Supplement to Relativism

Relativism and the Constructive Aspects of Perception

1. Empirical Aspects of Human Perception

To keep discussion manageable, we follow the usual, though not entirely salutary practice, of focusing on visual perception.

1.1 Top-Down Processing

The early, largely automatic stages of human visual processing involve things like feature detectors (e.g., edge detectors) that do not involve our concepts or beliefs. These stages are called data-driven or bottom up aspects of perceptual information processing. But in the later stages of processing perception often is affected by our concepts, beliefs, and expectations. Such processes are said to be hypothesis-driven or expectation-driven; they are also known as top-down processes. There is debate over how large a role top-down processes play in everyday perception, but there is little doubt that they can be important (Palmer, 1999, Ch. 9 contains an up-to-date discussion of the issues).

Ambiguous Figures

Ambiguous figures provide a dramatic illustration of the influence our concepts, beliefs, and expectations can exert on perception. The object in the figure below was devised by L. A. Necker in 1832 and is now known as a Necker cube. It is called an ambiguous figure because it can be seen in more than one way: we can see it as a cube with the face ABCD or, when it “reverses,” as a cube with the quite different face, EFGH.

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Necker Cube

The ambiguous creature below can be seen as a duck (looking off to the left) or as a rabbit (looking off to the right).

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An Ambiguous Animal

And in the next figure the person can be seen as either a young woman or as an old woman (the chin line of the young woman is part of the nose of the old woman).

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An Ambiguous Woman

1.2 What Ambiguous Figures Teach Us

Ambiguous figures are not mere curiosities. In each of the above figures the input to the visual system (at least the light striking the rods and cones at the backs of our retinas) is the same. But when the figures reverse, we see things differently. Since this difference cannot be traced to the visual input, it must have some other source. As perceptual psychologists like to say, there is more to seeing than meets the eye.

But what it this more that accounts for the different ways we see these figures? In the next figure we plop our ambiguous duck-rabbit down into two different settings

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Two Group Portraits

and we tend to see it as the sort of creature (duck or rabbit) that fits in with the other creatures in the context.

Next consider

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What's that in the middle?

What is the character in the middle? If we block out the 12 on the left and the 14 on the right we see just the column, and many people naturally, even automatically, see the middle character as a B. But block out the A and the C instead, and it looks like a 13. Here we again tend to see what the context leads us to expect we would see. More importantly, for perceptual relativism, the context only affects us in this way because we belong to a culture in which we have learned about Roman letters and Arabic numerals.

Speech Perception

Everyday speech perception illustrates the same point. We hear our mother tongue as meaningful words that are segmented from each other at spots where the acoustical pattern is not segmented. Indeed, it is very difficult to hear it as “just sounds” (as we hear conversations in languages we don't understand), even when we try.

2. The Theory-Ladeness of Perception

Vision scientists call the way we are primed to see things in a particular context our perceptual set, and set plays a significant role in top-down processing. Some aspects of a person's set are transitory and context-sensitive, as when I prime you to see a duck in the figure above by first showing you a series of unambiguous pictures of ducks. But other aspects, which are more directly relevant to relativism, depend on longer-term features of one's language and culture, as the figure with the alphanumeric characters shows. Writing in the late fifties the philosopher of science Norwood Russell Hanson (1958, esp. Ch. 1) summed these ideas up in the slogan that perception is theory-laden. Our background “theory,” i.e., our concepts, beliefs, and expectations influence what we see--or at least how we them.

2.1 Perception and Relativism

We can sum up the implications various thinkers have drawn for perceptual relativism in two claims.

  1. A good deal of perception is affected by the perceiver's concepts, expectations and general beliefs.
  2. Members of different groups--scientific communities, cultures, linguistic communities, historical periods--will therefore see the world in interestingly different ways.

3. Cross-Cultural Studies of Perception

Some of the earliest fieldwork in anthropology and cross-cultural psychology focused on perception. During the famous British expedition to islands of the Torres Straits (near what was then British New Guinea) in 1895 W. H. R. Rivers tested the hypothesis, then under debate, that members of different cultures differed in perceptual acuity. His work was far from conclusive (though subsequent work suggests that such differences are at best small), but it got the ball rolling. Later, in claims that bear directly on relativism, various social scientists argued that members of cultures with different quite color vocabularies would perceive colors differently. As we will see in our discussion of linguistic relativism, there appears to be some influence of this sort, but not a great deal.

By way of example we consider a meticulous series of experiments by Segall, Campbell, and Herskovitz (1966). They studied subjects from three European and fourteen non-European cultures and tested three hypotheses about the effects living in certain types of environments on susceptibility to various visual illusions. One hypothesis was that living in a “carpentered world”--the common environment in Western societies where rectangular shapes, straight lines, square corners abound--would affect susceptibility to the Müller-Lyer illusion and illusion and the Sander Parallelogram illusion.

