Mechanisms in Science

First published Wed Nov 18, 2015

Around the turn of the twenty-first century, what has come to be called the new mechanical philosophy (or, for brevity, the new mechanism) emerged as a framework for thinking about the philosophical assumptions underlying many areas of science, especially in sciences such as biology, neuroscience, and psychology. In this entry, we introduce and summarize the distinctive features of this framework, and we discuss how it addresses a range of classic issues in the philosophy of science, including explanation, metaphysics, the relations between scientific disciplines, and the process of scientific discovery. For each of these issues, we show how the mechanistic framework has reoriented philosophical work, what the new mechanism has contributed to the discussion, and what remains to be done.

1. The Rise of the New Mechanism

Twentieth century philosophy of science was largely dominated by logical empiricism. More a framework for doing philosophy of science than any coherent set of doctrines, logical empiricism addressed a range of issues in philosophy of science through the lens of the logical and mathematical structures constitutive of scientific thought and practice (see the entry on logical empiricism). Logical empiricism tended, by and large, to focus on abstract, epistemic features of science, with little attention to scientific practice. Physics was the dominant exemplar.

The new mechanical philosophy emerged around the turn of the twenty-first century as a new framework for thinking about the philosophy of science. The philosophers who developed this framework were, by comparison with the logical empiricists, practitioners as well of the history of science and tended, by and large, to focus on the biological, rather than physical, sciences. Many new mechanists developed their framework explicitly as a successor to logical empiricist treatments of causation, levels, explanation, laws of nature, reduction, and discovery.

As with logical empiricism, the new mechanical philosophy is less a systematic and coherent set of doctrines than it is an orientation to the subject matter of the philosophy of science. The approach emerged as philosophers and historians of science began to break from the once-standard practice of reconstructing scientific inference with the tools of logic and, instead, to embrace detailed investigation of actual episodes from the history of science. The main tenets of logical empiricism had been under intense criticism for decades, and a new era of historically informed philosophy of science had taken hold through the works of, e.g., Kuhn (1962), Laudan (1977), and Lakatos (1977). To many such scholars raised in this post-logical empiricist milieu, it appeared that much of the practice of contemporary science (both in the laboratory and in print) was driven by the search for mechanisms, that many of the grand achievements in the history of science were discoveries of mechanisms, and that more traditional philosophy of science, for whatever reason, had failed to appreciate this central feature of the scientific worldview.

Aspects of the new mechanical philosophy began to emerge in the late 1960s. Fodor (1968), for example, contrasted mechanistic explanations (dealing with parts and their law-like interactions) with functional explanations in psychology. Wimsatt (1972a, 1976), building on the work of Simon (1962) and Kaufman (1971), argued repeatedly that the abstract and idealized structures of logical empiricism were ill-suited to understanding how scientists discover and explain complex systems at multiple levels of organization. Cummins (1975) provided an account of functional analyses, characterizing a function as a contribution a component part makes to the overall capacity of some system that includes that component. Salmon (1984, 1989) argued that empiricist views of scientific explanation are fundamentally flawed because they neglect causal mechanisms. Cartwright (1989) argued that the logical empiricist conception of a law of nature is, in fact, a philosophical fiction used to describe the search for capacities and nomological machines.

These strands began to coalesce into an over-arching perspective in the 1990s. The earliest clear statement of the new mechanism was Bechtel and Richardson's (2010 [1993]) Discovering Complexity. They self-consciously put aside logical empiricist concerns with theory reduction and focused instead on the process by which scientists discover mechanisms (see Section 6 below). Soon after, Glennan argued that mechanisms are the secret connexion Hume sought between cause and effect (1996), a thesis related to and partly inspired by Cartwright's focus on capacities and nomological machines (Glennan 1997). Likewise, Thagard's How Scientists Explain Disease centered the search for causes and mechanisms in medicine (Thagard 2000; see also Section 6 below). Machamer, Darden and Craver's “Thinking about Mechanisms” (Machamer, Darden, and Craver 2000; familiarly known as “MDC”) drew these strands together and became for many the lightening rod of the new mechanist perspective. MDC suggested that the philosophy of biology, and perhaps the philosophy of science more generally, should be restructured around the fundamental idea that many scientists organize their work around the search for mechanisms.

2. The Concept of a Mechanism

The term “mechanism” emerged in the seventeenth century and derived from Greek and Latin terms for “machine” (Dijksterhuis 1961). Descartes understood mechanics as the basic building block of the physical world; in Le Monde, he proposed to explain diverse phenomena in the natural world (such as planetary motion, the tides, the motion of the blood, and the properties of light) in terms of the conservation of inertial motion through contact action (see the entry on René Descartes). Subsequently, the idea of mechanism has been transformed many times to reflect an evolving understanding of the basic causal forces in the world (besides conserved motion): e.g., attraction and repulsion (du Bois Reymond), conservation of energy (Helmholtz), gravitational attraction (Newton) (Boas 1952; Westfall 1971; see also entries on Hermann von Helmholtz and Isaac Newton). The concept of mechanism has had an almost separate evolution in the history of the life sciences (Allen 2005; Des Chene 2001, 2005; Nicholson 2012), at times eschewing the metaphysical austerity embraced by Descartes and many early mechanists.

The new mechanists inherit the word “mechanism” from these antecedents, but, in their effort to capture how the term is used in contemporary science, have distanced themselves both from the idea that mechanisms are machines and especially from the austere metaphysical world picture in which all real change involves only one or a limited set of fundamental activities or forces (cf. Andersen 2014a,b).

Mechanists have generally eschewed the effort to spell out necessary and sufficient conditions for something to be a mechanism. Instead, they offer qualitative descriptions designed to capture the way scientists use the term and deploy the concept in their experimental and inferential practices.

Three characterizations are most commonly cited:

  • MDC: “Mechanisms are entities and activities organized such that they are productive of regular changes from start or set-up to finish or termination conditions” (2000: 3).
  • Glennan: “A mechanism for a behavior is a complex system that produces that behavior by the interaction of a number of parts, where the interaction between parts can be characterized by direct, in variant, change-relating generalizations” (2002: S344).
  • Bechtel and Abrahamsen: “A mechanism is a structure performing a function in virtue of its component parts, component operations, and their organization. The orchestrated functioning of the mechanism is responsible for one or more phenomena” (2005: 423).

Each of these characterizations contains four basic features: (1) a phenomenon, (2) parts, (3) causings, and (4) organization. We consider each of these in detail below.

A useful canonical visual representation of a mechanism underlying a phenomenon is shown in Figure 1 (from Craver 2007). At the top is the phenomenon, some system S engaged in behavior y. This is the behavior of the mechanism as a whole. Beneath it are the parts (the Xs) and their activities (the fs) organized together. The dotted horizontal lines reflect the fact that the parts and activities are contained within, are components of, the mechanism engaged in this behavior. Thus represented, mechanisms are decompositional in the sense that the behavior of the system as a whole can be broken down into organized interactions among the activities of the parts.

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Figure 1. A visual representation of a mechanism (adapted from Craver 2007).

In the early literature, these different characterizations were often treated as competitors. Tabery (2004) argued instead that they reflecte different, and complementary, emphases and intellectual orientations. Many mechanists have adopted this ecumenical stance. For example, Illari and Williamson offer a “consensus concept” of mechanism:

A mechanism for a phenomenon consists of entities and activities organized in such a way that they are responsible for the phenomenon. (2012: 120)

Likewise, Glennan refers to “minimal mechanism”:

A mechanism for a phenomenon consists of entities (or parts) whose activities and interactions are organized in such a way that they produce the phenomenon. (Glennan forthcoming: Ch. 2)

These ecumenical characterizations each include the four basic elements and are designed to make the characterization more inclusive. MDC's insistence on the regularity of mechanisms is abandoned, for example, to accommodate mechanisms that work only once or that work irregularly (Skipper and Milstein 2005; Bogen 2005; see also Section 2.1.2 below). Bechtel and Abrahamson's emphasis on the “functions” is abandoned to accommodate mechanisms that serve no end and to distance mechanism from this loaded term so often opposed to mechanism (although see Craver 2001a; Garson 2013; Maley and Piccinini forthcoming; see also Section 4.5 below).

These ecumenical characterizations intentionally downplay the fact that the term “mechanism” is used differently in different scientific and philosophical contexts (see Levy 2013 and Andersen 2014a,b for alternative overviews of the differences). Indeed, much of the progress in the early years involved learning to recognize the many ways that the term “mechanism” can be used and the many commitments that can be undertaken in its name. (For still other characterizations of mechanism, see Woodward (2002), Fagan (2012), Nicholson (2012), and Garson (2013)). Taking these ecumenical views as a starting point, we now consider the four basic components: 1) the phenomenon, 2) parts, 3) causings, and 4) organization.

2.1 Phenomenon

The phenomenon is the behavior of the mechanism as a whole. All mechanisms are mechanisms of some phenomenon (Kauffman 1971; Glennan 1996, 2002). The mechanism of protein synthesis synthesizes proteins. The mechanism of the action potential generates action potentials. The boundaries of a mechanism—what is in the mechanism and what is not—are fixed by reference to the phenomenon that the mechanism explains. The components in a mechanism are components in virtue of being relevant to the phenomenon.

MDC (2000) describe mechanisms as working from start- or set-up conditions to termination conditions. They insist that it is impoverished to describe the phenomenon as an input-output relation because there are often many such inputs and outputs from a mechanism and because central features of a phenomenon might be neither inputs nor outputs (but rather details about how the phenomenon unfolds over time). Darden, appealing to the example of protein synthesis, often associates the phenomenon with the end-state: the protein (Darden 2006). Craver (2007), following Cummins (1975) and Cartwright (1989), often speaks of the phenomenon roughly as a capacity or behavior of the mechanism as a whole.

