Notes to Hans Reichenbach

1. It is not entirely clear whether Reichenbach ever was a student of Max Born. Their times in Berlin and Göttingen did not overlap, and Reichenbach does not appear to have officially enrolled in any of Born's courses (see Padovani 2008, pp. 7-10). Nevertheless, Reichenbach himself counts Born as one of his teachers in autobiographical notes.

2. This notation should be distinguished from set-theoretic notation. Reichenbach has an idiosyncratic notation for probability implications. We use (for html compatibility) “⊃” for Reichenbach's standard material implication and “⊇” for his probability implication, where “⊇p” is a probability implication with probability p.

3. In “Axiomatik der Wahrscheinlichkeitsrechnung” (Reichenbach 1932f) Reichenbach presents his first attempt of an axiomatization of probability.

4. Reichenbach's axioms are restricted to finite additivity, but van Fraassen convincingly argues that without an extension to countable additivity, much of scientific inference would not be captured. There is a separate question of whether the examples van Fraassen provides are excluded by Reichenbach's requirements on the sequences that give rise to the probabilities. But even if that is so, the narrower focus is then a weakness of the limiting frequency interpretation.

Copyright © 2012 by
Clark Glymour <>
Frederick Eberhardt <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free

The SEP would like to congratulate the National Endowment for the Humanities on its 50th anniversary and express our indebtedness for the five generous grants it awarded our project from 1997 to 2007.