also determined only up to some characteristic inaccuracy.

As an example, he considered the measurement of the position of an electron by a microscope. The accuracy of such a measurement is limited by the wave length of the light illuminating the electron. Thus, it is possible, in principle, to make such a position measurement as accurate as one wishes, by using light of a very short wave length, e.g., γ-rays. But for γ-rays, the Compton effect cannot be ignored: the interaction of the electron and the illuminating light should then be considered as a collision of at least one photon with the electron. In such a collision, the electron suffers a recoil which disturbs its momentum. Moreover, the shorter the wave length, the larger is this change in momentum. Thus, at the moment when the position of the particle is accurately known, Heisenberg argued, its momentum cannot be accurately known:

At the instant of time when the position is determined, that is, at the instant when the photon is scattered by the electron, the electron undergoes a discontinuous change in momentum. This change is the greater the smaller the wavelength of the light employed, i.e., the more exact the determination of the position. At the instant at which the position of the electron is known, its momentum therefore can be known only up to magnitudes which correspond to that discontinuous change; thus, the more precisely the position is determined, the less precisely the momentum is known, and conversely (Heisenberg, 1927, p. 174-5).

This is the first formulation of the uncertainty principle. In its
present form it is an epistemological principle, since it limits what
we can *know* about the electron. From "elementary formulae of
the Compton effect" Heisenberg estimated the ‘imprecisions’
to be of the order

δ pδq∼h(2)

He continued: “In this circumstance we see the direct
*anschaulich* content of the relation
** qp** −

**=**

*pq**i*ℏ.”

He went on to consider other experiments, designed to measure other physical quantities and obtained analogous relations for time and energy:

δ tδE∼h(3)

and action *J* and angle *w*

δ wδJ∼h(4)

which he saw as corresponding to the "well-known" relations

−tE=Etiℏ or−wJ=Jwiℏ(5)

However, these generalisations are not as straightforward as Heisenberg suggested. In particular, the status of the time variable in his several illustrations of relation (3) is not at all clear (Hilgevoord 2005). See also on Section 2.5.

Heisenberg summarized his findings in a general conclusion: all
concepts used in classical mechanics are also well-defined in the realm
of atomic processes. But, as a pure fact of experience ("*rein
erfahrungsgemäß*"), experiments that serve to provide
such a definition for one quantity are subject to particular
indeterminacies, obeying relations (2)-(4) which prohibit them from
providing a simultaneous definition of two canonically conjugate
quantities. Note that in this formulation the emphasis has slightly
shifted: he now speaks of a limit on the definition of concepts, i.e.
not merely on what we can *know*, but what we can meaningfully
*say* about a particle. Of course, this stronger formulation
follows by application of the above measurement=meaning principle: if
there are, as Heisenberg claims, no experiments that allow a
simultaneous precise measurement of two conjugate quantities, then
these quantities are also not simultaneously well-defined.

Heisenberg's paper has an interesting "Addition in proof" mentioning
critical remarks by Bohr, who saw the paper only after it had been sent
to the publisher. Among other things, Bohr pointed out that in the
microscope experiment it is not the change of the momentum of the
electron that is important, but rather the circumstance that this
change cannot be precisely determined in the *same* experiment.
An improved version of the argument, responding to this objection, is
given in Heisenberg's Chicago lectures of 1930.

Here (Heisenberg, 1930, p. 16), it is assumed that the electron is illuminated by light of wavelength λ and that the scattered light enters a microscope with aperture angle ε. According to the laws of classical optics, the accuracy of the microscope depends on both the wave length and the aperture angle; Abbe's criterium for its ‘resolving power’, i.e. the size of the smallest discernable details, gives

δ q∼ λ/sin ε(6)

On the other hand, the direction of a scattered photon, when it enters the microscope, is unknown within the angle ε, rendering the momentum change of the electron uncertain by an amount

δ p∼hsin ε/λ(7)

leading again to the result (2).

Let us now analyse Heisenberg's argument in more detail. First note
that, even in this improved version, Heisenberg's argument is
incomplete. According to Heisenberg's ‘measurement=meaning
principle’, one must also specify, in the given context, what
the meaning is of the phrase ‘momentum of the electron’,
in order to make sense of the claim that this momentum is changed by
the position measurement. A solution to this problem can again be
found in the Chicago lectures (Heisenberg, 1930, p. 15). Here, he
assumes that initially the momentum of the electron is precisely
known, e.g. it has been measured in a previous experiment with an
inaccuracy δ*p*_{i},
which may be arbitrarily small. Then, its position is measured with
inaccuracy δ*q*, and after this, its final momentum is
measured with an inaccuracy δ*p*_{f}. All three measurements can be
performed with arbitrary precision. Thus, the three quantities
δ*p*_{i},
δ*q*, and δ*p*_{f}
can be made as small as one wishes.
If we assume further that the initial momentum has not changed until
the position measurement, we can speak of a definite momentum until
the time of the position measurement. Moreover we can give operational
meaning to the idea that the momentum is changed during the position
measurement: the outcome of the second momentum measurement (say
*p*_{f}) will generally
differ from the initial value *p*_{i}. In fact, one can also show that
this change is discontinuous, by varying the time between the three
measurements.

Let us now try to see, adopting this more elaborate set-up, if we can
complete Heisenberg's argument. We have now been able to give
empirical meaning to the ‘change of momentum’ of the
electron,
*p*_{f} −
*p*_{i}.
Heisenberg's argument claims that the order of magnitude of this
change is at least inversely proportional to the inaccuracy of the
position measurement:

| p_{f}−p_{i}| δq∼h(8)

However, can we now draw the conclusion that the momentum is only
imprecisely defined? Certainly not. Before the position measurement,
its value was *p*_{i},
after the measurement it
is *p*_{f}.
One might, perhaps, claim that the
value at the very instant of the position measurement is not yet
defined, but we could simply settle this by an assignment by
convention, e.g., we might assign the mean
value (*p*_{i} +
*p*_{f})/2 to the
momentum at this instant.
But then, the momentum is precisely determined at all instants, and
Heisenberg's formulation of the uncertainty principle no longer
follows. The above attempt of completing Heisenberg's argument thus
overshoots its mark.