2.1.1 Producing, Underlying, and Maintaining

New mechanists speak variously of the mechanism as producing, underlying, or maintaining the phenomenon (Craver and Darden 2013). The language of production is best applied to mechanisms conceived as a causal sequence terminating in some end-product: as when a virus produces symptoms via a disease mechanism or an enzyme phosphorylates a substrate. In such cases, the phenomenon might be an object (the production of a protein), a state of affairs (being phosphorylated), or an activity or event (such as digestion). For many physiological mechanisms, in contrast, it is more appropriate to say that the mechanism underlies the phenomenon. The mechanism of the action potential or of working memory, for example, underlies the phenomenon, here characteristically understood as a capacity or behavior of the mechanism as a whole. Finally, a mechanism might maintain a phenomenon, as when homeostatic mechanisms hold body temperature within tightly circumscribed boundaries. In such cases, the phenomenon is a state of affairs, or perhaps a range of states of affairs, that is held in place by the mechanism. These ways of talking can in many cases be inter-translated (e.g., the product is produced, the production has an underlying mechanism, and the state of affairs is maintained by an underlying mechanism). Yet clearly confusion can arise from mixing these ways of talking.

2.1.2 Regularity

Must the relationship between the mechanism and the phenomenon be regular? This is an area of active discussion (DesAutels 2011; Andersen 2011, 2014a,b; Krickel 2014). MDC stipulate that mechanisms are regular in that they work “always or for the most part in the same ways under the same conditions” (2000: 3). Some have understood this (incorrectly in our view) as asserting that there are no mechanisms that work only once, or that a mechanism must work significantly more than once in order to count as a mechanism.

Some argue that mechanisms have to be regular in this factual sense (Andersen 2014a,b); i.e., repeated on many occasions (see Leuridan 2010). This view would seem to require a somewhat arbitrary cut-off point in degree of regularity between things that truly count as mechanisms and those that do not. Some mechanists (Bogen 2005; Glennan 2009) argue that there is no difficulty applying the term “mechanism” to one-off causal sequences, as when an historian speaks of the mechanism that gave rise to World War I. Other mechanists argue that the type-token distinction is too crude a dichotomy to capture the many levels of abstraction at which mechanism types and tokens might be characterized (Darden 1991).

It is possible, however, to read the MDC statement as asserting, not a factual kind of regularity, but as a counterfactual kind of near-determinism: were all the conditions the same, then the mechanism would likely produce the same phenomenon, where “likely” accommodates mechanisms with stochastic elements.

While the MDC account leaves open the possibility that some mechanisms are stochastic, it clearly rules out mechanisms that usually fail to produce their phenomena. Skipper and Millstein (2005) press this point to argue that the MDC account cannot accommodate the idea that natural selection is a mechanism. If, as Gould (1990) argued, one could not reproduce the history of life by rewinding the tapes and letting things play forward again, then natural selection would not be an MDC mechanism (see also Section 2.6 below). It is unclear why MDC would allow for the possibility of stochastic mechanisms and rule out, by definition, the possibility that they might fail more often than they work. Whether any biological mechanisms are truly irregular in this sense (i.e., all the causally relevant factors are the same but the product of the mechanism differs) is a separate question from whether they are mechanisms simpliciter (see Bogen 2005; Machamer 2004; Steel 2008 develops a stochastic account of mechanisms).

Krickel (2014) reviews the many different ways of unpacking the relevant notion of regularity (see also Andersen 2012). Her favored solution, “reverse regularity,” holds that there must be a generalization to the effect that, typically, when the phenomenon occurs, the mechanism was acting.

2.2 Parts

Mechanists have struggled to find a concise way to express the idea of parthood required of the components in a mechanism. The project is to develop an account that is both sufficiently permissive to include the paradigmatic mechanisms from diverse areas of science and yet not vacuous.

Formal mereologies are difficult to apply to the material parts of biological mechanisms. Axioms of mereology, such as reflexivity (everything is a part of itself) and unrestricted composition (any two things form a whole) do not apply in standard biological uses of the “part” concept.

Glennan (1996) recognized the difficulty of defining parthood very early on. His proposal:

The parts of mechanisms must have a kind of robustness and reality apart from their place within that mechanism. It should in principle be possible to take the part out of the mechanism and consider its properties in another context. (1996: 53)

Yet even this is perhaps too strong, given that some parts of a mechanism might become unstable when removed from their mechanistic context. Later, Glennan (2002: S345) says that the properties of a part must be stable in the absence of interventions, or that parts must be stable enough to be called objects. This notion is perhaps too strong to accommodate the more ephemeral parts of some biochemical mechanisms or of the mechanisms of natural selection (Skipper and Millstein 2005; but see Illari and Williamson 2010).

2.3 Causings

Mechanists have disagreed with one another about how to understand the cause in causal mechanism. New mechanists have in general been at pains both (1) to liberate the relevant causal notion from any overly austere view that restricts causation to only a small class of phenomena (such as collisions, attraction/repulsion, or energy conservation), and (2) to distance themselves from the Humean, regularist conception of causation common among logical empiricists (see also the entry on the the metaphysics of causation). Four ways of unpacking the cause in causal mechanism have been discussed: conserved quantity accounts, mechanistic accounts, activities accounts, and counterfactual accounts. (It should be noted that some mechanists have evolved in their thinking about causation.)

2.3.1 Conserved Quantity Accounts

According to transmission accounts, causation involves the transmission and propagation of marks or conserved quantities (Salmon 1984, 1994; Dowe 1992). The most influential form of this view holds that two causal processes causally interact when they intersect in space-time and exchange some amount of a conserved quantity, such as mass. On this view, causation is local (the processes must intersect) and singular (it is fully instantiated in particular causal processes), though the account relies upon laws of conservation (Hitchcock 1995). Although this view inspired many of the new mechanists, and although it shares their commitment to looking toward science for an account of causation, it has generally been rejected by new mechanists (though see Millstein 2006; Roe 2014).

This view has been unpopular in part because it has little direct application in nonfundamental sciences, such as biology. The causal claims biologists make usually don't involve explicit reference to conserved quantities (even if they presuppose such notions fundamentally) (Glennan 2002; Craver 2007). Furthermore, biological mechanisms often involve causation by omission, prevention, and double prevention (that is, when a mechanism works by removing a cause, preventing a cause, or inhibiting an inhibitor) (Schaffer 2000, 2004). Such forms of causal disconnection are ubiquitous in the special sciences.

2.3.2 Mechanistic Accounts

Glennan (1996, 2009) sees causation (at least non-fundamental causation) as derivative from the concept of mechanism: causal claims are claims about the existence of a mechanism. The truth-maker for a causal claim at one level of organization is a mechanism at a lower level. In short, mechanisms are the hidden connexion Hume sought between cause and effect. Like the Salmon-Dowe account, Glennan's view is singular: particular mechanisms link particular causes and particular effects (Glennan forthcoming)

This view has been charged with circularity: the concept of mechanism ineliminably contains a causal element. However, Glennan replies that many accounts of causation (such as Woodward's 2003 account, see Section 2.3.4 below) share this flaw. Furthermore, he argues that for at least all non-fundamental causes, a mechanisms clearly explains how a given cause produces its effect.

Whether the analysis succeeds depends on how one deals with the resulting regress (Craver 2007). As Glennan (2009) notes, the decomposition of causes into mechanisms might continue infinitely, in which case there is no point arguing about which notion is more fundamental, or the decomposition might ground out in some basic, lowest-level causal notion that is primitive and so not analyzable into other causal mechanisms. The latter option must confront the widely touted absence of causation in the theories of fundamental physics (Russell 1913); at very small size scales, classical conceptions of objects and properties no longer seem to apply, making it difficult to see what content is left to the idea that there are mechanisms at work (see also Teller 2010; Kuhlman and Glennan 2014).

2.3.3 Activity-Based Accounts

Still other mechanists, such as Bogen (2005, 2008a) and Machamer (Machamer 2004), embrace an Anscombian, non-reductive view that causation should be understood in terms of productive activities (see also the entry on G.E.M. Anscombe). Activities are kinds of causing, such as magnetic attraction and repulsion or hydrogen bonding. Defenders of activity-based accounts eschew the need to define the concept, relying on science to say what activities are and what features they might have. This view is a kind of causal minimalism (Godfrey-Smith 2010). Whether an activity occurs is not a matter of how frequently it occurs or whether it would occur always or for the most part in the same conditions (Bogen 2005).

This account has been criticized as vacuous because it fails to say what activities are (Psillos 2004), to account for the relationship of causal and explanatory relevance (Woodward 2002), and to mark an adequate distinction between activities and correlations (Psillos 2004), though see Bogen (2005, 2008a) for a response. Glennan (forthcoming) argues that these problems can be addressed by recognizing that activities in a mechanism at one level depend on lower-level mechanisms. (See also Persson 2010 for a criticism of activities based on their inability to handle cases of polygenic effects.)

2.3.4 Counterfactual Accounts

Lastly, some new mechanists, particularly those interested in providing an account of scientific explanation, have gravitated toward a counterfactual view of causal relevance, and in particular, to the manipulationist view expressed in Woodward (2001, 2003) (see, e.g., Glennan 2002; Craver 2007). The central commitment of this view is that models of mechanisms describe variables that make a difference to the values of other variables in the model and to the phenomenon. Difference-making in this manipulationist sense is understood as a relationship between variables in which interventions on cause variables can be used to change the value of effect variables (see the entry on causation and manipulability).

Unlike the views discussed above, this way of thinking about causation provides a ready analysis of explanatory relevance that comports well with the methods for testing causal claims. Roughly, one variable is causally relevant to a second when there exists an ideal intervention on the first that changes the value of the second via the change induced on the first. The view readily accommodates omissions, preventions, and double preventions—situations that have traditionally proven troublesome for production-type accounts of causation. In short, the claim that C causes E requires only that ideal interventions on C can be used to change the value of E, not that C and E are physically connected to one another. Finally, this view provides some tools for accommodating higher-level causal relations and the non-accidental laws of biology. On the other hand, the counterfactual account is non-reductive (like the mechanistic view), and it inherits challenges faced by other counterfactual views, such as pre-emption and over-determination which are common in biological mechanisms (see the entry on counterfactual theories of causation).

