Notes to The Unity of Science

1. The chief North American delegate was Paul Carus, editor of Open Court and The Monist.

2. Notice the assumption of a fact-convention distinction.

3. While Morrison refers to unifying and explanatory mechanisms as formal representations involving interaction or connection parameters, she does not think of them as being mechanistic. The causal mechanisms behind those ‘mechanisms’ are for her the real source of explanatory understanding. Much of the confusion comes from the ambiguity in her use of the term ‘mechanism’.

4. Plutynski and Rosenberg have stressed the value of answers to how-possibly and why-necessarily (the distinction corresponds to Clerk Maxwell’s distinction between illustration and explanation).

5. Contrast with Cartwright's antirealism in Cartwright 1983 about universal fundamental level, on account of the local validity of empirical evidence and the approximation and idealizations that pave its twisted way to high-theory.

6. A related debate between Cartwright and her critics (see above) revolves around whether Cartwright's insistence that laws are true only ceteris paribus, applies to fundamental laws of physics (but compare Teller 2004 and Kincaid 1996). On the case of the separation between physics from special sciences see also Kincaid 1996.

7. In addition, research in X-ray crystallography became a crucial strand of research behind the discovery of the DNA.

8. Smocovitis has argued for a role in the evolutionary synthesis, through Woodger, of the unifying spirit of logical empiricism.

Copyright © 2013 by
Jordi Cat <jcat@indiana.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free