Supplement to Sextus Empiricus

Revisiting the texts which appeared to support interpretations 3.4.2 and 3.4.3

What of the texts assembled under 3.4.2, which can make it seem that Sextus is after all a rustic skeptic, with no beliefs at all? How would a Frede-style, ‘urbane’, interpreter respond to those texts? PH I 12 states:

The chief constitutive principle of skepticism is the claim that to every account an equal account is opposed; for it is from this, we think, that we come to hold no beliefs (μὴ δογματίζειν).

The urbane interpreter will observe that Sextus immediately goes on in I 13 to give the sense in which the skeptic has no beliefs, and that is the sense in which having a dogma would involve choosing between equally opposed appearances generated by philosophical argumentation; that is all that was meant in I 12. The urbane interpreter will also need to explain those texts where Sextus says that the skeptic leads his life adoxastôs (translated by Annas and Barnes as ‘without holding any opinions’), such as PH I 15, 24, etc. But again, this word only need be understood as meaning ‘without dogmata (of the forbidden type)’. Sextus goes to such trouble to tell us that there are dogmata that the skeptic does have, and dogmata that the skeptic doesn't have, it is only reasonable to interpret an adverb such as adoxastôs as meaning ‘without dogmata (of the forbidden type)’, especially since it occurs first in I 15, only a few lines after I 13. Frede-style interpreters would advocate translating adoxastôs in the way Bury did, as ‘undogmatically’ (there is no adverb adogmatikôs in Greek).

What of the text mentioned under 3.4.3, which would support the Fine/Perin view that the skeptic can only believe that they are being appeared to in a certain way? That text is PH I 19–20:

When we investigate whether existing things are such as they appear, we grant (δίδομεν) that they appear, and what we investigate is not what is apparent but what is said about what is apparent—and this is different from investigating what is apparent itself. For example, it appears to us that honey sweetens (we concede (συγχωροῦμεν) this inasmuch as we are sweetened in a perceptual way).

In this text, Sextus says that the skeptic grants that existing things appear in such-and-such a way, and concedes that it appears to them that honey sweetens. A proponent of the Frede view has to say something like this: yes, Sextus does grant and concede those things, but there is no reason to think that this is the only thing that he grants or concedes—and in fact, there are plenty of places where the skeptic tells us what other things he accepts or grants or says, and these are straightforward propositions such as ‘there are numbers’, ‘god exists’, ‘piety is good and impiety bad’, etc. (see the texts listed at the end of 3.4.1).

Copyright © 2014 by
Benjamin Morison <bmorison@princeton.edu>

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