2.4 Organization

The characteristic organization of mechanisms is itself the subject of considerable discussion.

2.4.1 Organization and Aggregativity

Wimsatt (1997) contrasts mechanistic organization with aggregation, a distinction that mechanists have used to articulate how the parts of a mechanism are organized together to form a whole (see Craver 2001b). Aggregate properties are properties of wholes that are simple sums of the properties of their parts. In aggregates, the parts can be rearranged and intersubstituted for one another without changing the property or behavior of the whole, the whole can be taken apart and put back together without disrupting the property or behavior of the whole, and the property of the whole changes only linearly with the addition and removal of parts. These features of aggregates hold because organization is irrelevant to the property of the whole. Wimsatt thus conceives organization as non-aggregativity. He also describes it as a mechanistic form of emergence (see Section 4.2 below).

Mechanistic emergence is ubiquitous—truly aggregative properties are rare. Thus mechanists have tended to recognize a spectrum of organization, with aggregates at one end and highly organized mechanisms on the other. Indeed, many mechanisms studied by biologists involve parts and causings all across this spectrum. (For further discussion of mechanistic emergence in relationship to other varieties, see Richardson and Stephan 2007.)

2.4.2 Varieties of Organization

Following Wimsatt, mechanists have detailed several kinds of organization characteristic of mechanisms. A canonical list includes both spatial and temporal organization. Spatial organization includes location, size, shape, position, and orientation; temporal organization includes the order, rate, and duration of the component activities. More recently, mechanists have emphasized organizational patterns in mechanisms as a whole. Bechtel, for example, discusses how mathematical models, and dynamical models in particular, are used to reveal complex temporal organization in interactive mechanisms (Bechtel 2006, 2011, 2013b). Some argue that dynamical models push beyond the limits of the mechanistic framework (e.g., Chemero and Silbestein 2008 and, at times, Bechtel himself; see Kaplan and Bechtel 2011). Others argue that dynamical models are, in fact, often merely descriptive (i.e., non-explanatory models) or, alternatively, that they are used to describe the temporal organization of mechanisms (Kaplan and Bechtel 2011; Kaplan 2012).

Mechanists have also recently borrowed from Alon's (2006; Milo et al. 2002) work on network motifs, repeated patterns in causal networks, to expand the vocabulary for thinking about abstract patterns of organization (Levy 2014; Levy and Bechtel 2012). Understanding how parts compose wholes is likely to be a growth area in the future of the mechanistic framework. (For some other recent additions, see Kuorikoski and Ylikoski 2013; Kuhlmann 2011; Glennan forthcoming.)

2.4.3 Modularity

Woodward's (2001, 2002, 2011, 2014) counterfactual definition of a mechanism (which is indirectly specified via an account of mechanistic models), as well as a descendant elaborated by Menzies (2012), require that models of mechanisms be modular. This means, roughly, that it should be physically possible to intervene on a putative cause variable in a mechanism without disrupting the functional relationships among the other variables in the mechanism. In terms of structural equation models in particular, this means that one should be able to replace the right-hand side of an equation in the model with a particular value (i.e., set the left-hand variable to a value) without needing to change any of the other equations in the model. This is intended to formally capture the sense in which mechanism is composed of separable, interacting parts. For arguments in favor of a modularity condition on mechanistic models see Menzies (2012).

Steel (2008) appeals to a somewhat weaker form of modularity in his probabilistic analysis of mechanisms—one that follows directly from Simon's (1996 [1962]) idea of nearly decomposable systems. On Simon's view, the parts of a mechanism have more and stronger causal relations with other components in the mechanism than they do with items outside the mechanism. This gives mechanisms (and parts of mechanisms) a kind of “independence” or “objecthood” defined ultimately in terms of the intensity of interaction among components. Grush (2003), following Haugeland (1998), develops an idea of modularity in terms of the bandwidth of interaction, where modules are high-bandwidth in their internal interactions and low-bandwidth in their external interactions. On this view, modularity is not an all-or-none proposition but a matter of degree; mechanisms are only nearly decomposable. Craver (2007) argues that such a generic notion fails to account for the relevance of different causal interactions for different mechanistic decompositions; what counts as a part of a mechanism can only be defined relative to some prior decision about what one takes the mechanism to be doing. For criticisms of modularity, see Mitchell (2005) and Cartwright (2001, 2002).

2.4.4 Jointness

Fagan (2012, 2013) emphasizes the interdependent relationship between parts of a mechanism. Components in a mechanism, she points out, often form a more complex unit by virtue of the individual properties that unite them—their “meshing properties”; the complex unit then figures into the mechanism's behavior. This interdependent relationship—jointness—is exemplified by the lock-and-key model of enzyme action. Fagan applies this notion to research on stem cells (Fagan 2013) but argues that it is a general feature of experimental biology (Fagan 2012).

2.4.5 Levels

Many mechanists emphasize the hierarchical organization of mechanisms and the multilevel structure of theories in the special sciences (see especially Craver 2007, Ch. 5). Antecedents of the new mechanism focused almost exclusively on etiological, causal relations. However, the new emphasis on mechanisms in biology and the special sciences demanded an analysis of mechanistic relations across levels of organization.

From a mechanistic perspective, levels are not monolithic divides in the furniture of the universe (as represented by Oppenheim and Putnam 1958), nor are they fundamentally a matter of size or the exclusivity of causal interactions within a level (Wimsatt 1976). Rather, levels of mechanisms are defined locally within a multilevel mechanism: one item is at a lower level of mechanisms than another when the first item is a part of the second and when the first item is organized (spatially, temporally, and actively) with the other components such that together they realize the second item. Thus, the mechanism of spatial memory has multiple levels, some of which include organs such as the hippocampus generating a spatial map, some of which involve the cellular interactions that underlie map generation, and some of which involve the molecular mechanisms that underlie those cellular interactions (Craver 2007). For more on levels, see Section 4.2 below.

2.4.6 Stable and Ephemeral Mechanisms

Finally, mechanists have found it necessary to distinguish between stable mechanisms, which rely fundamentally upon the more or less fixed arrangement of parts and activities, and ephemeral mechanisms, which involve a process evolving through time without fixed spatial and temporal arrangement (Glennan 2009). The time-keeping mechanism in a clock, for example, is a relatively stable assemblage of components in relatively fixed locations that work the same way, with the same organizational features, each time it works. Ephemeral mechanisms, in contrast, involve a much looser kind of organization: items still interact in space and time, but they do not do so in virtue of robust, stable structures. Many chemical mechanisms in a cell are like that (Richardson and Stephan 2007). Ephemeral mechanisms are surely a primary focus of historical sciences, such as archaeology, history, and evolutionary biology (Glennan 2009).

2.5 What Mechanisms Are Not and What Are Not Mechanisms

The term “mechanism” has been used in many different ways to express many different ideas. The new mechanists’ appropriation of the term is thus likely to cause unhelpful associations, and their liberalization of the term is likely to raise worries that the notion of mechanism has thereby been trivialized (see, e.g., Moss 2012 and Nicholson 2012). Here, we first distinguish the new mechanism from other doctrines with which it shares both name and family resemblance. We then discuss some things to which the new use of the term “mechanism” does not apply.

2.5.1 What Mechanisms Are Not

New mechanists have explicitly eschewed the following associations with the term “mechanism”:

  1. Mechanisms are not necessarily deterministic. Mechanisms might be stochastic if, for example, they are composed of stochastic activities (Bogen 2005, 2008a), or, in a more mundane sense (i.e., one consistent with determinism), because it is always possible for one or more factors to interfere with the working of a mechanism; one of the parts might be broken, or an unexpected preventer might interfere with the operation of a mechanism. The truth or falsity of determinism, and its relevance to understanding the special sciences, is an independent issue from the question of whether something is a mechanism.
  2. Appeal to mechanisms is not necessarily reductionistic. Mechanisms are often described as multi-level, with activities at different levels being equally essential to how a mechanism works. Mechanistic explanations might look, up, down, or around depending on the choice of an explanandum and the presuppositions of the explanatory context (Bechtel 2009a). Mechanists might be reductionists or anti-reductionists. That said, many mechanists opt for some form of explanatory anti-reductionism, emphasizing the importance of multilevel and upward-looking explanations, without rejecting the central ideas that motivate a broadly physicalist world-picture (e.g., McCauley and Bechtel 2001; Craver 2007). (For further discussion, see Theurer 2013; see also Sections 3.1 and 5 and the entry on reductionism in biology.)
  3. Not all mechanisms are machines. Machines are human-made contrivances with each part added and organized by a designer to perform a function; biological and social mechanisms, in contrast, are products of evolution, broadly construed (Darden 2006), and so display ornate forms of organization in comparison with contrivances. One machine might contain multiple mechanisms (a car, for example, has mechanisms for braking, propulsion, playing music and climate control). Machines are also capable of being both active and passive (a stopped clock is still a machine); mechanisms, in contrast, have a productive aspect and are always doing something.
  4. Mechanisms are not necessarily sequential or linear. Mechanisms can have feedback loops and cycles wherein the output of the mechanism or components in turn influences the input of the mechanism or components in a subsequent iteration (Bechtel 2011). Also, the interactions among components in a mechanism need not be describable by a linear equation.
  5. Mechanisms are not necessarily localizable (Bechtel and Richardson 2010 [1993]). Components of mechanisms might be widely distributed (as are many brain mechanisms) and might violate our intuitive or tutored sense of the boundaries of objects (as an action potential violates the cell boundary). The assumption of localization is often an important heuristic in the search for mechanisms; however, this heuristic often must be abandoned as the mechanism's organization reveals itself.
  6. Mechanisms are not limited to push-pull dynamics. Descartes’ mechanism had this feature, but (as noted above) the new mechanism explicitly liberalizes the notion to account for other kinds of causing.
  7. Mechanisms are not just fictions/metaphors. When a scientist says that there is a mechanism that makes proteins in living organisms, she is not just using a machine metaphor; rather, she is saying that there are in fact parts and activities organized in living organisms such that they produce proteins.