A solution to this problem can again be found in the Chicago Lectures. Heisenberg admits that position and momentum can be known exactly. He writes:

If the velocity of the electron is at first known, and the position then exactly measured, the position of the electron for times previous to the position measurement may be calculated. For these past times, δpδqis smaller than the usual bound. (Heisenberg 1930, p. 15)

Indeed, Heisenberg says: "the uncertainty relation does not hold for the past".

Apparently, when Heisenberg refers to the uncertainty or imprecision
of a quantity, he means that the value of this quantity cannot be given
*beforehand*. In the sequence of measurements we have considered
above, the uncertainty in the momentum after the measurement of
position has occurred, refers to the idea that the value of the
momentum is not fixed just *before* the final momentum
measurement takes place. Once this measurement is performed, and
reveals a value *p*_{f},
the uncertainty relation no longer holds; these values then belong to
the past. Clearly, then, Heisenberg is concerned with
*unpredictability*: the point is not that the momentum of a
particle changes, due to a position measurement, but rather that it
changes by an unpredictable amount. It is, however always possible to
measure, and hence define, the size of this change in a subsequent
measurement of the final momentum with arbitrary precision.

Although Heisenberg admits that we can consistently attribute values
of momentum and position to an electron in the past, he sees little
merit in such talk. He points out that these values can never be used
as initial conditions in a prediction about the future behavior of the
electron, or subjected to experimental verification. Whether or not we
grant them physical reality is, as he puts it, a matter of personal
taste. Heisenberg's own taste is, of course, to deny their physical
reality. For example, he writes, "I believe that one can formulate the
emergence of the classical ‘path’ of a particle pregnantly
as follows: *the ‘path’ comes into being only because we
observe it*" (Heisenberg, 1927, p. 185). Apparently, in his view, a
measurement does not only serve to give meaning to a quantity, it
*creates* a particular value for this quantity. This may be
called the ‘measurement=creation’ principle. It is an
ontological principle, for it states what is physically real.

This then leads to the following picture. First we measure the
momentum of the electron very accurately. By ‘measurement=
meaning’, this entails that the term "the momentum of the
particle" is now well-defined. Moreover, by the
‘measurement=creation’ principle, we may say that this
momentum is physically real. Next, the position is measured with
inaccuracy δ*q*. At this instant, the position of the
particle becomes well-defined and, again, one can regard this as a
physically real attribute of the particle. However, the momentum has
now changed by an amount that is unpredictable by an order of
magnitude | *p*_{f} − *p*_{i} | ∼
*h*/δ*q*. The meaning and validity of this claim
can be verified by a subsequent momentum measurement.

The question is then what status we shall assign to the momentum of the electron just before its final measurement. Is it real? According to Heisenberg it is not. Before the final measurement, the best we can attribute to the electron is some unsharp, or fuzzy momentum. These terms are meant here in an ontological sense, characterizing a real attribute of the electron.

### 2.3 The interpretation of Heisenberg's relation

The relations Heisenberg had proposed were soon considered to be a cornerstone of the Copenhagen interpretation of quantum mechanics. Just a few months later, Kennard (1927) already called them the "essential core" of the new theory. Taken together with Heisenberg's contention that they provided the intuitive content of the theory and their prominent role in later discussions on the Copenhagen interpretation, a dominant view emerged in which the uncertainty relations were regarded as a fundamental principle of the theory.

The interpretation of these relations has often been debated. Do Heisenberg's relations express restrictions on the experiments we can perform on quantum systems, and, therefore, restrictions on the information we can gather about such systems; or do they express restrictions on the meaning of the concepts we use to describe quantum systems? Or else, are they restrictions of an ontological nature, i.e., do they assert that a quantum system simply does not possess a definite value for its position and momentum at the same time? The difference between these interpretations is partly reflected in the various names by which the relations are known, e.g. as ‘inaccuracy relations’, or: ‘uncertainty’, ‘indeterminacy’ or ‘unsharpness relations’. The debate between these different views has been addressed by many authors, but it has never been settled completely. Let it suffice here to make only two general observations.

First, it is clear that in Heisenberg's own view all the above questions stand or fall together. Indeed, we have seen that he adopted an operational "measurement=meaning" principle according to which the meaningfulness of a physical quantity was equivalent to the existence of an experiment purporting to measure that quantity. Similarly, his "measurement=creation" principle allowed him to attribute physical reality to such quantities. Hence, Heisenberg's discussions moved rather freely and quickly from talk about experimental inaccuracies to epistemological or ontological issues and back again.

However, ontological questions seemed to be of somewhat less interest to him. For example, there is a passage (Heisenberg, 1927, p. 197), where he discusses the idea that, behind our observational data, there might still exist a hidden reality in which quantum systems have definite values for position and momentum, unaffected by the uncertainty relations. He emphatically dismisses this conception as an unfruitful and meaningless speculation, because, as he says, the aim of physics is only to describe observable data. Similarly, in the Chicago Lectures (Heisenberg 1930, p. 11), he warns against the fact that the human language permits the utterance of statements which have no empirical content at all, but nevertheless produce a picture in our imagination. He notes, "One should be especially careful in using the words ‘reality’, ‘actually’, etc., since these words very often lead to statements of the type just mentioned." So, Heisenberg also endorsed an interpretation of his relations as rejecting a reality in which particles have simultaneous definite values for position and momentum.

