Notes to Relativism

1. The framework in this section is based on Swoyer (1982); the idea for a tabular presentation is borrowed from Haack (1996).

2. "Wie Schiffer sind wir, die ihr Schiff auf offener See umbauen müssen, ohne es jemals in einem Dock zerlegen und aus besten Bestandteilen neu errichten zu können." In translation: We are like sailors who must rebuild their ship on the open sea, without ever being able to dismantle it in dry dock and reconstruct it from the best components.

3. The similes of the pyramid and the raft are borrowed from Sosa's important paper, 1980, though my use of them is slightly different from his.

4. D'Andrade, 1995 is a good overview of cognitive anthropology; Berry, et al. 1996 and Cole, 1996 provide accessible treatments of cross-cultural psychology from somewhat different perspectives. Brown, 1991 is a detailed defense of the thesis that there are a number of important human universals. Sperber, 2001, aims to link psychologists' work on modularity with issues in anthropology. It should be noted that different universals may have different explanations, e.g., some universal concepts may be innate while others are so useful that virtually every culture has hit upon them.

5. Poincaré's (1902) work on the conventionality of geometry also influenced several of these thinkers. A few of them, most notably Reichenbach, changed their views on these matters in later years. Some of these writers were part of the linguistic turn, and so they spoke of the role of language, rather than concepts, in shaping experience and knowledge.

6. In 1996 a New York University physicist, Alan Sokal, published a paper entitled "Transgressing the Boundaries: Towards a Transformative Hermeneutics of Quantum Gravity" in Social Text, a journal of "cultural and political analysis." At about the same time he published a brief note in the journal Lingua Franca, "A Physicist Experiments with Cultural Studies," in which he explained that his article in Social Text was an elaborate hoax. It was deliberately stuffed full of patently false claims about science, blatantly wrong accounts of logic and mathematics, and a good deal of other nonsense.

The Sokal affair has become a sort of postmodernist Rorschach, some seeing it as an outrage, others as an innocent hoax, and still others as a long-overdue exposé. But whatever one's allegiances, many of Sokal's claims were so absurd that many undergraduates who had taken a course in physics or mathematics or logic would have caught them immediately. The editors of Social Text either failed to realize that Sokal's claims were false, or else they simply didn't care. Neither alternative is reassuring.

Copyright © 2003 by
Chris Swoyer

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free

The SEP would like to congratulate the National Endowment for the Humanities on its 50th anniversary and express our indebtedness for the five generous grants it awarded our project from 1997 to 2007.