2.5.2 What Are Not Mechanisms

One might object that there's nothing left of mechanism once it sheds these historical associations. One might suspect that it has been trivialized (Dupré 2013).

The idea of mechanism is a central part of the explanatory ideal of understanding the world by learning its causal structure. The history of science contains many other conceptions of scientific explanation and understanding that are at odds with this commitment. Some have held that the world should be understood in terms of divine motives. Some have held that natural phenomena should be understood teleologically. Others have been convinced that understanding the natural world is nothing more than being able to predict its behavior. Commitment to mechanism as a framework concept is commitment to something distinct from and, for many, exclusive of, these alternative conceptions. If this appears trivial, rather than a central achievement in the history of science, it is because the mechanistic perspective now so thoroughly dominates our scientific worldview.

Yet there are many ways of organizing phenomena besides revealing mechanisms. Some scientists are concerned with physical structures and their spatial relations without regard to how they work: an anatomist might be interested in the spatial organization of parts within the body with minimal interest in how those parts articulate together to do something. Many scientists build predictive models of systems without any pretense that these models in fact reveal the causal structures by which the systems work. Some scientists are concerned with taxonomy, sorting like with like without regard to how the sorted items came about or how they work. Finally, in many areas of science, there is a widely recognized and practically significant distinction between knowing that C (e.g., smoking) is a cause of E (lung cancer) and knowing how C causes E. This is not so much an ontological difference as it is a difference in the grain with which one seeks to understand a system's causal structure. In short, there are many framework concepts in science, and not all of them can be assimilated to mechanisms.

But what, the critic might push further, does not count as a mechanism? Here are some contrast classes:

  1. Entities (or objects) are not mechanisms. Mechanisms do things. If an object is not doing anything (i.e., if there is no phenomenon), then it is not a mechanism.
  2. Correlations are not mechanisms. Mechanisms explain at least many correlations, and many correlations can be used to characterize causal or mechanistic relations, but correlations themselves are not mechanistic. The same can be said of mere temporal sequences of events.
  3. Inferences, reasons, and arguments are not mechanisms. Though there are mechanisms of inference and reasoning, what makes something an inference or a reason is logical relation and not (merely) a causal relationship between premise and conclusion.
  4. Symmetries are not mechanisms. Many kind of symmetry are of fundamental importance in different areas of physics (e.g., translational symmetries, rotational symmetries). These are features of physical systems that are highly general facts or assumptions, not mechanisms.
  5. Fundamental laws and fundamental causal relations are not mechanisms. If a law or causal relation is fundamental, then (by definition) there is no mechanism for it.
  6. Relations of logical and mathematical necessity are not mechanisms. Such truths hold in all possible worlds and so do not depend for their truth on facts about the causal structure of this world.

This is not an exhaustive list of non-mechanisms or non-mechanistic framework concepts. Yet it demonstrates that even the liberalized concept of mechanism is neither vacuous nor trivial.

2.6 Philosophical Work to Be Done

Much of the early new mechanical philosophy has focused on the special sciences, such as neuroscience and molecular biology. In the years since, philosophers have extended the mechanistic framework to other scientific disciplines, such as cell biology (Bechtel 2006), cognitive science (Bechtel 2008; Thagard 2006), neuroeconomics (Craver and Alexandrova 2008), organic chemistry (Ramsey 2008), physics (Teller 2010), astrophysics (Illari and Williamson 2012), behavior genetics (Tabery 2014a), and phylogenetics (Matthews forthcoming). Philosophers continue to test the limits of this framework, with the expectation that alternative organizing frameworks might play central roles in other sciences. For example, a debate has emerged in the philosophy of biology over whether or not natural selection is a mechanism (see, for example, Skipper and Millstein 2005; Baker 2005; Barros 2008; Illari and Williamson 2012; Havstad 2011; and Matthewson and Calcott 2011). Similar debates have emerged concerning mechanistic explanation in cognitive science (Bechtel 2008; Piccinini and Craver 2011; Weiskopf 2011; Povich forthcoming).

One area that has received particular attention is the effort to understand computational mechanisms. On some accounts, computational mechanisms form a proper subclass of mechanisms that can be defined explicitly in terms of the kinds of entities, properties, and activities involved in mechanisms in that class (Piccinini 2007; Milkowski 2013). According to this view, computational mechanisms are mechanisms that have the function to manipulate medium independent vehicles in accordance with a general rule that applies to all vehicles and depends on the inputs for its application (Piccinini and Scarantino 2011). Digital computers are distinctive in that their vehicles are digits (Piccinini 2007). Proponents of this account hope to demarcate computing mechanisms from non-computing mechanisms by appeal to the distinctive components proprietary to computing mechanisms. This view contrasts both with a semantic view, according to which computation is essentially a matter of manipulating symbols or representations, and with perspectivalist views, according to which whether a mechanism counts as computing is a matter of whether it is so described (Churchland 1986; Churchland and Sejnowski 1992; Shagrir 2010).

Philosophers of the social sciences have also emphasized and debated the importance of mechanistic knowledge (e.g., Elster 1989; for a useful review of these connections, see Hedström and Ylikoski 2010). In that context, appeals to mechanisms are intended to remedy the relative uninformativeness of social (or macro-level) explanations of social phenomena (such as widespread norms, persistent inequalities, network and institutional structures) by insisting that these explanations ultimately be grounded in mechanistic details about individual agents and actors, their desires and motivations, and, importantly, their relations to one another. The emphasis on relations among actors distances this mechanistic view from methodological individualism (see the entry on methodological individualism). Mechanists in the social sciences have also tended to shy away from grand, overarching theories and toward more local explanations: scientific knowledge grows by adding items to a toolbox of mechanisms and showing how items from that toolbox can be combined to provide an explanation for a particular phenomenon. Frederica Russo (2009) discusses a number of strategies for modeling social mechanisms (see also Little 1991, 1998; Hedström 2005; Hedström and Swedberg 1998).

3. Explanation: From Formal Analyses to Material Structures

The covering-law model of explanation was a centerpiece of the logical empiricist conception of science. According to that model, explanations are arguments showing that the event to be explained (the explanandum event) was to have been expected on the basis of laws of nature and the antecedent and boundary conditions (the explanans). For advocates of the covering-law model, the philosophical problem of explanation is thus largely a matter of analyzing the formal structure of explanatory arguments (Hempel and Oppenheim 1948; Hempel 1965). A rainbow, for example, is explained under the covering-law model by reference to laws of reflection and refraction alongside conditions concerning the position of the sun and the nature of light, the position of the raindrops, and the position of the person seeing the rainbow. The description of the rainbow is the conclusion of a deductive argument with law statements and descriptions of conditions as premises, and so the rainbow was to be expected in light of knowledge of the laws and conditions.

Mechanists, in contrast, insist explanation is a matter of elucidating the causal structures that produce, underlie, or maintain the phenomenon of interest. For mechanists, the philosophical problem is largely about characterizing or describing the worldly or ontic structures to which explanatory models (including arguments) must refer if they are to count as genuinely explanatory. A rainbow, for the mechanist, is explained by situating that phenomenon in the causal structure of the world; the explanation is an account of how the phenomenon was produced by entities (like rain drops and eyeballs) with particular properties (like shapes and refractive indices) that causally interact with light propagating from the sun. Mechanists typically distinguish several ways of situating a phenomenon within the causal structure of the world.

3.1 Etiological and Constitutive Explanations

Most mechanists recognize two main aspects of mechanistic explanation: etiological and constitutive. Salmon (1984) describes them as two different ways of situating an explanandum phenomenon in the causal nexus (see also Craver 2001b; Glennan 2009). Etiological explanations reveal the causal history of the explanandum phenomenon, as when one says a virus explains a disease. Constitutive explanations, in contrast, explain a phenomenon by describing the mechanism that underlies it, as when one says brain regions, muscles, and joints explain reaching.

Philosophical arguments against the covering law model often focused on its inability to deal with causal, etiological explanations. The model failed to deliver the right verdict on a variety of problem cases precisely because it attempted to provide an account of explanation without any explicit mention of causation (Bromberger 1966; Salmon 1984; Scriven 1959)

New mechanists extend these kinds of criticism to the covering law model of intertheoretic, micro-reduction. According to the covering law model of reductive explanation, a theory about parts reduces, and so explains, a theory about wholes when it is possible to derive the second from the first given bridge laws to connect the two (see Nagel 1961; Schaffner 1993).

Some mechanists argue that the covering law model of constitutive explanation has problems analogous to those that beset the covering-law model of etiological explanations. Action potentials cannot be explained by mere temporal sequences of events utterly irrelevant to the phenomenon, but one can derive a description of the action potential from descriptions of such irrelevant phenomena. Action potentials cannot be explained by mere patterns of correlation that are not indicative of an underlying causal relation. Irrelevant byproducts of a mechanism might be correlated with the behavior of the mechanism, even perfectly correlated such that one could form bridge laws between levels, but would not thereby explain the relationship. Merely finding a neural correlate of consciousness, for example, would not, and is not taken by anyone to, constitute an explanation of consciousness. So mechanists argue that micro-reductive explanations must satisfy causal constraints just as surely as etiological explanations must (Craver 2007).