The second observation is that although for Heisenberg experimental,
informational, epistemological and ontological formulations of his
relations were, so to say, just different sides of the same coin, this
is not so for those who do not share his operational principles or his
view on the task of physics. Alternative points of view, in which e.g.
the ontological reading of the uncertainty relations is denied, are
therefore still viable. The statement, often found in the literature of
the thirties, that Heisenberg had *proved* the impossibility of
associating a definite position and momentum to a particle is certainly
wrong. But the precise meaning one can coherently attach to
Heisenberg's relations depends rather heavily on the interpretation one
favors for quantum mechanics as a whole. And because no agreement has
been reached on this latter issue, one cannot expect agreement on the
meaning of the uncertainty relations either.

### 2.4 Uncertainty relations or uncertainty principle?

Let us now move to another question about Heisenberg's relations: do
they express a *principle* of quantum theory? Probably the first
influential author to call these relations a ‘principle’
was Eddington, who, in his Gifford Lectures of 1928 referred to them as
the ‘Principle of Indeterminacy’. In the English literature
the name uncertainty principle became most common. It is used both by
Condon and Robertson in 1929, and also in the English version of
Heisenberg's Chicago Lectures (Heisenberg, 1930), although, remarkably,
nowhere in the original German version of the same book (see also
Cassidy, 1998). Indeed, Heisenberg never seems to have endorsed the
name ‘principle’ for his relations. His favourite
terminology was ‘inaccuracy relations’
(*Ungenauigkeitsrelationen*) or ‘indeterminacy
relations’ (*Unbestimmtheitsrelationen*). We know only one
passage, in Heisenberg's own Gifford lectures, delivered in 1955-56
(Heisenberg, 1958, p. 43), where he mentioned that his relations "are
usually called relations of uncertainty or principle of indeterminacy".
But this can well be read as his yielding to common practice rather
than his own preference.

But does the relation (2) qualify as a principle of quantum mechanics? Several authors, foremost Karl Popper (1967), have contested this view. Popper argued that the uncertainty relations cannot be granted the status of a principle on the grounds that they are derivable from the theory, whereas one cannot obtain the theory from the uncertainty relations. (The argument being that one can never derive any equation, say, the Schrödinger equation, or the commutation relation (1), from an inequality.)

Popper's argument is, of course, correct but we think it misses the point. There are many statements in physical theories which are called principles even though they are in fact derivable from other statements in the theory in question. A more appropriate departing point for this issue is not the question of logical priority but rather Einstein's distinction between ‘constructive theories’ and ‘principle theories’.

Einstein proposed this famous classification in (Einstein, 1919). Constructive theories are theories which postulate the existence of simple entities behind the phenomena. They endeavour to reconstruct the phenomena by framing hypotheses about these entities. Principle theories, on the other hand, start from empirical principles, i.e. general statements of empirical regularities, employing no or only a bare minimum of theoretical terms. The purpose is to build up the theory from such principles. That is, one aims to show how these empirical principles provide sufficient conditions for the introduction of further theoretical concepts and structure.

The prime example of a theory of principle is thermodynamics. Here the role of the empirical principles is played by the statements of the impossibility of various kinds of perpetual motion machines. These are regarded as expressions of brute empirical fact, providing the appropriate conditions for the introduction of the concepts of energy and entropy and their properties. (There is a lot to be said about the tenability of this view, but that is not the topic of this entry.)

Now obviously, once the formal thermodynamic theory is built, one
can also *derive* the impossibility of the various kinds of
perpetual motion. (They would violate the laws of energy conservation
and entropy increase.) But this derivation should not misguide one into
thinking that they were no principles of the theory after all. The
point is just that empirical principles are statements that do not rely
on the theoretical concepts (in this case entropy and energy) for their
meaning. They are interpretable independently of these concepts and,
further, their validity on the empirical level still provides the
physical content of the theory.

A similar example is provided by special relativity, another theory of principle, which Einstein deliberately designed after the ideal of thermodynamics. Here, the empirical principles are the light postulate and the relativity principle. Again, once we have built up the modern theoretical formalism of the theory (the Minkowski space-time) it is straightforward to prove the validity of these principles. But again this does not count as an argument for claiming that they were no principles after all. So the question whether the term ‘principle’ is justified for Heisenberg's relations, should, in our view, be understood as the question whether they are conceived of as empirical principles.

One can easily show that this idea was never far from Heisenberg's
intentions. We have already seen that Heisenberg presented the
relations as the result of a "pure fact of experience". A few months
after his 1927 paper, he wrote a popular paper with the title
"*Ueber die Grundprincipien der Quantenmechanik*" ("On the
fundamental principles of quantum mechanics") where he made the point
even more clearly. Here Heisenberg described his recent break-through
in the interpretation of the theory as follows: "It seems to be a
general law of nature that we cannot determine position and velocity
simultaneously with arbitrary accuracy". Now actually, and in spite of
its title, the paper does not identify or discuss any
‘fundamental principle’ of quantum mechanics. So, it must
have seemed obvious to his readers that he intended to claim that the
uncertainty relation was a fundamental principle, forced upon us as an
empirical law of nature, rather than a result derived from the
formalism of the theory.

