Notes to Shared Agency

1. To this, we should add that the distinction between shared activity and a mere aggregate of individual acts is significant also for our understanding of failures of agency. The sorts of irrationality, inefficiencies or self-defeat that might be exhibited by agents can differ depending on whether they're acting collectively or individually.

2. To take examples from Gilbert 1990, Bratman 1992, and Searle 1990.

3. Compare the passage from Wittgenstein (PI 621): “…when ‘I raise my arm’, my arm goes up. And the problem arises: what is left over if I subtract the fact that my arm goes up from the fact that I raise my arm?”

4. This point is implicit in Searle, as when he describes the case of mere aggregation by saying that “there is just a sequence of individual acts that happen to converge on a common goal” (403, emphasis added). The point is more explicitly made in the discussion of Searle in Pacherie 2007.

5. Perhaps it's premature to conclude, as Searle does, that there has to be an “internal” difference here. While most theorists treat intention as an attitude (e.g. Davidson 1978, Harman 1976, Bratman 1986), there has been work on intention influenced by Anscombe and Wittgenstein (Wilson 1989, Thompson 2008) that understands intention fundamentally in terms of intentional action. (See Setiya's entry on intention.) It remains to be seen how advocates of such a view would explicitly address the issues raised in the recent literature in shared agency, though some gesture in this direction might be found in Stoutland 1997.

6.A passage from Hobbes (1651, 3) is suggestive of the view: “By art is created that great Leviathan, called a Commonwealth or State—(in Latin, Civitas) which is but an artificial man…” See Rovane 1997, Tollefsen 2002, Pettit 2003. See below for discussion of Pettit's discursive dilemma argument for group minds.

Gilbert (1989, 163; 1990; 1997) has spoken of plural subjects, insisting that several individuals can be subject to a mental state, and rejecting the idea that, properly speaking, only a single individual is the subject of a particular mental state). But she also disavows a supra-individual entity. Her talk of plural subject agents is, arguably, best interpreted not as a metaphysical claim, but one about the nature of the special obligations and rights holding between participants in shared activity. See below. Velleman 1997a speaks of a concrete, public event as being an intention. And Bratman 1993 thinks of a shared intention as a feature of a group of individuals (see below). But neither endorses any claim about groups having minds.)

7. See his Constraint 1 (Searle 1990, 406).

8. Presumably, a nation would count as a supra-individual entity. So consider the following example. The US increases research funding in physics in order to win the space race with the USSR. I'm a graduate student benefiting from the additional funding, and I do research in rocket and satellite technology, and teach physics and engineering to undergraduates; indeed, I wouldn't have gone into the area had it not been for the funding opportunities. I am in the relevant sense a constituent of the larger entity—in this case the US—but I have no concern with the space race. I'm just doing my job, or pursuing my own interests.

9. It is widely held that the commitment associated with intention distinguishes it from attitudes such as desire, and accounts for the distinctive role it plays in practical reasoning. Harman 1976, 1986; Bratman 1987.

10. The term ‘participatory intention’ is coined by Kutz 2000. The Intention Thesis might make it sound as if one is prejudging the matter in favor of reductivists. But we'll see that Searle satisfies this, and even Gilbert does (if we interpret her talk of derived personal commitments as entailing an intention or intention-like state).

Ludwig 2007 points to a grammatical criterion to distinguish different readings of plural subject action sentences. For example, we went to college may be understood collectively, in which case there is a single thing done together, or it may be read distributively, in which case there is more than one act done independently. Ludwig's aim is to provide a semantics that doesn't involve reference to group agents. He does this by quantifying over action/events, and treating we as a restricted quantifier over individuals within a group. The difference between collective and distributive readings turn out, on this view, to hinge on a scope ambiguity. The point of interest for our purposes is this. Although Ludwig himself might not endorse it, his grammatical criterion for the collective reading might amount to a criterion for shared agency that is independent of the intentions of the participants, and hence in violation of the Intention Thesis. But just because there is an action description with a certain logical form (appropriate for the collective reading) doesn't mean that something automatically answers to it. Perhaps there is only something of interest that answers to it when intentions are involved.

11. This not the view that Tuomela develops in detail in later work. (See note below.) Other reductivists: Bratman (1992), MacMahon (2001, 2005), Miller (2001). Regarding mutual belief, see Lewis 1969. For some recent discussion, see Chant & Ernst 2008.

12. In a related vein, Gold and Sugden (2007, 111) point out that Tuomela and Miller's analysis would entail that every Nash equilibrium—even when both parties defect in the Prisoner's Dilemma—as a case of shared activity. Strictly speaking, that is not the case, for as Gold and Sugden recognize, Tuomela and Miller talk of the individuals intending to do their parts, which is not how players in a Prisoner's Dilemma see themselves.