The covering law model also fails to distinguish models that merely re-describe the phenomenon in general terms from explanations that, in addition to predicting aspects of the phenomenon, reveal the mechanisms that produce it (Craver 2006; Kaplan and Craver 2011; but see Weiskopf 2011). For example, Snell's law allows one to predict how light bends when passing from one medium to another, but it does not explain why the light bends. New mechanists also argue that the covering law model fails to distinguish predictively adequate but fictional models from explanatory models. Finally, mechanists argue that the intertheoretic model of reduction fails to capture an important dimension of explanatory quality: depth. An implication of the covering law model is that any true law statements that allow one to derive the explanandum law (with suitable corrections and assumptions) will count as a complete explanation. Yet it seems one can deepen an explanation by opening black boxes and revealing how things work down to whatever level one takes as relatively fundamental for the purposes at hand. Such criticisms suggest that the covering-law model of constitutive explanation is too weak to capture the norms of explanation in the special sciences.

Other mechanists have argued that the covering law model is too strong. Philosophers of biology have long argued that there are no laws of the sort the logical empiricist described in biology and other special sciences (Beatty 1995; Mitchell 1997, 2000; Woodward 2001). One might conclude from this that there are no explanations in biology (Rosenberg 1985), but such a radical conclusion is difficult to square with obvious advances in understanding, e.g., protein synthesis, action potentials, cell signaling, and a host of other biological phenomena. In such cases, one finds that scientists appeal to mechanisms to do the explanatory work, even in cases where nothing resembling a law appears to be available.

3.2 Constitutive Relevance

With increased attention to constitutive explanation, mechanists realized the need for an account of constitutive relevance, a principal for sorting relevant from irrelevant factors in a mechanism (Craver 2007; Ylikoski 2013). A system (S) exhibiting phenomenon (y) is composed of many different entities (x), with various properties, engaging in myriad activities (f) organized together (see Figure 1 above in Section 2). One central research problem is to say which of these entities, activities, and organizational features contribute to the phenomenon and which do not. In a sense, this is a challenge of defining the boundaries of a mechanism: of saying what is and is not in the mechanism.

Three proposals have been considered. The first, the mutual manipulability account, understands constitutive relevance in terms of the experimental manipulations used to test interlevel relations. According to this account, if it can be shown (i) that the putative components are contained within S, (ii) that some ideal interventions on the putative component (x's f-ing) change the phenomenon (S's y-ing), and (iii) that some ideal interventions on S's y-ing change x's f-ing, that is sufficient to establish that x is a component in the mechanism. The notion of an ideal intervention in this account is explicitly indebted to and a proposed extension of Woodward's theory of causal relevance to the constitutive domain (see Craver 2007; see also Kaplan 2012). A concern with the mutual manipulability account, though, is that it is best an epistemic guide to constitutive relevance, not an account of what constitutive relevance is (Couch 2011). The account offers, at best, a sufficient condition of relevance. Also, the notion of an “ideal” intervention, borrowed from Woodward's account of causal relevance, cannot be applied straightforwardly to constitutive explanations. An ideal intervention on a system cannot intervene on both the independent and the dependent variable at the same time. However, when one intervenes to make S y (or prevent S from y-ing), one invariably also intervenes on the components of S's y-ing. And when one intervenes on the components of S's y-ing, one often intervenes on S's y-ing. Because x's f-ing and S's y-ing are related as part to whole, they are not independent, and so require another way to think about ideal interventions (see Baumgartner 2010; 2013; Leuridan 2011; yet see Menzies 2012; Woodward 2014.

A second proposal offers a regularity account of constitutive relevance modeled on Mackie's notion of understanding a cause as an INUS condition: an Insufficient but Non-redundant part of an Unnecessary but Sufficient condition for the effect in question (Mackie 1974; see also Cummins 1983). On this account, a constitutively relevant component is an insufficient but non-redundant part of an unnecessary but sufficient mechanism for a given phenomenon (Couch 2011; see also Harbecke 2010, 2014). Allow that any number of mechanisms might suffice to bring about S's y-ing; each possible sufficient mechanism is then unnecessary for y-ing. Each of these mechanisms is made of components, none of which is alone sufficient to produce the behavior of the mechanism as a whole, but each of which is necessary in the context of the mechanism for S to y. This account presupposes the idea of being necessary in context, and one might reasonably worry about sorting accidentally correlated Xs from Xs that in fact make a difference to S's y-ing.

A third approach to constitutive relevance dispenses with the interlevel framing enforced by the mutual manipulability account and attempts to analyze relevance using causal notions only. According to accounts of this sort, constitutive relevance is a kind of causal between-ness. If S's y-ing is understood as an input-output relationship of some sort, then mechanistic relevance could be understood as being a necessary link in the causal chain between the input and the output (see Harinen forthcoming; Menzies 2012). The putatively interlevel experiments in the mutual manipulability account can then be recast as different kinds of unilevel causal experiments. Romero (forthcoming) provides a helpful framing of these issues and offers the novel suggestion that putatively high-level interventions are in fact fat-handed interventions relative to their lower-level counterparts.

3.3 Mechanisms and Models

The philosophical literature on mechanisms also overlaps with the philosophical literature on scientific models (see the entry on models in science). Here we distinguish mechanical models from models of mechanisms and we discuss varieties of non-mechanical models.

3.3.1 Characterizing Completeness

Glennan (2005) proposed a definition of a mechanical model as follows:

(MM) A mechanical model consists of (i) a description of the mechanism's behavior (the behavioral description); and (ii) a description of the mechanism that accounts for that behavior (the mechanical description). (446)

Such models can be represented in many different ways (see also Giere 2004). They are evaluated in terms of their ability to predict the features of the phenomenon and in terms of the mapping between items in the model and the entities, activities, and organizational features in the mechanism (Glennan 2005: 17; Kaplan and Craver 2011). Glennan emphasizes that there is no hard line between complete and incomplete models; rather models are continually in the process of articulation and refinement. Whether a model is complete enough is determined by pragmatic considerations.

This last point is related to Darden's distinction between mechanism schemas and mechanism sketches (Darden and Cain 1989; Darden 2002). In discovering a mechanism, it is often crucial to identify gaps that have to be filled in one's model. While no model is ever complete in the absolute sense, some models have lacunae that must be filled before the model is complete enough

Mechanism schemas are abstract descriptions of mechanisms that can be filled in with details to yield a specific type or token mechanism. Thus, the schema:

DNA → RNA → Protein

can be filled in with a specific sequence of bases in DNA, its complement in RNA, and a corresponding amino acid sequence in the protein. The arrows can be filled in, showing how transcription and translation work. A mechanism sketch is an incomplete representation of a mechanism that specifies some of the relevant entities, activities, and organizational features but leaves gaps that cannot yet be filled. Black boxes, question marks, and filler-terms (such as “activate”, “cause”, or “inhibitor”) hold the place for some entity, activity or process yet to be discovered. The distinction between sketches and schemas is a matter of completeness: schemas are more complete than sketches in the sense that a sketch omits one or more stages of the mechanism that have to be understood if one really wants to solve one's discovery problem.

Mechanists also emphasize the distinction between a how-possibly schema and a how-actually-enough schema (Craver and Darden 2013). A how-possibly schema describes how entities and activities might be organized to produce a phenomenon. A how possibly model is n hypothesis about how the mechanism works. Such models might be true (enough) or false. A true (enough) how-possibly model is (though we may not know it) also a how-actually (enough) model. A how-actually-enough schema describes how entities and activities are in fact organized to produce the phenomenon. The term “how-actually-enough” captures the idea that the requisite “accuracy” of a mechanistic model can vary considerably from one pragmatic context to another (Weisberg 2013).A false how possibly model is merely a how possibly model; just-so-stories are merely how possibly models (Dray 1957; Brandon 1985). Used in this way, the term “how possibly model” is similar to the term “hypothesis”: it is entertained as a possibility but not necessarily endorsed.

3.3.2 Abstraction and Idealization

In contrast to mechanism schemas and sketches, some models of mechanisms work not by describing all of the parts, causal interactions, and organizational features, but rather by abstracting away from such potentially obfuscating details (Craver and Darden 2013; Strevens 2008; Levy and Bechtel 2012). In such cases, idealizing assumptions can be introduced to bring the relevant feature of the mechanism most clearly into view: infinite populations, frictionless planes, perfect geometrical shapes are presumed in order to strip the model of detail that does not matter for, or would only obstruct, the intended purposes of model.

Critics of the new mechanical philosophy have pushed on the importance of abstraction in science, drawing attention to the above discussions of completeness. The goals of completeness and accuracy are taken to conflict with the common practice of being satisfied with models that sacrifice detail and truth for clarity and generality (Strevens 2008; Woodward 2014). The normative distinction between a schema and a sketch, for example, seems to suggest that science progresses by moving from incomplete to complete models. And the distinction between how-possibly and how-actually-enough likewise seems to privilege accuracy over other goals of modeling, which often require distortion and falsity (see Wimsatt 2007; Weisberg 2007; Levy and Bechtel 2012; Batterman and Rice 2014; Chirimuuta 2014; Levy 2014).

Yet mechanists can surely allow that not all models of mechanisms are mechanical models or mechanism schemas. Often other sorts of model are useful for isolating central aspects of a mechanism's functioning. Dynamical models, for example, can be used to characterize the temporal dynamics of a mechanism (Bechtel 2013a,b; Kaplan and Bechtel 2011). Network models can be used to characterize patterns of connectivity regardless of what units are connected and regardless of what kinds of connections one is particularly interested in characterizing (Hunneman 2010). Minimal models can be used to capture something fundamental about the dynamics of a broad class of mechanisms that share no entities and activities in common (Batterman 2002). A model of a mechanism is a model that describes a mechanism. It need not be a mechanical model or a mechanism schema, in the above sense, to play that role.

