Supplement to Russell's Moral Philosophy

Russell's Humean Wobble: Human Society in Ethics and Politics

Russell's Human Society is a fun book to read, but meta-ethically it is a bit of a mess. There is much wit and some wisdom, though both the wit and the wisdom are more conspicuous when he is discussing human nature and human society than when he is discussing the finer points of ethical theory. (I particularly like his frequent complaints that human behavior seldom rises to the level of enlightened self-interest. If only we could manage to be intelligently selfish, the world would be a much better place.) The drift of the argument is sometimes difficult to discern, partly because of has frequent digressions to make bon mots, and partly because of his dialectical method of presentation, which approaches what he takes to be the truth via a series of successive approximations. Human Society in Ethics and Politics was published in 1954, but the meta-ethical bits were originally written some years earlier and intended for inclusion in Human Knowledge: Its Scope and Limits, (1948). Russell held them back because he was not sure whether ethical propositions rose to the dignity of knowledge. He continued to be doubtful about this, but by the early 1950s his doubts had sufficiently dissipated for publication to become a possibility. Nevertheless, there are marked analogies between the two books. Human Knowledge attempts to establish the existence of a mind-independent world on the basis of private perceptions. Human Society attempts to establish an ethic that is in some degree independent of individual minds on the basis of subjective sentiments.

Hume looms large in Russell's Human Knowledge. Indeed the whole book can be seen as an attempt to concede the premises of Hume's skeptical argument — that the data we start with are private and personal and that we cannot infer an external world from such data by means of demonstrative inference — whilst resisting its conclusion — that we can have no knowledge of an external world. (Hence the need for non-demonstrative inference.) But although Hume was Russell's chief opponent in Human Knowledge, he was perhaps a meta-ethical ally in Human Society. In the Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Moral, Hume sought to base an inter-subjective ethic on human sentiments, specifically the sentiments of approbation and disapprobation. Hume was much more at ease in the world than Russell, and was only interested in moral reform in so far as morals rested on the ‘delusive glosses of superstition and false religion’ (which in his opinion included all religion). But he did want a meta-ethic that would enable him to transfer the monkish virtues (whose status as virtues depended on the ‘delusive glosses’) from the catalogue of virtues to the catalogue of vices. Thus he wanted to be able to show that those who approved of ‘celibacy, fasting, penance, mortification, self-denial, humility, silence, solitude’ were making some kind of mistake. How did he propose to do it? By combining a definition with an empirical research program. ‘The hypothesis which we embrace is plain. It maintains that morality is determined by sentiment. It defines [my italics] virtue to be whatever mental action or quality gives to a spectator the pleasing sentiment of approbation; and vice the contrary. We then proceed to examine a plain matter of fact, to wit, what actions have this influence’ (Hume 1975: 289). The matter of fact is less plain than Hume suggests, since the ‘spectator’ is an ideal observer, whose moral sense operates at optimum in part because (unlike the rest of us) he is relevantly informed. This means that we cannot simply predict the reactions of the spectator by observing the reactions of mankind, since mankind is often mistaken about the relevant facts. In particular, since many people are subject to the delusive glosses of superstition and false religion, their reactions are liable to be distorted by false beliefs, leading them to approve of what is really vicious (such as celibacy, fasting etc) and to disapprove of what is really right (such as playing whist on Sundays with ‘modest women’). Since a virtue is whatever mental action or quality gives to a [suitably qualified] spectator the pleasing sentiment of approbation, and since nobody would approve of fasting, celibacy etc if they did not think they would be useful in procuring an agreeable afterlife, no suitably qualified person would approve of them, since being suitably qualified involves not being subject to the delusive glosses of superstition and false religion. However Hume's meta-ethic rests partly on a definition (which Hume obviously conceives of as reporting a truth of language) and partly on the thesis that people share the same moral sensibility which can therefore be ‘idealized’ to serve as the criterion for virtue. In other words Hume's theory rests on the presupposition that given the same information, we would approve or disapprove of much the same things.

What about Russell? His theory, like Hume's rests on a set of ‘fundamental propositions and definitions’:

(1) Surveying the acts which arouse emotions of approval or disapproval, we find that, as a general rule, the acts which are approved of are those believed likely to have, on the balance, effects of certain kinds, while opposite effects are expected from acts that are disapproved of.

