Supplement to Rigid Designators

Two-Dimensionalism Against Materialism

Consider the following materialism-unfriendly two-dimensional diagram (see the subsection Rigidity at Work in Arguments from Two-Dimensionalism (§3.5) of this entry for an indication of how to interpret it).

Table 3

Considered as counterfactual →
Considered as actual ↓
w1
(c-fibers fire if and only if there is an unpleasant sensation)
w2
(c-fibers fire as in w1 but with no attending sensations)
w1
(c-fibers fire if and only if there is an unpleasant sensation)
  1. ‘Pain occurs when c-fibers fire’ (T)
  2. ‘pain’ applies to unpleasant sensations
  1. ‘Pain occurs when c-fibers fire’ (F)
  2. ‘pain’ applies to unpleasant sensations (≠ c-fiber firing)
w2
(c-fibers fire as in W1 but with no attending sensations)
  1. ‘Pain occurs when c-fibers fire’ (F)
  2. ‘pain’ applies to unpleasant sensations (≠ c-fiber firing)

The diagram immediately indicates that it is not metaphysically necessary that pain occurs when c-fibers fire. This seems to indicate that pain is not constituted by c-fiber firing, even in w1, the actual world. If pain were constituted by c-fiber firing in w1, then it would seem to be impossible to have c-fiber firing carrying on just as it does in w1 but without the pain; yet that is just what happens in another possible world, w2. Compare a battle in w1, which might be constituted by certain deadly firings of weapons even though the battle is not identical to those deadly firings because the same battle would have occurred had one of the weapons run out of ammunition faster. On these assumptions about constitution, it is natural to suppose that there is no possible world w2 in which deadly firings carry on just as in w1 but with no attending battle.

Arguments like the above have been discussed feverishly since the publication of Chalmers' The Conscious Mind (1996). Because there is so much interest in arguments of this broad variety, it is worth sorting out some of the striking similarities and differences between them and Kripkean arguments from rigidity like that presented in the subsection on Mind (§3.4) of this entry. As I have said there, I leave to the reader the task of determining how much work rigidity performs in the well-known two-dimensionalist arguments.

A perspicuous version of the two-dimensionalist case against materialism can be approached as a response to an initial materialist reaction to Table 3. The reaction is that there is no good reason to fill out the horizontal row of values at the top right under ‘w2’ in the way that the above diagram does. In Chalmers' vocabulary, the “primary intensions” of ‘Pain occurs when c-fibers fire’ and ‘pain’, are functions from possible worlds to extensions that are captured on the diagonal. The diagonal concerns content that is relevant to the epistemic status of the sentence as a priori or a posteriori; the diagonal does not concern what is metaphysically possible. The horizontal row of values at the top, which depicts the “secondary intension,” concerns what is metaphysically possible. Even though we know about primary intensions just from a priori reflection, we do not know about secondary intensions in this way so we must find out a posteriori how to fill out the values in the top right box. We thus have no reason to say that it is really metaphysically possible that there should be c-fiber firing without pain.

I will follow Chalmers' frequently cited and highly detailed response to materialism on behalf of two-dimensionalism (Chalmers 1996, pp. 132-4; for very similar arguments, see Jackson's 1998 discussion leading to the anti-physicalist conclusion on p. 83). For Chalmers, as for Kripke, anything that feels like a pain is a pain, in any counterfactual world. Something similar holds for any world considered as actual: were we in a world in which scientists find out that our unpleasant sensations are not attended by c-fibers, we would still say that those sensations are “pains.” For that reason, Chalmers says, the primary and secondary intensions for ‘pain’ coincide. They fail to correspond to any physical phenomenon along the diagonal so they fail to correspond to any physical phenomenon along the horizontal.[1]

How does this style of argument compare to the Kripkean argument presented above? Similarities are clear: in both cases, the argument turns on the claim that what we would call a “pain” in any possible world is the phenomenal sensation, not the underlying physical phenomenon that scientific information in the actual world allows us to associate with that sensation. In this respect, ‘pain’ differs from ‘water’.