Some mechanists reserve the term “mechanical models” for models that describe the entities, activities, and organizational features of a system. According to Glennan's (2005) account, a mechanical model that leaves out some relevant features is, ipso facto, incomplete and sketchy. One specific instantiation of this debate concerns the explanatory force of functional models in psychology. Piccinini and Craver (2011) argue that such models should be understood as mechanistic sketches, black-box models to be evaluated and filled in as details about the underlying mechanism are discovered. Black box models are incomplete in virtue of leaving out details about underling mechanisms and that those models ultimately depend for their explanatory force on the promise that the functional models do, in fact, correspond to how the mechanism works. (See Weiskopf 2011 for a criticism of this account and Povich forthcoming for a response)

One might talk about mechanistic explanation in a way that abstracts from the kind of model used to describe the mechanism: the commitment to mechanistic explanation is not a commitment about the form of the model but rather a commitment about what such models must represent: namely, causal and mechanistic structures. Models are explanatory in virtue of the fact that they represent the causal/mechanistic structures that produce, underlie, or maintain the phenomenon. They are non-mechanistic if they refer to some non-causal, non-mechanistic kind of relation (Salmon 1984; Craver 2014).

3.4 Philosophical Work to Be Done

To date, much of the work on mechanistic explanation has been driven by the goal of providing a descriptively and normatively adequate theory of mechanistic explanation. Some claim there are kinds of explanation that rely very little on a precise understanding of the mechanistic details of a system (Woodward 2014; Weiskopf 2011) or that work fundamentally by removing all such details from one's model (Batterman and Rice 2014). Resolving such debates will require being very clear about precisely what one expects out of a philosophical theory of scientific explanation and what one takes a scientific explanation to be (Strevens 2008; Craver 2014). Research is required to understand the diverse representational forms that scientists use to represent mechanisms (Burnston et al. forthcoming), and to understand the role of idealization in mechanistic explanation (Levy and Bechtel 2012; Huneman 2010). Further work is also required to limn the boundaries between mechanistic explanation and other putative varieties of explanation and to say, as perspicuously as Hempel or the causal-mechanical theory, what a model must do to count as explanatory and precisely how good explanations are to be distinguished from bad.

4. Metaphysics of Mechanisms

In this section, we review some of the ways that the concept of mechanism has been used in diverse areas of metaphysics. Of all the areas we have discussed, this is likely the most in need of future development. Here we discuss the relationship between mechanisms and laws, emergence, realization, natural kinds, and functions.

4.1 Token Mechanisms, Type Mechanisms, and Laws

In much of the early literature on mechanisms, mechanisms are contrasted explicitly with laws of nature (Bechtel 1988; Bechtel and Abrahamsen 2005; MDC 2000). This contrast clearly grew out of an emerging consensus in philosophy that there are few, or perhaps no, laws of biology (see Section 3.1 above). The empirical generalizations one finds in biology tend to be hedged by ceteris paribus clauses; whether they hold or not depends on background conditions that might not hold and on conditions internal to the mechanism that might fail. These generalizations, in short, are mechanistically explicable; what necessity they have derives from a mechanism (Cummins 2000; Glennan 1996). Mechanisms thus seem to play the role of laws in the biological sciences: we seek mechanisms to explain, predict, and control phenomena in nature even if mechanisms lack many of the characteristics definitive of laws in the logical empiricist framework (such as universality, inviolable necessity, or unrestricted scope).

One specific strand of this discussion emerged from consideration of Weber's (2005) argument that biology is heteronymous, i.e., that it ultimately borrows its explanatory power from the laws of physics and chemistry. Weber uses Hodgkin and Huxley's model of the action potential as an exemplar of the reducing biological phenomena to physical laws (such as Ohm's law and the Nernst equation). Craver (2006) responds that the explanatory force of Hodgkin and Huxley's model, in fact, requires a grasp of the distinctly biological properties of ion channels, which properties were black-boxed in Hodgkin and Huxley's total current equation (see also Craver 2007; Bogen 2008b; Weber 2008).

Yet the contrast between laws and mechanisms has not always been entirely clear. Some, such as Bogen (2005), Machamer (2004), and Glennan (forthcoming) emphasize that causes and mechanisms are, at base, singular, not general or universal. Leuridan (2010), building on the work of Mitchell (2000), objects that mechanisms cannot replace laws of nature in our conceptual understanding of explanation and the metaphysics of science. Scientists rarely investigate token mechanisms, one might think, but are much more interested in types. And once one starts talking about types of mechanisms, one is back in the business of formulating general regularities about how mechanisms work. So it would appear that the concept of mechanism cannot supplant the work that generalization was supposed to do, but requires the idea of regularity, and so something akin to laws, if it is to do that explanatory work (see Andersen 2011, 2012, 2014a,b; Krickel 2014). For a reply to Leuridan, see Kaiser and Craver (2013).

4.2 Mechanisms, Levels, and Emergence

Work on mechanisms has also helped to clarify the idea of levels of organization and its relation to other forms of organization and non-mechanistic forms of emergence.

Many mechanists, following Simon (1996 [1962]), emphasize that biological systems are hierarchically organized into near-decomposable structures: mechanisms within mechanisms, within mechanism. Using the parable of Tempus and Hora, Simon (1962) argued that a watchmaker who builds hierarchically decomposable watches (Tempus) will make more watches than one who builds holistic watches (Hora). This parable led Simon to the conclusion that evolved structures are more likely to be nearly decomposable into hierarchically organized, more or less stable structures and sub-structures. Some have objected that the story is misleading because evolution does not construct organisms from scratch, piece by piece (Bechtel 2009b). Steel (2008), building on the work of others (Schlosser and Wagner 2004), therefore attempts to reconstruct this argument as a way of showing that evolved systems are more likely to be modular: systems made of independently manipulable parts can quarantine the effects of changes to specific parts, giving them added flexibility to make local changes without causing catastrophic side-effects.

The near decomposability of mechanisms is directly related to the idea that mechanisms span multiple levels of organization. The behavior of the whole is explained in terms of the activities and interactions among the component parts. These activities and interactions are themselves sustained by underlying activities and interactions among component parts, and so on (see Bechtel and Richardson 2010 [1993]). Craver (2007) defines levels of mechanisms in terms of a relationship between the behavior (y) exhibited by a system (S) and the activity (f) of some component part (X) of that system. On this account, X's f-ing is at a lower level of mechanistic organization than S's y-ing if and only if (i) X is a part of S, and (ii) X's f-ing is a component in S's y-ing. In short, to say that something is at a lower mechanistic level than the mechanism as a whole is to say that it is a working part of the mechanism. Though the term “level” is used in many legitimate ways, levels of mechanisms seem to play a central role in structuring the relations among many different models in contemporary biology (e.g., between Mendelian and molecular genetics (Darden 2006), between learning and memory and channel physiology (Craver 2007), and between population-level variation and developmental mechanisms (Tabery 2009, 2014a)).

One implication of this view of levels, combined with certain familiar assumptions about causal relations, is that there can be no causal relationships between items at different levels of mechanisms. There can be causal relationships between things of different sizes, and there can be causal relationships between things described in very different vocabularies; but (again, conjoined with certain assumptions about the temporal asymmetry of cause and effect and the independence of cause and effect) there cannot be causal relationships between the behavior of a mechanism and the activities of the parts that jointly constitute that behavior. Claims about interlevel causation, which are ubiquitous in the scientific literature, are best understood either as targeting a different sense of levels or, concerning levels of mechanisms, as expressing hybrid claims combining constitutive claims about the relationship between the behavior of the mechanism as a whole and the activities of its parts, and causal claims concerning relationships between things not related as part and whole (Craver and Bechtel 2007). For alternative interpretations of levels, see Fehr 2004; Leuridan 2011; Thalos 2013; Eronen 2013; 2015; Baumgartner and Gebhardter forthcoming; Romero forthcoming. For reflections on the metaphysical status of higher-level phenomena and higher-level causes, see Baumgartner 2010; Glennan 2010 a, b; Hoffman-Kolss 2014, as well as the entries on causation and manipulability, physicalism, and scientific reduction.

As noted above, the fact that phenomena at higher levels of mechanisms depend upon the organization of component parts entails that the properties/activities of wholes are not simple sums of the properties/activities of the parts. Levels of mechanisms can thus be contrasted with levels of mere aggregation. Because the whole is greater (in this sense) than the sum of the parts, some (such as Wimsatt) have found it appropriate to describe this as a kind of emergence. Mechanistic (or organizational) emergence thus understood is ubiquitous and banal but extremely important for understanding how scientists explain things.

Also familiar is epistemic emergence, the inability to predict the properties or behaviors of wholes from properties and behaviors of the parts. Epistemic emergence can arise as a result of ignorance, such as failing to recognize a relevant variable, or from failing to know how different variables interact in complex networks. It might also result from limitations on human cognitive abilities or in current-generation representational tools (Bedau 1997; Boogerd 2005; Richardson and Stephan 2007). The practical necessity of studying mechanisms by decomposing them into component parts raises the epistemic challenge of putting the parts back together again in a way that actually works (Bechtel 2013a).

The mechanists’ emphasis on mechanistic/organizational and epistemic emergence contrasts with their desire to distance themselves from spooky emergence (Richardson and Stephan 2007). Spooky emergence would involve the appearance of new properties with no sufficient basis in mechanisms. It is not clear that emergent properties are properly said to be properties of the necessary mechanisms; and it is not clear in what since the emergent property is “emergent” rather than a fundamental feature of the causal structure of the world.

In short, such forms of emergence are altogether distinct from, and so gain no plausibility from, verbal association with organizational/mechanistic and epistemic emergence.

4.3 Mechanisms and Realization

Because the framework concept of a mechanism is so useful for thinking about levels and explanation in the sciences, some scholars have sought in the notion of mechanism a way of fleshing out the ontological relationship of realization.

