Supplement to School of Names

Pronunciation Guide

The following is a very rough guide to the pronunciation of some of the Chinese terms used in the article. A question mark indicates a rising tone, an exclamation point a falling tone. (Caution: Some of the suggested English equivalents approximate the Chinese sounds only vaguely.) In the list below, the Chinese term is given first followed by the meaning in parentheses and the pronunciation in square brackets.

  • Bian (disputation, dialectics) [“be-yen!” pronounced as a single syllable]
  • Bian zhe (disputers, dialecticians) [“be-yen!” as a single syllable, followed by “juh” (rhymes with “uh-huh?”)]
  • Deng Xi (famous lawyer) [“dung!” followed by “shee” as in ‘banshee’]
  • Fei (not-this, wrong) [“fey”]
  • Gongsun Long (proponent of white horse sophism) [“gohng” (“go” plus an “-ng” ending), followed by “soo-en” pronounced as one syllable, with the vowel shorter than the English ‘soon’; “lohng?” (“low” plus an “-ng” ending)]
  • Hui Shi (proponent of paradoxes) [“hway!”, “shr” or “sher”]
  • Jian bai (hard and white) [“jee-yen,” pronounced as a single syllable; “bye?”]
  • Jixia (scholarly “thinktank” sponsored by King Xuan of Qi) [Two syllables: “jee!” followed by “shee-ya!”]
  • Ke (admissible) [“ker” without the final ‘r’]
  • Mozi (classical text) [“mwo!” followed by “dz”]
  • Qi (ancient state in northeast China) [“chee?”, pronouncing the “ch” roughly as in “watching”]
  • Qin (ancient state in western China; eventually conquered all other states to form a unified empire in 221 B.C.) [“chin?”, pronouncing the “ch” roughly as in “watching”]
  • Shi (this, right) [“shr!” or “sher!” as in “Sherlock”]
  • Shi (stuff) [“shr?” or “sher?” as in “Sherlock”]
  • Shuo (explanation) [“shwo”]
  • Tong (same, similar) [“tohng?” (“toe” plus an “-ng?” ending)]
  • Wu hou (the dimensionless) [“woo?” “hoe!”]
  • Xing (shape) [“sheeng?” “shee” as in ‘banshee’ plus an “-ng?” ending]
  • Xunzi (Confucian thinker and eponymous text) [“issue,” without the initial ‘i’ and adding a final ‘n’, followed by “dz”]
  • Yi (thought, intention) [“e!” (a clipped pronunciation of the letter “e”)]
  • Zhao (ancient state in north China) [“jow!”, rhyming with “ow!”]
  • Zheng ming (correcting or rectifying names) [“jung!” as in ‘jungle’, followed by “ming?” as in ‘mingle’]
  • Zhi (pointing or referring) [“jr” (similar to the first syllable of ‘gerbil’)]
  • Zhuangzi (classical Daoist text) [“joo-wong” pronounced as one syllable, followed by “dz”]

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Chris Fraser <>

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