This reading of Heisenberg's intentions is corroborated by the fact
that, even in his 1927 paper, applications of his relation frequently
present the conclusion as a matter of principle. For example, he says
"In a stationary state of an atom its phase is *in principle*
indeterminate" (Heisenberg, 1927, p. 177, [emphasis added]). Similarly,
in a paper of 1928, he described the content of his relations as: "It
has turned out that it is *in principle* impossible to know, to
measure the position and velocity of a piece of matter with arbitrary
accuracy. (Heisenberg, 1984, p. 26, [emphasis added])"

So, although Heisenberg did not originate the tradition of calling
his relations a principle, it is not implausible to attribute the view
to him that the uncertainty relations represent an empirical principle
that could serve as a foundation of quantum mechanics. In fact, his
1927 paper expressed this desire explicitly: "Surely, one would like to
be able to deduce the quantitative laws of quantum mechanics directly
from their *anschaulich* foundations, that is, essentially,
relation [(2)]" (*ibid*, p. 196). This is not to say that
Heisenberg was successful in reaching this goal, or that he did not
express other opinions on other occasions.

Let us conclude this section with three remarks. First, if the uncertainty relation is to serve as an empirical principle, one might well ask what its direct empirical support is. In Heisenberg's analysis, no such support is mentioned. His arguments concerned thought experiments in which the validity of the theory, at least at a rudimentary level, is implicitly taken for granted. Jammer (1974, p. 82) conducted a literature search for high precision experiments that could seriously test the uncertainty relations and concluded they were still scarce in 1974. Real experimental support for the uncertainty relations in experiments in which the inaccuracies are close to the quantum limit have come about only more recently. (See Kaiser, Werner and George 1983, Uffink 1985, Nairz, Andt, and Zeilinger, 2001.)

A second point is the question whether the theoretical structure or the quantitative laws of quantum theory can indeed be derived on the basis of the uncertainty principle, as Heisenberg wished. Serious attempts to build up quantum theory as a full-fledged Theory of Principle on the basis of the uncertainty principle have never been carried out. Indeed, the most Heisenberg could and did claim in this respect was that the uncertainty relations created "room" (Heisenberg 1927, p. 180) or "freedom" (Heisenberg, 1931, p. 43) for the introduction of some non-classical mode of description of experimental data, not that they uniquely lead to the formalism of quantum mechanics. A serious proposal to construe quantum mechanics as a theory of principle was provided only recently by Bub (2000). But, remarkably, this proposal does not use the uncertainty relation as one of its fundamental principles.

Third, it is remarkable that in his later years Heisenberg put a
somewhat different gloss on his relations. In his autobiography *Der
Teil und das Ganze* of 1969 he described how he had found his
relations inspired by a remark by Einstein that "it is the theory which
decides what one can observe" -- thus giving precedence to theory above
experience, rather than the other way around. Some years later he even
admitted that his famous discussions of thought experiments were
actually trivial since "… if the process of observation itself
is subject to the laws of quantum theory, it must be possible to
represent its result in the mathematical scheme of this theory"
(Heisenberg, 1975, p. 6).

### 2.5 Mathematical elaboration

When Heisenberg introduced his relation, his argument was based only
on qualitative examples. He did not provide a general, exact derivation
of his
relations.^{[3]}
Indeed, he did not even give a definition of
the uncertainties δ*q*, etc., occurring in these
relations. Of course, this was consistent with the announced goal of
that paper, i.e. to provide some qualitative understanding of quantum
mechanics for simple experiments.

The first mathematically exact formulation of the uncertainty relations is due to Kennard. He proved in 1927 the theorem that for all normalized state vectors |ψ> the following inequality holds:

Δ _{ψ}Δp_{ψ}≥ ℏ/2q(9)

Here, Δ_{ψ}** p** and
Δ

_{ψ}

**are standard deviations of position and momentum in the state vector |ψ>, i.e.,**

*q*

(Δ _{ψ})² = <p²>p_{ψ}− (<>p_{ψ})², (Δ_{ψ})² = <q²>q_{ψ}− (<>q_{ψ})².(10)

where <·>_{ψ} =
<ψ|·|ψ>
denotes the expectation value in state |ψ>. The inequality (9)
was generalized in 1929 by Robertson who proved that for all
observables (self-adjoint operators) ** A** and

*B*

Δ _{ψ}ΔA_{ψ}≥ ½|<[B,A]>B_{ ψ}|(11)

where [** A**,

**] :=**

*B*

*A***−**

*B*

*B***denotes the commutator. This relation was in turn strengthened by Schrödinger (1930), who obtained:**

*A*

(Δ _{ψ})² (ΔA_{ψ})² ≥B

¼|<[,A]>B_{ ψ}|² + ¼|<{−<A>A_{ ψ},−<B>B_{ ψ}}>_{ψ}|²(12)

where {** A**,

**} := (**

*B*

*A***+**

*B*

*B***) denotes the anti-commutator.**

*A*Since the above inequalities have the virtue of being exact and general, in contrast to Heisenberg's original semi-quantitative formulation, it is tempting to regard them as the exact counterpart of Heisenberg's relations (2)-(4). Indeed, such was Heisenberg's own view. In his Chicago Lectures (Heisenberg 1930, pp. 15-19), he presented Kennard's derivation of relation (9) and claimed that "this proof does not differ at all in mathematical content" from the semi-quantitative argument he had presented earlier, the only difference being that now "the proof is carried through exactly".

But it may be useful to point out that both in status and intended role there is a difference between Kennard's inequality and Heisenberg's previous formulation (2). The inequalities discussed in the present section are not statements of empirical fact, but theorems of the quantum mechanical formalism. As such, they presuppose the validity of this formalism, and in particular the commutation relation (1), rather than elucidating its intuitive content or to create ‘room’ or ‘freedom’ for the validity of this relation. At best, one should see the above inequalities as showing that the formalism is consistent with Heisenberg's empirical principle.

This situation is similar to that arising in other theories of principle where, as noted in Section 2.4, one often finds that, next to an empirical principle, the formalism also provides a corresponding theorem. And similarly, this situation should not, by itself, cast doubt on the question whether Heisenberg's relation can be regarded as a principle of quantum mechanics.