(2) Effects that lead to approval are defined as “good”, and those leading to disapproval as “bad”.

(3) An act of which, on the available evidence, the effects are likely to be better than those of any other act that is possible in the circumstances, is defined as “right”; any other act is “wrong”. What we “ought” to do is, by definition, the act which is right.

‘These definitions and propositions, if accepted provide a coherent body of propositions which are true (or false) in the same sense as if they were propositions of science.’ (RoE: 161-162/ Human Society in Ethics and Politics: 116.)

Now (1) is a variant of Sidgwick's thesis that common-sense moralities tend to solidify around rules which are believed to have generally beneficial consequences, where the benefit is cashed out in terms of human welfare. It is a dubious thesis, especially as Russell himself had argued that many traditional moralities foster the interests of the elite at the expense of other groups — foreigners, women, slaves and serfs. Perhaps Russell wants to exclude such moralities, by restricting his claim to civilized communities, where ‘civilized‘ rules out societies with blatantly elitist moral codes. Thesis (2) purports to define ‘good effects’, but it does not state whose approval is to determine goodness — people in general, people at their impartial best, or just the enlightened and well-informed? Without some clarity on this point, too many things will wind up as good, since for any likely effect there will be some weirdo somewhere who approves of it. Conversely, if being disapproved of means that an effect is not good, the class of good effects may vanish altogether, since for any likely effect there will be some weirdo somewhere who disapproves of it. Paradoxically given his long career as a moral radical, Russell's meta-ethic seems to have less critical bite than Hume's, at least as regards ends. Hume's theory allows him to transfer a reputed virtue to the catalogue of vices if people approve of it on the basis of false beliefs. Russell seems to be stuck with whatever effects people happen to approve of even if their tendency to approve is based on false beliefs and malodorous passions. But the real problem lies with (3). It defines ‘right’ and ‘ought’ in consequentialist terms and as we have seen (and as Russell himself had argued many years before) such a definition is clearly false, at least if it is construed as a report of current usage. It is not a tautology to say that the right thing to do is the action that seems likely to produce the best consequences, which it would be if Russell's definition were correct.

The theory could be improved by retaining (1) and (2) with the class of approvers more carefully specified, but replacing (3) with something like:

(3a) The right thing to do is defined as the action which an impartial, informed and non-superstitious spectator would approve of doing.

On the assumption that the impartial spectator would retain the broadly consequentialist tendencies of our rude ancestors, (1) and (3a) together would allow us to derive:

(3b) The right thing to do is that action which seems likely to produce the best effects.

And this would be a moderately plausible synthetic claim rather than a patently false definition. Moreover, it would provide the basis for the right kind of utilitarian ethic — at least, it would do so if the ethical jury in (2) is specified in such a way as to ensure that they approve of the right effects.

But so far from being ‘true in the same sense as if they were propositions of science’, the definitions (2) and (3a) are simply false, at least if they are construed as accounts of what the words in question actually mean. Russell seems to have been aware of this, as the tell-tale phrase ‘if they are accepted’ indicates. Perhaps these definitions should be understood not as attempts to codify current usage but as proposals for linguistic reform (which, was a common dodge on the part of mid-century philosophers when their purported analyses proved false). But in that case they can be rejected without making any kind of mistake, along with Russell's entire ethic. And what can be rejected without intellectual error can hardly qualify as knowledge.

Russell himself may have agreed. He was not at all sure that there was such a thing as ethical knowledge and soon reverted to his earlier emotivism. Within one month of the publication of Human Society he was expressing ‘complete agreement’ with the emotivism of A.J. Ayer (RoE: 165/Papers 11: 175). The reason, I suspect, is that he came to see that his ‘definitions of ‘right’ and ‘good’ were intellectually optional. Some years later a Mr Harold Osborn sent him a book which attempted to provide an objective basis for a humanistic ethic. Russell's letter of thanks points out a problem: ‘any system of ethics which claims objectivity can only do so by means of a concealed ethical premise, which, if disputed, cannot be demonstrated’ (Dear Bertrand Russell: 98). That is precisely what is wrong with Human Society in Ethics and Politics.

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Copyright © 2007 by
Charles Pigden <>

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