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Müller-Lyer Illusion

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Sander Parallelogram Illusion

The researchers hypothesized that people living in highly-carpentered environments would learn to interpret oblique and acute angles as displaced right angles and to perceive two-dimensional drawings in terms of depth. This would lead them to see the two figures in the Müller-Lyer illusion as a three-dimensional object. If the figure on the left were thought of as, say, an edge of a box, it would be the front edge while the figure on the right would be the back edge. This would mean that the figure on the left was larger, as we indeed see it. Similar sorts of issues arise with the Sander parallelogram illusion.

Would similar results be obtained with people living in uncarpentered environments where rectangles and right angles are less common? The Zulu, for example, live in round huts and plow their fields in circles rather than rows. And they turned out, as hypothesized, to be less susceptible to these illusions but more susceptible to some others. (For more recent discussions of the influence of culture on perception see D'Andrade, 1995, Ch. 8.)

3.1 Comprehension Checks

Segall, Campbell, and Herskovitz employed a series of comprehension checks to make sure that they and their subjects agreed about enough things so that subjects' responses could be sensibly interpreted, and it was only after the native informant had passed comprehension checks, ensuring that communication was taking place, that the experiment began. Here is the third comprehension check (1966, p. 109).

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Comprehension Check Item 3

It was only after the informant correctly identified which line of a pair was longer, more slanted, and the like that the experiment began.

4. Perceptual Relativism

Many writers have argued that the way we perceive the world is strongly influenced by our concepts (or our words) and beliefs. In a number of prescient passages the American philosopher Charles Sanders Peirce noted such examples to argue that perception was in fact a type of interpretation or inference (as Helmholtz had urged earlier). is not necessary to go beyond ordinary observations of common life to find a variety of widely different ways in which perception is interpretative (CP, 5.184).

In all such visual illusions of which two or three dozen are well known, the most striking thing is that a certain theory of interpretation of the figure has all the appearance of being given in perception. The first time it is shown to us, it seems as completely beyond the control of rational criticism as any percept is (CP, 5.183).

The point is often linked quite explicitly to relativistic themes. Thus Ruth Benedict tells us that “no man sees the world with pristine eyes” (1934, p. 2), while Edward Sapir urges that "even comparatively simple acts of perception are very much more at the mercy of the social patterns called words than we might suppose" (1929, p. 210). And here is Whorf:

We dissect nature along lines laid down by our native languages. The categories and types that we isolate from the world of phenomena we do not find there because they stare every observer in the face; on the contrary, the world is presented in a kaleidoscopic flux of impressions which has to be organized by our minds …We cut nature up and organize it into concepts, and ascribe significance…. We are thus introduced to a new principle of relativity, which holds that all observers are not led by the same physical evidence to the same picture of the universe (1956, pp. 213-14]).

The anthropologist John Beattie tells us it is an “epistemological commonplace” that

people see what they expect to see, and that the categories of their perception are largely if not wholly determined by their social and cultural background. So members of different cultures may see the world they live in very differently. And it is not just a matter of reaching different conclusions about the world from the same evidence; the very evidence which is given to them as members of different cultures may be different (1966, p. 75).

Here is Nelson Goodman:

Perception depends heavily on conceptual schemata. “There is no innocent eye.” The raw material of vision cannot be extracted from the finished product. Our schemata may change and evolve, be revised or replaced, be suggested or informed, by factors of all kinds; but without some schema there is no perception (1972, p. 142).

The influence of concepts and beliefs on perception was also cornerstone of the new philosophy of science that emerged in the 1960s. In a typical passage Thomas Kuhn tells that various visual illusions (of the sort described above) suggests that

…something like a paradigm is prerequisite to perception itself. What a man sees depends both upon what he looks at and also upon what his previous visual-conceptual experience has taught him to see (1970b, p. 113).

In a sense that I am unable to explicate further, the proponents of competing paradigms practice their trades in different worlds. …Practicing in different worlds …[the proponents of competing paradigms] see different things when they look from the same point in the same direction (1970b, p. 150).

And Paul Feyerabend:

Given appropriate stimuli, but different systems of classification (different ‘mental sets’), our perceptual apparatus may produce perceptual objects which cannot be easily compared (1993, p. 166)

The recurring theme in such passages, which are easily multiplied, is that our concepts and beliefs, language and culture, can exert a strong influence on how we perceive the world.

Return to Relativism: §1: A Framework for Relativism
Return to Relativism: §2: Dependent Variables: What is Relative?
Return to Relativism: §3: Independent Variables: Relative to What?
Return to Relativism: §4: Arguments For Relativism
Return to Relativism: §5: Arguments Against Relativism
Return to Relativism: Table of Contents

Copyright © 2003 by
Chris Swoyer

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