According to the “flat view” (Gillett 2002) realization is a relationship between different properties of one and the same thing (Kim 1998; Shapiro 2000; Shoemaker 2003, 2007; Polger 2007). The subset view, which holds that a property P1 (e.g., mean kinetic energy of the gas) realizes property P2 (e.g., temperature of the gas) when the causal powers distinctive of P2 (temperature) are a subset of the causal powers distinctive of P2 (mean kinetic energy), is an example of the flat view. P1 and P2 are both attributed to the same thing, the gas (Gillett 2002, 2003). The dimensioned view describes realization as a relationship holding between the properties of wholes and the properties of the parts and their organization. This view of realization comports with the explanatory aims of the special sciences and fits nicely with the evidential base on which interlevel claims are grounded (see Aizawa and Gillett 2011). Gillett has since expanded this notion to handle the realization of objects, properties, and processes (Gillett 2013); for criticism and alternatives, see Polger 2010; Melnyk 2003; Melnyk 2010)

4.4 Mechanisms and Natural Kinds

Mechanistic theories of natural kinds develop out of Boyd's homeostatic property cluster (HPC) view. The HPC view is a theory of natural kinds designed to work in domains with high individual variability. The HPC view is offered as a third way between essentialism and nominalism about kinds in the special sciences (Boyd 1991, 1997, 1999; Kornblith 1993; Wilson 1999, 2005; see also the entry on natural kinds).

According to this view, a natural kind is characterized by i) a cluster of properties that regularly co-occur, and ii) a similarity generating mechanism that explains why the properties in (i) tend to co-occur. In short, kinds are property clusters explained by mechanisms.

This view of natural kinds has been deployed to argue for taxonomic revision in, for example, the biology of human emotion (Griffiths 1997), the structure of concepts (Machery 2009), and the taxonomy of psychiatry (Kendler, Zachar, and Craver 2010; see Craver 2009): a putatively single kind is split into multiple kinds because it is discovered that distinct properties in a property cluster are explained by distinct mechanisms. This view of kinds can also be used to make sense of kinds that are historically transient and, in some ways, the product of human attitudes and so socially constructed in this straightforward sense; perhaps race is like this (see Kuorikoski and Pöyhönin 2012; Khalidi 2013).

4.5 Mechanisms and Functions

Emphasis on the importance of mechanisms is historically associated with the rejection of teleology and formal causes (e.g., Westfall 1971). Yet contemporary biology and many other special sciences, despite the widespread acceptance of the mechanism framework concept, continue to make use of the concept of function, a teleological notion (see the entry on teleological notions in biology). How is the notion of function at play in contemporary science related to the concept of mechanism? Craver (2001a), following Cummins (1975), argues that functional description is a perspectival means of situating some part within a higher-level mechanism. According to this view, teleology is not a feature of the world so much as it is imposed upon it by an intentional describer (see also Machamer 1977). Garson (2011, 2012), following Wimsatt (1972b), Wright (1973) and Neander (1991a,b), argues that functions are effects of an item that are part of the etiological explanation (through selection, learning, or reinforcement) for why the item is present; as such, functions are reduced to causal histories. In a third view, Maley and Piccinini (forthcoming) argue that the (teleological) function of an item is its contribution to the goals of organisms, which may be objective or subjective goals. Like Garson, Maley and Piccinini hold that functions are objective (i.e., not observer relative). Unlike Garson, however, they are not grounded in the etiology of the item but in their current contribution to survival or reproduction (the objective goals of organisms) or to what the organism itself desires (the subjective goals of organisms).

4.6 Philosophical Work to Be Done

What must the world be like for this mechanistic perspective to be accurate? Clearly, there are many ways of answering this question from different metaphysical starting assumptions. And clearly, many metaphysical starting assumptions rule this world picture out as illegitimate. The clearest path forward, it would seem, is to work out precisely what one must be committed to in holding that the world is composed of a hierarchy of mechanisms and precisely what of that can be recovered on the basis of different starting assumptions.

That said, not all applications of the mechanism framework require a fully articulated metaphysics. Work on discovery and explanation might proceed perfectly well without embracing any particular metaphysical world picture. Philosophers with different interests (discovery, explanation, testing, reduction, emergence, and so) are likely to elaborate the concept in different ways. There is every reason to doubt, that the idea of mechanism can be given a one-size fits all metaphysical analysis that will adequately address the diverse philosophical ends to which the concept is being deployed.

5. Relations between Scientific Disciplines: From Theory Reduction to Mechanism Integration

5.1 Theory Reduction

According to Nagel (1961), reduction is a species of covering-law explanation: one theory is reduced to another when it is possible to identify the theoretical terms of the first with those of the second and to literally derive the first from the second. On the assumption that scientific disciplines and theories correspond to one another, reduction serves as a model of interdisciplinary integration as well. Mechanist's objections to the covering-law model of constitutive explanation (i.e., micro-reduction) are discussed above (see Section 3.1); here the focus is rather on how distinct disciplines of science are integrated.

On the Nagel view, reduction is an interlevel relationship. It is also a relationship between theories. Theories about phenomena at a higher level (e.g., gases, lightning, and life) are reduced to (i.e., derived from) theories about phenomena at lower levels (e.g., molecules, electrons, and physiological systems). Finally, the relationship is formally specified and has little to do with either the content of the theories or the material structures those theories describe. From the mechanistic perspective, each of these features of the Nagel model is problematic.

5.2 Mechanism Integration

First, mechanists criticize the idea that reduction should be understood primarily as a relationship between theories. In integrating their results, scientists are not simply building theories simpliciter; they are building theories about mechanisms. Mechanisms can perhaps be described using formal accounts of theories—perhaps they can be axiomatized in predicate logic or reconstructed as set theoretic predicates. But such formal accounts of the structures of scientific theories gloss over the mechanistic structures crucial for understanding how these theories are constructed and evaluated (Craver 2001b).

Mechanists also challenge the idea that disciplines are related by way of the relationship between their theories. Darden and Maull (1977) argued that disciplinary fields often integrate their findings through the construction of interfield theories, appealing to diverse material relationships between items in the different fields’ domains: relations such as cause and effect, part and whole, or structure and function. Darden and Maull did not offer a general account of interfield theories, but Bechtel presciently suggested that such theories often take the form of descriptions of mechanisms (Bechtel 1988: 101–102).

The mechanistic approach also has been claimed to have many advantages over reduction for thinking about interlevel forms of interdisciplinary integration. First, it provides a straightforward way to interpret the talk of levels (see Sections 2.4.5 and 4.2). Second, it offers significantly more insight into what interlevel integration is, into the evidential constraints by which interlevel bridges are evaluated, and into the forces driving the co-evolution of work at different levels. Constraints on the parts, their causal interactions, and their spatial, temporal, and hierarchical organization all help to flesh out an interlevel integration. Finally, mechanists repeatedly recognize the need to not only look down to the constitutive mechanisms responsible for a given phenomenon (emphasized by classical reduction models), but also to look up and around to the context within which the phenomenon is embedded: interlevel integration is an effort to see how phenomena at many different levels are related to one another (Bechtel 2009a; Craver 2007).

Mechanists have developed several extended examples of the many forms of mechanism integration pursued in mechanistic research programs. Darden (2005), for example, suggests that philosophers in the grip of classical reduction fundamentally misunderstood the relationship between Mendelian and molecular genetics. While reductionists see it as an instance of interlevel explanation, she argues, it is in fact a case in which different scientists worked on different parts of a mechanism that are etiologically (not constitutively) related to one another. Mendelian genetics did not reduce to molecular biology; rather, classical geneticists and molecular biologists integrated their work by focusing on different working entities in the sequentially operating chromosomal and molecular hereditary mechanisms. Examples have also been drawn from the discovery of the mechanisms of protein synthesis (Darden 2006) and cell biology (Bechtel 2006). Craver (2007) uses examples from the neuroscience of memory to explore how multilevel integration does and ought to proceed. In each case, the search for mechanisms serves as an abstract scaffold onto and around which the findings of diverse scientists converge.

5.2.1 Integrative Pluralism

The mechanistic perspective tends to emphasize integrative pluralism in scientific research (Mitchell 2003, 2009). The goal is not to explain the less fundamental in terms of the more fundamental in a step-wise relating of monolithic theories at one level to monolithic theories at another. Rather, such scientific achievements are collaborative and piecemeal, adding incremental constraints to an emerging picture of how a mechanism works both at a level and across levels. The many scientific disciplines that investigate a phenomenon pluralistically co-exist and co-inform one another by integratively contributing to the etiological, constitutive, and contextual mechanistic explanations of that phenomenon (Bechtel 2009a; Tabery 2014a).

5.3 Philosophical Work to Be Done

The Nagel model of theory reduction offers a clear vision of the “unity of science” (see the entry on unity of science). According to the model, the unity among scientific disciplines is achieved by reducing theories of higher-level disciplines to the theories of lower-level disciplines. Integration, on that vision, is understood as progress toward a grand, unified body of scientific knowledge. For mechanists, in contrast, integration is piecemeal, local, and pluralistic. What sort of unity could such an “integration” sustain? This question plays out in a back-and-forth between Longino and Tabery concerning disciplinary relationships in the behavioral sciences. Tabery argues that disciplines as disparate as neurobiology and quantitative genetics could pluralistically co-exist and co-inform one another's causal explanations of complex behaviors by way of mechanism integration. Longino counters that Tabery's pluralism is only a “moderate” sort because the push for integration ultimately is a push for unification (Longino 2013, 2014; Tabery 2014a,b). Sullivan (2009) also challenges the push for mechanism integration; she argues that there are significant barriers to the kind of integration mechanists envision. Different laboratories use different experimental protocols to study what they assume to be the same phenomenon; however, these different protocols often in fact target different phenomena, so the integration achieved by combining results is only illusory. These discussions are symptomatic of more general philosophical questions faced by mechanists: How are mechanism integrations actually achieved (as opposed to just asserted)? And what is the relationship between mechanism integration and unification? The new mechanical philosophy stands to benefit from future efforts to situate mechanistic integration into more general philosophical views of integration and pluralism.

