Notes to Locke on Real Essence

1. All quotations of Locke's Essay in this entry are from the Nidditch volume. The italicized words, unless otherwise indicated, are in the original. It is also important to point out that the term real essence is used by Henry More in An Antidote Against Atheism, p. 336, London: Flesher, 1655. But here, unlike in More, the term is being defined and used as a technical term that goes beyond “real being”.

2. Another version of natural kind realism comes from John Sergeant in his Solid Philosophy Asserted Against the Fancies of the Ideists (New York: Garland Publishing, 1984) originally published 1697, where he argues that generality, e.g., species and genus ideas, are imposed on us by nature by providing observable similarities; see Reflections 16, section 11. Locke's emphasis on human decision in the creation of nominal essences is obviously at odds with Sergeant's position.

3. For a defense of this reading of Boyle, see Jan-Erik Jones' “Locke vs. Boyle: The Real Essence of Corpuscular Species,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 15 (4): 2007, 659–684. Edward Stillingfleet in the correspondence with Locke appears to be a realist of a similar stripe as Boyle. As Stillingfleet put it:

But in this one Sun there is a real essence, and not a mere nominal or abstracted essence: but suppose there were more suns; would not each of them have the real essence of the Sun? For what is it makes the second sun, but having the same real essence with the first? If it were but a nominal essence, then the second would have nothing but the name. (Works of John Locke, vol. iv, p. 83. All references to Works of John Locke are to Works of John Locke, 10 volumes, London: W. Otridge and Son (1812))

That is, the Bishop of Worcester here assumes that the powers of bodies and their resulting species memberships are determined by physical similarities (and hence the causal similarities) in real essences.

4. Locke, in, also seems to indicate this same conclusion. See Michael Ayers' Locke, vol. II, pp. 67–98; Paul Guyer's “Locke's Philosophy of Language,” p. 133. For Ayers and Guyer, the real essence is a subset of the structure that explains its possession of its nominally essential properties. Stanford, however, argues that real essences also include the necessary connections between the real constitution and the nominally essential properties. For more on this issue, see P. Kyle Stanford (1998), David Owen (1991) and Lionel Shapiro (1999).

5. If one interprets Locke as asserting that there are real essences for individuals, and these essences are not indexed to a specific time, then this might have implications for how we interpret Locke on diachronic identity. Locke is a relative identity theorist, so how we determine the identity of an object is determined by how we describe it. If we think of an object as merely a collection of parts, then any change in parts is a change in identity. However, if an object is an organism, then the parts may change without altering the identity of the object. So, if the real essence of the individual is described as a structure, then that will have a different set of identity conditions than if we describe it as a collection of parts.

6. See “The Ideas of Power and Substance in Locke's Philosophy”, pp. 16–7; for Ayers' later view, see Locke: Epistemology and Ontology, vol. II, ch. 4.

7. As Nicholas Jolley pointed out to me in conversation, a problem that arises here is that Locke ought to distinguish between a mode and an idea of a mode. For example, a disease like malaria is not itself a substance, but it depends on substances for its existence, and so fits the definition of a mode. But malaria (qua parasitic infection) itself is very different from a mere idea of malaria. That is, insofar as malaria is a way in which a substance exists, or a way of being, then it is clearly a mode, whether we have ideas of it or not. So, it seems, Locke needs a way to distinguish modes from ideas of modes.

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Jan-Erik Jones <>

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