But there are important differences. The most salient difference is that the whole two-dimensional structure is superfluous for the Kripkean argument. Kripke does not appear to commit to any kind of content apart from content relevant to the metaphysics of modality. Indeed, in places he appears to reject the idea that there is any other content like epistemic content.[2] When Kripke talks about epistemically possible worlds, he rephrases. To say that water might have turned out not to be H2O for Kripke is actually “inaccurate” shorthand and “should be replaced” (p. 143) by something better. The kind of accurate replacement that Kripke has in mind is something like this: in another possible world that, like Twin Earth, appears to denizens of that world just as ours appears to us, the word ‘water’ fails to apply to H2O but it applies instead to some other chemical like XYZ (Kripke 1980, pp. 102-4; see also pp. 140-3). Notice that this paraphrase distinguishes our term ‘water’, with its content, from the term ‘water’ that is employed by denizens of the relevant counterfactual worlds, which term looks and sounds like ours but has a different content. If this is all there is to epistemic possibilities then such possibilities do not make room for our term ‘water’ to enjoy any epistemic semantic content that could allow ‘Water = H2O’ to take the value F, as it does in the diagonal intension recognized by two-dimensionalists (see Table 2 from the subsection Rigidity at Work in Arguments from Two-Dimensionalism (§3.5) of this entry).

Chalmers, by contrast, recognizes the diagonal intension as genuine “epistemic content,” which he takes to be distinct from the “subjunctive content” represented on the horizontal line. “As for the content of S (unqualified), this is a complex content that subsumes both of these and possibly more” (Chalmers 2002, p. 165; see also 1996, p. 62). Both are perfectly legitimate truth-bearing contents. Thus, to protest that ‘Water = H2O at w2’ is really true since the subjunctive content is true is, for Chalmers, “arbitrary”: one could as well say that the statement is really false, since the epistemic content is false. Nor does he brook the suggestion that epistemic content is about the content of sentences as speakers at other worlds use them, that epistemic content is about the content that the sentences would have had had the world been different. On that suggestion, the epistemic content of sentences is not the content that they do in fact have as we use them in our world, given the way the world has turned out. This suggestion is just a mistake, for Chalmers (2002, p. 166; see also forthcoming-a, §5.7; forthcoming-b, §5).

No doubt Kripke's alternative way of seeing things could be mapped onto a two-dimensional diagram, with the horizontal bar representing the content of our expressions as we use them and the diagonal representing the content of expressions that look and sound like ours but that have different content in different worlds: the content that they would have if they were to be used in the respective world, in which the language is sufficiently like ours. Such a diagram would not depict two-dimensional semantics for our expressions; rather, the two dimensions would represent semantics for our expressions, on the one hand, and semantics for expressions looking and sounding like ours, on the other. But such a position would circumvent objections directed at the proposal that there are two kinds of content. For example, there are objections centering around whether the two intensions can and must be understood as giving rise to ambiguity (Marconi 2005, p. 345; Bealer 2002, pp. 83-4). There are also the expected objections from direct reference theorists.[3] (Chalmers resists these attractions, finding Kripke's surrogate two-dimensionalism objectionable: Chalmers forthcoming-a, §5.7.)