6. Discovery: From A-ha Moments to Discovery Strategies

6.1 Discovery via A-ha Moments

What can philosophers say about scientific discovery? Many logical empiricists had a simple answer: Nothing. According to Popper, for example, philosophers can illuminate the epistemology of testing, but they can say nothing of substance about how scientists generate the ideas to be tested (Popper 1959). Such “A-ha!” moments of creativity are in the province of psychology, not philosophy. Reichenbach distinguished the context of discovery from the context of justification (the “context distinction”) (Reichenbach 1938; but see the entry on Hans Reichenbach for an alternate interpretation of this distinction). The process of scientific discovery was thus largely off limits to philosophers.

Not all philosophers of science agreed. Hanson, for example, articulated a logic of discovery involving abductive inferences from anomalous data to new hypotheses designed to account for them (Hanson 1958). Others focused on methodologies of discovery that could either allow one to rationally reconstruct why something was discoverable at a given time (Nickels 1985) or to explain why a new hypothesis is considered promising and worthy of further investigation (Schaffner 1993). Early contributions to the new mechanical philosophy followed this path and characterized investigative strategies scientists use to discover mechanisms (see the entry on scientific discovery).

6.2 Discovery via Strategies

Bechtel and Richardson's Discovering Complexity (2010 [1993]) is organized around a flowchart representing choice-points in the discovery of a mechanism. The process of searching for mechanisms begins with a provisional characterization of the phenomenon. Then follow strategies of localizing the mechanism within the system, and decomposing the phenomenon into distinct sub-functions. Localization of function involves determining which of these sub-functions of the system is performed by which parts. Bechtel and Richardson further characterize the use of excitatory and inhibitory experiments to obtain these kinds of information. Bechtel and Abrahamsen (2013) add a subsequent stage, in which scientists recompose what they have learned about the functional parts by putting them back together to produce the phenomenon in question (perhaps using simulations).

Darden also emphasized mechanisms as an important framework concept in scientific discovery (Darden 1980, 1982, 1986, 1991). In the discovery of protein synthesis (jointly investigated by molecular biologists and biochemists in the 1950s and 1960s), scientists didn't simply have an “A-ha” moment. Rather, they deployed strategies for revealing how a mechanism works (Darden 2006; Craver and Darden 2013). Darden characterizes the process of mechanism discovery as an “extended, piecemeal process with hypotheses undergoing iterative refinement”; that process occurs via the construction, evaluation, and revision of mechanism schemas in light of observational and experimental constraints (Darden 2006: 272).

Darden's construction strategies are strategies for generating new hypotheses about a mechanism. In addition to decomposition and localization, Darden shows that scientists often borrow a schema type from another area of science, as when selection-type mechanisms were borrowed to understand how the immune system works, or assemble a mechanism from known modules of functional activity (modular sub-assembly), as is common in biochemistry and molecular biology. Sometimes, scientists know one part of the mechanism and attempt to work forward or backward through to the other parts and activities. In the discovery of the mechanism of protein synthesis, for example, molecular biologists worked forward from the structure of DNA to figure out what molecules could interact with it (forward chaining), and biochemists worked backward from proteins to figure out what chemical reactions would be necessary to create them (backward chaining). They met in the middle at RNA. Protein synthesis is now understood to involve transcribing DNA into RNA and then translating RNA into proteins. Far from being philosophically inscrutable, Darden points out that scientists used what they knew about the working entities and activities in the mechanism to infer what could come next or before in the mechanism of protein synthesis (Darden 2006; see also the entry on molecular biology).

Evaluation strategies, for Darden, involve constraint-based reasoning to limn the contours of the space of possible mechanisms for a given phenomenon. Often scientists reason about how a mechanism works by building off basic findings concerning the spatial and temporal organization of its parts. Harvey, for example, reasoned his way to the circulation of the blood by considering the locations of the valves of the veins and their orientation with respect to the heart. These organizational constraints, and many others, combined to narrow the space of possible mechanisms to a small region containing a model in which the blood completes a circuit of the body (Craver and Darden 2013).

Darden and Craver also discuss experimental strategies for learning how a mechanism works. These strategies reveal how different entities and activities in a mechanism act, interact, and are organized together. For example, one might intervene to remove a putative component to see if and how the mechanism functions in its absence (inhibitory experiments). Or one might stimulate that component to see if it can drive the mechanism or modulate its behavior. Or one might activate a mechanism by placing it in the precipitating conditions for the phenomenon and observe how the entity or activity changes as the mechanism works. Craver (2002) discusses these under the heading of “interlevel experiments” (see also Harinen forthcoming). Craver and Darden (2013) also discuss more complex kinds of experiments for learning what sort of entity or activity contributes to a process and for learning more complex features of a mechanism's organization.

Datteri (2009; Datteri and Tamburrini 2007), explores the use of robotic simulations for the purposes of testing mechanisms. They discuss both how assumptions are built into robotic models and how experiments can be designed to reveal how mechanisms work. This work extends the mechanistic framework into the area of bio-robotics and reveals a set of strategies distinct from those explored in Darden's work.

Rather than focusing on the process by which mechanism schemas are constructed, evaluated, and revised, Steele focuses on the question of how one extrapolates from a sample population or a model organism to the structure of a mechanism in the target. Will a treatment proven to suppress tumors in mice (a model organism) also suppress tumors in humans (the target population)? After developing a probabilistic account of mechanisms, Steele considers how researchers get around what he calls the extrapolator's circle: determining

how we could know that the model and the target are similar in causally relevant respects without already knowing the causal relationship in the target. (Steel 2008: 78)

Steel breaks the extrapolator's circle by developing a mechanisms-based extrapolation strategy—the strategy of comparative process tracing. Once a mechanism for some phenomenon has been elucidated in a model (such as a particular process of carcinogenesis in rats), scientists (toxicologists in this case) then compare key stages (particularly downstream stages) of the model with the stages in the target, paying particular attention to points in the process where differences are most likely to arise. The greater the similarities of the entities, activities, and organization of the mechanisms in both populations, the stronger is the basis for extrapolation; the greater the differences, the weaker the basis (but see Howick et al. 2013; see also the sections on extrapolation in the entries on molecular biology and experiment in biology).

6.3 Mechanistic Evidence in Medical Discoveries

Discovery in medicine is another domain where the mechanical philosophy has been applied. Thagard draws on the case of H. pylori as a cause of ulcers to provide an account of how investigating mechanisms contributes to scientific discovery.

Thagard draws attention to both statistical evidence that suggests ulcers are somehow associated with H. pylori, as well as mechanistic evidence that can explain how the agent of infection could persist in a hostile environment long enough to cause an ulcer. More recently, philosophers interested in evidence-based medicine have probed the relationship between these two types of evidence in the health sciences. Russo and Williamson argue that both types of evidence are necessary to justify causal inference; the correlational evidence establishes that there is a difference-making relation between some cause and some effect, while the mechanistic evidence establishes how exactly the cause produces its effect—the “Russo-Williamson Thesis” (Russo and Williamson 2007). Philosophers have since refined the Russo-Williamson Thesis, pointing out, for instance, that “type of evidence” could refer to different methodologies for gathering evidence or to different objects of evidence. Difference-making methodologies include observational studies and randomized controlled trials, while mechanistic methodologies include interventionist experiments such as those described above; likewise, the object of evidence could be the evidence of an associated difference or it could be the evidence concerning the mechanism linking the cause and effect (Illari 2011; see also Campaner 2011). Evidence-based medicine hierarchies, which rank different kinds of evidence in terms of its epistemic strength, tend to prioritize evidence from difference-making methodologies (such as randomized controlled trials and meta-analyses) over mechanistic evidence; in reply, these philosophers argue that the different types of evidence are on a par (each with its own strengths and weaknesses) and advocate for integrating difference-making and mechanistic evidence, a sentiment which aligns with the emphasis on mechanism integration discussed in Section 5.2 above (Clarke et al. 2013, 2014).

6.4 Philosophical Work to Be Done

Many mechanists have explored the strategies that scientists use in discovery. Bechtel and Richardson attended to decomposition and localization; Darden and Craver highlighted forward and backward chaining; Russo and Williamson emphasized drawing on both difference-making and mechanistic evidence. These strategies were found in specific, experimental sciences, such as neuroscience and molecular biology. So one task for philosophers moving forward is to assess whether or not similar strategies exist in other sciences, especially those that operate outside the traditional laboratory, both in the human sciences (such as sociology and economics) and in the physical sciences (such as cosmology).

We also expect tremendous development to come from bridging the gap between the qualitative accounts of mechanisms and mechanistic explanation developed in the new mechanism and quantitative theories of discovery from the discipline of machine learning and causal modeling (Spirtes et al. 2000; Pearl 2009). The latter offer tools to mine correlational data for causal dependencies. Such tools might escape more qualitative, historical approaches and might, in fact, go beyond the common strategies that scientists traditionally use. Such tools also offer a means to assess discovery strategies by exploring the conditions under which they succeed and fail and the efficiency with which they deliver verdicts on causal hypotheses.

7. Conclusion

The new mechanical philosophy and, more generally, attention to the framework concept of “mechanism” has expanded rapidly over the last two decades bringing with it new orientations toward a wide range of issues in the philosophy of science. Yet it is clear that many of the major topics are only beginning to develop, leaving a lot of work for scholars to elaborate the basic commitments of this framework and to consider what it means to do science outside of that framework. The near future is likely to see continued discussion of the implications and limits of this framework for thinking about science and scientific practice.


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We are grateful to the following individuals for very helpful feedback on earlier drafts of this entry: Lindley Darden, Melinda Fagan, Stuart Glennan, Phyllis Illari, Beate Krickel, Lucas Matthews, Irena Mikhalevich, Anya Plutynski, Gualtiero Piccinini, Mark Povich, and Katheryn Shrumm. We are also grateful to Pamela Speh for help with Figure 1.

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