There is a second notable difference between (2) and (9). Heisenberg
did not give a general definition for the ‘uncertainties’
δ*p* and δ*q*. The most definite remark he
made about them was that they could be taken as "something like the
mean error". In the discussions of thought experiments, he and Bohr
would always quantify uncertainties on a case-to-case basis by choosing
some parameters which happened to be relevant to the experiment at
hand. By contrast, the inequalities (9)-(12) employ a single specific
expression as a measure for ‘uncertainty’: the standard
deviation. At the time, this choice was not unnatural, given that this
expression is well-known and widely used in error theory and the
description of statistical fluctuations. However, there was very little
or no discussion of whether this choice was appropriate for a general
formulation of the uncertainty relations. A standard deviation reflects
the spread or expected fluctuations in a series of measurements of an
observable in a given state. It is not at all easy to connect this idea
with the concept of the ‘inaccuracy’ of a measurement, such
as the resolving power of a microscope. In fact, even though Heisenberg
had taken Kennard's inequality as the precise formulation of the
uncertainty relation, he and Bohr never relied on standard deviations
in their many discussions of thought experiments, and indeed, it has
been shown (Uffink and Hilgevoord, 1985; Hilgevoord and Uffink, 1988)
that these discussions cannot be framed in terms of standard
deviation.

Another problem with the above elaboration is that the
‘well-known’ relations (5) are actually false if energy
** E** and action

**are to be positive operators (Jordan 1927). In that case, self-adjoint operators**

*J***and**

*t***do not exist and inequalities analogous to (9) cannot be derived. Also, these inequalities do not hold for angle and angular momentum (Uffink 1990). These obstacles have led to a quite extensive literature on time-energy and angle-action uncertainty relations (Muga et al. 2002, Hilgevoord 2005).**

*w*## 3. Bohr

In spite of the fact that Heisenberg's and Bohr's views on quantum mechanics are often lumped together as (part of) ‘the Copenhagen interpretation’, there is considerable difference between their views on the uncertainty relations.

### 3.1 From wave-particle duality to complementarity

Long before the development of modern quantum mechanics, Bohr had been particularly concerned with the problem of particle-wave duality, i.e. the problem that experimental evidence on the behaviour of both light and matter seemed to demand a wave picture in some cases, and a particle picture in others. Yet these pictures are mutually exclusive. Whereas a particle is always localized, the very definition of the notions of wavelength and frequency requires an extension in space and in time. Moreover, the classical particle picture is incompatible with the characteristic phenomenon of interference.

His long struggle with wave-particle duality had prepared him for a radical step when the dispute between matrix and wave mechanics broke out in 1926-27. For the main contestants, Heisenberg and Schrödinger, the issue at stake was which view could claim to provide a single coherent and universal framework for the description of the observational data. The choice was, essentially between a description in terms of continuously evolving waves, or else one of particles undergoing discontinuous quantum jumps. By contrast, Bohr insisted that elements from both views were equally valid and equally needed for an exhaustive description of the data. His way out of the contradiction was to renounce the idea that the pictures refer, in a literal one-to-one correspondence, to physical reality. Instead, the applicability of these pictures was to become dependent on the experimental context. This is the gist of the viewpoint he called ‘complementarity’.

Bohr first conceived the general outline of his complementarity argument in early 1927, during a skiing holiday in Norway, at the same time when Heisenberg wrote his uncertainty paper. When he returned to Copenhagen and found Heisenberg's manuscript, they got into an intense discussion. On the one hand, Bohr was quite enthusiastic about Heisenberg's ideas which seemed to fit wonderfully with his own thinking. Indeed, in his subsequent work, Bohr always presented the uncertainty relations as the symbolic expression of his complementarity viewpoint. On the other hand, he criticized Heisenberg severely for his suggestion that these relations were due to discontinuous changes occurring during a measurement process. Rather, Bohr argued, their proper derivation should start from the indispensability of both particle and wave concepts. He pointed out that the uncertainties in the experiment did not exclusively arise from the discontinuities but also from the fact that in the experiment we need to take into account both the particle theory and the wave theory. It is not so much the unknown disturbance which renders the momentum of the electron uncertain but rather the fact that the position and the momentum of the electron cannot be simultaneously defined in this experiment. (See the "Addition in Proof" to Heisenberg's paper.)

We shall not go too deeply into the matter of Bohr's interpretation
of quantum mechanics since we are mostly interested in Bohr's view on
the uncertainty principle. For a more detailed discussion of Bohr's
philosophy of quantum physics we refer to Scheibe (1973), Folse (1985),
Honner (1987) and Murdoch (1987). It may be useful, however, to sketch
some of the main points. Central in Bohr's considerations is the
*language* we use in physics. No matter how abstract and subtle
the concepts of modern physics may be, they are essentially an
extension of our ordinary language and a means to communicate the
results of our experiments. These results, obtained under well-defined
experimental circumstances, are what Bohr calls the "phenomena". A
phenomenon is "the comprehension of the effects observed under given
experimental conditions" (Bohr 1939, p. 24), it is the resultant of a
physical object, a measuring apparatus and the interaction between them
in a concrete experimental situation. The essential difference between
classical and quantum physics is that in quantum physics the
interaction between the object and the apparatus cannot be made
arbitrarily small; the interaction must at least comprise one quantum.
This is expressed by Bohr's quantum postulate:

[… the] essence [of the formulation of the quantum theory] may be expressed in the so-called quantum postulate, which attributes to any atomic process an essential discontinuity or rather individuality, completely foreign to classical theories and symbolized by Planck's quantum of action. (Bohr, 1928, p. 580)

A phenomenon, therefore, is an indivisible whole and the result of a measurement cannot be considered as an autonomous manifestation of the object itself independently of the measurement context. The quantum postulate forces upon us a new way of describing physical phenomena:

In this situation, we are faced with the necessity of a radical revision of the foundation for the description and explanation of physical phenomena. Here, it must above all be recognized that, however far quantum effects transcend the scope of classical physical analysis, the account of the experimental arrangement and the record of the observations must always be expressed in common language supplemented with the terminology of classical physics. (Bohr, 1948, p. 313)

This is what Scheibe (1973) has called the "buffer postulate" because it prevents the quantum from penetrating into the classical description: A phenomenon must always be described in classical terms; Planck's constant does not occur in this description.