The Kripkean argument is resistant, then, to some objections that beleaguer standard two-dimensionalism like that of Chalmers. By failing to commit to any diagonal content for our expressions, the Kripkean argument is committed to less. Another way the Kripkean argument is committed to less is that it never endorses the kind of simplicity and power that standard two-dimensionalism claims. A “core claim” of standard two-dimensionalism is that “A sentence token S is metaphysically necessary if and only if the secondary intension of S is true at all worlds” (Chalmers forthcoming-b §3.1). As we have seen, ‘Pain occurs when c-fibers fire’ has a secondary intension that yields F for some worlds: so the statement is not necessarily true, according to Chalmers (1996, pp. 136-8). The statement also yields T for some worlds, so its negation is not necessary: accordingly, the statement is contingent. But the Kripkean argument above never commits to saying that all statements with contingent secondary intensions are in fact metaphysically contingent.[4] There is nothing so sweeping in the argument, which does not address claims that are unlike the theoretical identities under consideration. Take a quite different claim: there is a tradition according to which ‘God exists’ is metaphysically necessary (see God and Other Necessary Beings). We do have epistemic access to the truth of God's necessary existence by way of metaphysical principles about causation and contingency, according to many in the tradition (Aquinas, Leibniz and others), so for simplicity let us consider a variant tradition favored by agnostics who maintain that God's existence is necessary if it obtains at all but who maintain that whether God actually does exist (and so does exist necessarily) cannot be demonstrated true or false by us mere mortals. Chalmers appears to be committed to rejecting such necessity since for him the secondary intension of ‘God exists’ is false in worlds at which the primary intension is false, the secondary intension representing truth values as we have access to them in ideal epistemic circumstances that might obtain after, say, scientists have done their work (Chalmers 1999, pp. 484-5; forthcoming-b, §5). Kripke is silent about such matters.

A third respect in which the two-dimensionalist argument associated with Table 3 commits to more than the Kripkean argument from the subsection on Mind (§3.4) in this entry is that the two-dimensionalist argument concludes that pain is not even constituted by c-fiber firing. According to this argument, pain is something “over and above” any physical phenomenon (Chalmers 1996, p. 134). This is a stronger claim than the mere claim that pain is not identical to c-fiber firing. For Kripke, a statue is not identical to the clay that constitutes it (see the subsection Objections to Rigidity in General (§4.1) of this entry): but clearly there is an intimate relationship between the two. The Kripkean argument above merely establishes non-identity. Further work would be needed to draw conclusions about constitution, though Kripke suggests that arguments against constitution are only a short step away (1980, p.145, note 74; there appears to be unresolved tension in Kripke's mind about the matter: cf. p. 155, note 77).

The foregoing paragraphs show that the standard two-dimensionalist argument associated with Table 3 is more ambitious, in some respects, than the Kripkean argument from the subsection on Mind (§3.4) of this entry. The Kripkean argument is committed to less. There are also respects in which the relevant Kripkean argument against identity, as an argument against token identity, is committed to more than the two-dimensionalist argument. The two-dimensionalist argument mentions nothing about whether a token pain could be that very pain in a counterfactual world in which it (or what would otherwise be it) is not generated by the corresponding c-fiber firing. Similarly, the two-dimensionalist argument mentions nothing about whether a token c-fiber firing could be that very c-fiber firing in a counterfactual world in which it (or what would otherwise be it) fails to generate the corresponding pain. Claims like this are crucial to the Kripkean argument, from the subsection on Mind (§3.4) of this entry, for the failure of token identity statements like ‘P = C′. A champion of the two-dimensionalist argument would reject token identity, presumably, since she concludes that pain (any pain, by a natural extension of the above argument) is something over and above c-fiber firing. Even so, she need not say that any particular pain could have existed without the corresponding c-fiber firing or that any particular c-fiber firing could have existed without the corresponding pain: therefore she need not accept Kripke's argument against token identity,[5] which relies on the intuition that the token pain P could have existed without the token c-fiber firing C or that C could have existed without P. The two-dimensionalist could restrict herself to saying that there are worlds w in which a c-fiber firing C′, which is otherwise just like the event C in the actual world, fails to be painful (even though C′ may be distinct from C, since should C have failed to generate pain, the “rump C” remaining in the resulting world w is not C, but merely something just like C: C′, whose failure to generate pain makes it distinct from C).

The Kripkean argument against token identity is generally recognized to be of great significance, if it is successful. But it is controversial. Standard two-dimensionalist arguments against materialism evade some of the controversy, as I have indicated, by committing to less. In the same way, the Kripkean argument avoids some of the commitments of standard two-dimensionalist arguments against materialism.

Return to Rigid Designators

Copyright © 2006 by
Joseph LaPorte <jlaporte@hope.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free