Together, the two postulates induce the following reasoning. In every phenomenon the interaction between the object and the apparatus comprises at least one quantum. But the description of the phenomenon must use classical notions in which the quantum of action does not occur. Hence, the interaction cannot be analysed in this description. On the other hand, the classical character of the description allows to speak in terms of the object itself. Instead of saying: ‘the interaction between a particle and a photographic plate has resulted in a black spot in a certain place on the plate’, we are allowed to forgo mentioning the apparatus and say: ‘the particle has been found in this place’. The experimental context, rather than changing or disturbing pre-existing properties of the object, defines what can meaningfully be said about the object.

Because the interaction between object and apparatus is left out in our description of the phenomenon, we do not get the whole picture. Yet, any attempt to extend our description by performing the measurement of a different observable quantity of the object, or indeed, on the measurement apparatus, produces a new phenomenon and we are again confronted with the same situation. Because of the unanalyzable interaction in both measurements, the two descriptions cannot, generally, be united into a single picture. They are what Bohr calls complementary descriptions:

[the quantum of action]...forces us to adopt a new mode of description designated as complementary in the sense that any given application of classical concepts precludes the simultaneous use of other classical concepts which in a different connection are equally necessary for the elucidation of the phenomena. (Bohr, 1929, p. 10)

The most important example of complementary descriptions is provided by the measurements of the position and momentum of an object. If one wants to measure the position of the object relative to a given spatial frame of reference, the measuring instrument must be rigidly fixed to the bodies which define the frame of reference. But this implies the impossibility of investigating the exchange of momentum between the object and the instrument and we are cut off from obtaining any information about the momentum of the object. If, on the other hand, one wants to measure the momentum of an object the measuring instrument must be able to move relative to the spatial reference frame. Bohr here assumes that a momentum measurement involves the registration of the recoil of some movable part of the instrument and the use of the law of momentum conservation. The looseness of the part of the instrument with which the object interacts entails that the instrument cannot serve to accurately determine the position of the object. Since a measuring instrument cannot be rigidly fixed to the spatial reference frame and, at the same time, be movable relative to it, the experiments which serve to precisely determine the position and the momentum of an object are mutually exclusive. Of course, in itself, this is not at all typical for quantum mechanics. But, because the interaction between object and instrument during the measurement can neither be neglected nor determined the two measurements cannot be combined. This means that in the description of the object one must choose between the assignment of a precise position or of a precise momentum.

Similar considerations hold with respect to the measurement of time and energy. Just as the spatial coordinate system must be fixed by means of solid bodies so must the time coordinate be fixed by means of unperturbable, synchronised clocks. But it is precisely this requirement which prevents one from taking into account of the exchange of energy with the instrument if this is to serve its purpose. Conversely, any conclusion about the object based on the conservation of energy prevents following its development in time.

The conclusion is that in quantum mechanics we are confronted with a
complementarity between two descriptions which are united in the
classical mode of description: the space-time description (or
coordination) of a process and the description based on the
applicability of the dynamical conservation laws. The quantum forces us
to give up the classical mode of description (also called the
‘causal’ mode of description by
Bohr^{[4]}):
it is impossible to
form a classical picture of what is going on when radiation interacts
with matter as, e.g., in the Compton effect.

Any arrangement suited to study the exchange of energy and momentum between the electron and the photon must involve a latitude in the space-time description sufficient for the definition of wave-number and frequency which enter in the relation [E=hν andp=hσ]. Conversely, any attempt of locating the collision between the photon and the electron more accurately would, on account of the unavoidable interaction with the fixed scales and clocks defining the space-time reference frame, exclude all closer account as regards the balance of momentum and energy. (Bohr, 1949, p. 210)

A causal description of the process cannot be attained; we have to content ourselves with complementary descriptions. "The viewpoint of complementarity may be regarded", according to Bohr, "as a rational generalization of the very ideal of causality".

In addition to complementary descriptions Bohr also talks about
complementary phenomena and complementary quantities. Position and
momentum, as well as time and energy, are complementary
quantities.^{[5]}

We have seen that Bohr's approach to quantum theory puts heavy emphasis on the language used to communicate experimental observations, which, in his opinion, must always remain classical. By comparison, he seemed to put little value on arguments starting from the mathematical formalism of quantum theory. This informal approach is typical of all of Bohr's discussions on the meaning of quantum mechanics. One might say that for Bohr the conceptual clarification of the situation has primary importance while the formalism is only a symbolic representation of this situation.

This is remarkable since, finally, it is the formalism which needs to be interpreted. This neglect of the formalism is one of the reasons why it is so difficult to get a clear understanding of Bohr's interpretation of quantum mechanics and why it has aroused so much controversy. We close this section by citing from an article of 1948 to show how Bohr conceived the role of the formalism of quantum mechanics:

The entire formalism is to be considered as a tool for deriving predictions, of definite or statistical character, as regards information obtainable under experimental conditions described in classical terms and specified by means of parameters entering into the algebraic or differential equations of which the matrices or the wave-functions, respectively, are solutions. These symbols themselves, as is indicated already by the use of imaginary numbers, are not susceptible to pictorial interpretation; and even derived real functions like densities and currents are only to be regarded as expressing the probabilities for the occurrence of individual events observable under well-defined experimental conditions. (Bohr, 1948, p. 314)

### 3.2 Bohr's view on the uncertainty relations

In his Como lecture, published in 1928, Bohr gave his own version of a derivation of the uncertainty relations between position and momentum and between time and energy. He started from the relations

E=hν andp=h/λ(13)

which connect the notions of energy *E* and momentum *p*
from the particle picture with those of frequency ν and wavelength
λ from the wave picture. He noticed that a wave packet of
limited extension in space and time can only be built up by the
superposition of a number of elementary waves with a large range of
wave numbers and frequencies. Denoting the spatial and temporal
extensions of the wave packet by Δ*x* and
Δ*t*, and the extensions in the wave number σ :=
1/λ and frequency by Δσ and Δν, it follows
from Fourier analysis that in the most favorable case Δ*x*
Δσ ≈ Δ*t* Δν ≈ 1, and,
using (13), one obtains the relations

Δ tΔE≈ ΔxΔp≈h(14)

Note that Δ*x*, Δσ, etc., are not standard
deviations but unspecified measures of the size of a wave packet. (The
original text has equality signs instead of approximate equality signs,
but, since Bohr does not define the spreads exactly the use of
approximate equality signs seems more in line with his intentions.
Moreover, Bohr himself used approximate equality signs in later
presentations.) These equations determine, according to Bohr: "the
highest possible accuracy in the definition of the energy and momentum
of the individuals associated with the wave field" (Bohr 1928, p. 571).
He noted, "This circumstance may be regarded as a simple symbolic
expression of the complementary nature of the space-time description
and the claims of causality"
(*ibid*).^{[6]}
We note a few points
about Bohr's view on the uncertainty relations. First of all, Bohr does
not refer to *discontinuous changes* in the relevant quantities
during the measurement process. Rather, he emphasizes the possibility
of *defining* these quantities. This view is markedly different
from Heisenberg's. A draft version of the Como lecture is even more
explicit on the difference between Bohr and Heisenberg:

These reciprocal uncertainty relations were given in a recent paper of Heisenberg as the expression of the statistical element which, due to the feature of discontinuity implied in the quantum postulate, characterizes any interpretation of observations by means of classical concepts. It must be remembered, however, that the uncertainty in question is not simply a consequence of a discontinuous change of energy and momentum say during an interaction between radiation and material particles employed in measuring the space-time coordinates of the individuals. According to the above considerations the question is rather that of the impossibility of defining rigourously such a change when the space-time coordination of the individuals is also considered. (Bohr, 1985 p. 93)

Indeed, Bohr not only rejected Heisenberg's argument that these
relations are due to discontinuous disturbances implied by the act of
measuring, but also his view that the measurement process
*creates* a definite result:

The unaccustomed features of the situation with which we are confronted in quantum theory necessitate the greatest caution as regard all questions of terminology. Speaking, as it is often done of disturbing a phenomenon by observation, or even of creating physical attributes to objects by measuring processes is liable to be confusing, since all such sentences imply a departure from conventions of basic language which even though it can be practical for the sake of brevity, can never be unambiguous. (Bohr, 1939, p. 24)

Nor did he approve of an epistemological formulation or one in terms of experimental inaccuracies:

[…] a sentence like "we cannot know both the momentum and the position of an atomic object" raises at once questions as to the physical reality of two such attributes of the object, which can be answered only by referring to the mutual exclusive conditions for an unambiguous use of space-time concepts, on the one hand, and dynamical conservation laws on the other hand. (Bohr, 1948, p. 315; also Bohr 1949, p. 211)It would in particular not be out of place in this connection to warn against a misunderstanding likely to arise when one tries to express the content of Heisenberg's well-known indeterminacy relation by such a statement as ‘the position and momentum of a particle cannot simultaneously be measured with arbitrary accuracy’. According to such a formulation it would appear as though we had to do with some arbitrary renunciation of the measurement of either the one or the other of two well-defined attributes of the object, which would not preclude the possibility of a future theory taking both attributes into account on the lines of the classical physics. (Bohr 1937, p. 292)

Instead, Bohr always stressed that the uncertainty relations are
first and foremost an expression of complementarity. This may seem odd
since complementarity is a dichotomic relation between two types of
description whereas the uncertainty relations allow for intermediate
situations between two extremes. They "express" the dichotomy in the
sense that if we take the energy and momentum to be perfectly
well-defined, symbolically Δ*E* = Δ*p* = 0,
the postion and time variables are completely undefined,
Δ*x* = Δ*t* = ∞, and vice versa. But
they also allow intermediate situations in which the mentioned
uncertainties are all non-zero and finite. This more positive aspect of
the uncertainty relation is mentioned in the Como lecture:

At the same time, however, the general character of this relation makes it possible to a certain extent to reconcile the conservation laws with the space-time coordination of observations, the idea of a coincidence of well-defined events in space-time points being replaced by that of unsharply defined individuals within space-time regions. (Bohr 1928, p. 571)

However, Bohr never followed up on this suggestion that we might be able to strike a compromise between the two mutually exclusive modes of description in terms of unsharply defined quantities. Indeed, an attempt to do so, would take the formalism of quantum theory more seriously than the concepts of classical language, and this step Bohr refused to take. Instead, in his later writings he would be content with stating that the uncertainty relations simply defy an unambiguous interpretation in classical terms:

These so-called indeterminacy relations explicitly bear out the limitation of causal analysis, but it is important to recognize that no unambiguous interpretation of such a relation can be given in words suited to describe a situation in which physical attributes are objectified in a classical way. (Bohr, 1948, p.315)It must here be remembered that even in the indeterminacy relation [Δ

qΔp≈h] we are dealing with an implication of the formalism which defies unambiguous expression in words suited to describe classical pictures. Thus a sentence like "we cannot know both the momentum and the position of an atomic object" raises at once questions as to the physical reality of two such attributes of the object, which can be answered only by referring to the conditions for an unambiguous use of space-time concepts, on the one hand, and dynamical conservation laws on the other hand. (Bohr, 1949, p. 211)

Finally, on a more formal level, we note that Bohr's derivation does not rely on the commutation relations (1) and (5), but on Fourier analysis. These two approaches are equivalent as far as the relationship between position and momentum is concerned, but this is not so for time and energy since most physical systems do not have a time operator. Indeed, in his discussion with Einstein (Bohr, 1949), Bohr considered time as a simple classical variable. This even holds for his famous discussion of the ‘clock-in-the-box’ thought-experiment where the time, as defined by the clock in the box, is treated from the point of view of classical general relativity. Thus, in an approach based on commutation relations, the position-momentum and time-energy uncertainty relations are not on equal footing, which is contrary to Bohr's approach in terms of Fourier analysis (Hilgevoord 1996 and 1998).

## 4. The Minimal Interpretation

In the previous two sections we have seen how both Heisenberg and Bohr attributed a far-reaching status to the uncertainty relations. They both argued that these relations place fundamental limits on the applicability of the usual classical concepts. Moreover, they both believed that these limitations were inevitable and forced upon us. However, we have also seen that they reached such conclusions by starting from radical and controversial assumptions. This entails, of course, that their radical conclusions remain unconvincing for those who reject these assumptions. Indeed, the operationalist-positivist viewpoint adopted by these authors has long since lost its appeal among philosophers of physics.

So the question may be asked what alternative views of the uncertainty relations are still viable. Of course, this problem is intimately connected with that of the interpretation of the wave function, and hence of quantum mechanics as a whole. Since there is no consensus about the latter, one cannot expect consensus about the interpretation of the uncertainty relations either. Here we only describe a point of view, which we call the ‘minimal interpretation’, that seems to be shared by both the adherents of the Copenhagen interpretation and of other views.

In quantum mechanics a system is supposed to be described by its
quantum state, also called its state vector. Given the state vector,
one can derive probability distributions for all the physical
quantities pertaining to the system such as its position, momentum,
angular momentum, energy, etc. The operational meaning of these
probability distributions is that they correspond to the distribution
of the values obtained for these quantities in a long series of
repetitions of the measurement. More precisely, one imagines a great
number of copies of the system under consideration, all prepared in the
same way. On each copy the momentum, say, is measured. Generally, the
outcomes of these measurements differ and a distribution of outcomes is
obtained. The theoretical momentum distribution derived from the
quantum state is supposed to coincide with the hypothetical
distribution of outcomes obtained in an infinite series of repetitions
of the momentum measurement. The same holds, *mutatis mutandis*,
for all the other physical quantities pertaining to the system. Note
that no simultaneous measurements of two or more quantities are
required in defining the operational meaning of the probability
distributions.

Uncertainty relations can be considered as statements about the spreads of the probability distributions of the several physical quantities arising from the same state. For example, the uncertainty relation between the position and momentum of a system may be understood as the statement that the position and momentum distributions cannot both be arbitrarily narrow -- in some sense of the word "narrow" -- in any quantum state. Inequality (9) is an example of such a relation in which the standard deviation is employed as a measure of spread. From this characterization of uncertainty relations follows that a more detailed interpretation of the quantum state than the one given in the previous paragraph is not required to study uncertainty relations as such. In particular, a further ontological or linguistic interpretation of the notion of uncertainty, as limits on the applicability of our concepts given by Heisenberg or Bohr, need not be supposed.

Indeed, this minimal interpretation leaves open whether it makes sense to attribute precise values of position and momentum to an individual system. Some interpretations of quantum mechanics, e.g. those of Heisenberg and Bohr, deny this; while others, e.g. the interpretation of de Broglie and Bohm insist that each individual system has a definite position and momentum (see the entry on Bohmian mechanics). The only requirement is that, as an empirical fact, it is not possible to prepare pure ensembles in which all systems have the same values for these quantities, or ensembles in which the spreads are smaller than allowed by quantum theory. Although interpretations of quantum mechanics, in which each system has a definite value for its position and momentum are still viable, this is not to say that they are without strange features of their own; they do not imply a return to classical physics.

We end with a few remarks on this minimal interpretation. First, it
may be noted that the minimal interpretation of the uncertainty
relations is little more than filling in the empirical meaning of
inequality (9), or an inequality in terms of other measures of width,
as obtained from the standard formalism of quantum mechanics. As such,
this view shares many of the limitations we have noted above about this
inequality. Indeed, it is not straightforward to relate the spread in a
statistical distribution of measurement results with the
*inaccuracy* of this measurement, such as, e.g. the resolving
power of a microscope. Moreover, the minimal interpretation does not
address the question whether one can make *simultaneous*
accurate measurements of position and momentum. As a matter of fact,
one can show that the standard formalism of quantum mechanics does not
allow such simultaneous measurements. But this is not a consequence of
relation (9).

If one feels that statements about inaccuracy of measurement, or the possibility of simultaneous measurements, belong to any satisfactory formulation of the uncertainty principle, the minimal interpretation may thus be too minimal.

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## Other Internet Resources

- Exhibit on Heisenberg and the uncertainty principle, from the American Institute of Physics
- The Nobel prize site, containing a short biography of Heisenberg and his 1932 Nobel presentation speech

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Jan Hilgevoord

Jos Uffink
<*jbuffink@umn.edu*>