13. For discussion of circularity, see Kutz 2000, Bratman 1997, and Petersson 2007. Whether this is a real problem depends on what the aims of the proposal are. A metaphysical reduction of collective action and intention might tolerate appeal to intentions whose content involves unreduced concepts of collective intentionality (Setiya 2010).

14.See Sellars (1963; 1968, 217). Tuomela's later view is similar to Searle in that there there is no reduction to individual intentions. But he wouldn't be described as primitivist, since he seems to characterize “we-mode” intentions functionally. There is no reduction of ‘we mode’ intentions to ‘I-mode’ intention because each has a distinctive holistic or functional characterization. See Tuomela 2003, 2007.

15. Commentators have had some difficulty assimilating Searle's rejection of anti-individualism with his treatment of collective phenomena. For a helpful critical discussion see Pacherie 2007, who (perhaps uncharitably) charges Searle with inconsistency. In particular, she tries to show that Searle is committed to describing certain cases (where one is under an illusion that one is acting with someone) in a way that is at odds with his rejection of anti-individualism.

16. There may be ways to elaborate and extend to the interpersonal the means-end structure which, according to Searle, relates collective with individual intentionality within a single mind. But it's not something he explores.

17. See Bratman 1993, 113 (1999, 129) for an explicit characterization of the view as reductive.

18. “Shared Intention”, Faces, 112. The strategy is to apply to groups of individuals the theoretical framework of Lewisian functionalism (see papers in Lewis 1982).

19. Though, as Bratman (1992, 340) points out, this requirement must be qualified in light of competitive games. See also Searle (1990, 413–13).

20. Interestingly, Bratman's requirement does not explicitly require the actual meshing of subplans. What would happen if each intends the meshing of subplans, but they simply do not succeed at it? For shared activity, Bratman requires that our intentions lead to the activity by way of mutual responsiveness (1992, 339), so our failure in meshing our plans would presumably prevent us from engaging in the activity, or do so only with difficulty. However, Bratman's account of shared intention (1993) only requires the intention to mesh, and would seem to allow that individuals share intentions even though they fail utterly in their attempts to mesh their subplans.

21. The normative aspect of shared activity, at least in the form of obligations, has been discussed extensively by Gilbert. See below.

22. Bratman 2009a seems to think of these constraints as wide-scope, in the sense of Broome 1999. But there is some worry that Broome's conception of normative constraints doesn't address the element of commitment and stability that is distinctive of intention.

23. See Bratman, 2009c, 2009b, 1992. Bratman expresses the bridge intention in terms of the condition requiring each participant to have the intention to act in accordance with and because of the others' intentions and plans (as well as his or her own). Roth 2003 (“Practical Intersubjectivity”) sympathizes with these interpersonal normative requirements of consistency and coherence as a condition for shared intention and action, but resists the reductive bridge intention account of it.

24. Korsgaard 2009, 192. Tuomela requires that “we-mode” intention necessarily involves group reasons. See his 2007; 13, 47, 98.

25. The example is due to S. Shiffrin. Bratman's view can handle these cases. He does not require the meshing of super-ordinate intentions, motives, or reasons. See his 1999, 122.

26. Unless, perhaps, fellow participants understand this to be your motive and are willing nevertheless to act with you.

27. At least in the basic cases that don't involve authority relations established by more basic shared activity (Gilbert 2008, 180). For Gilbert's notion of joint commitment, see below.

28. Gilbert 2008, 494–5; there is also discussion of the no unilateral withdrawal condition in earlier work, such as Gilbert 1990.

29. For Bratman 1993, the structure of related intentions serve to coordinate action and planning, as well as structure bargaining between participants.

30. Searle 1990, Bratman 1992. Velleman 2001 has also come around to this view about the object of what is intended.

31. Velleman 1997a. Others: Baier 1997, Stoutland 1997. One issue is that some think that you cannot intend more than your own actions; or, if you can, it is only as a result of one's own actions. But even if one is more liberal about the possible objects that may fall into the range of what's directly intended, such that one may intend more than one's own actions, there remains the worry that this is precluded in the case of shared activity.

32. See Bratman (1997). For some, the settling condition implies belief: the sense in which I'm settled on A-ing when I intend to A entails that I believe that I will A (Harman 1976, Velleman 1989). Even if one doesn't have such a strong belief requirement on intention, there remains the worry of how to reconcile the respect with which one should regard the agency of fellow participants with the idea that one's intention settles the matter. Thus, Bratman takes this problem seriously, even though he doesn't endorse the strong belief condition on intention.

33. This makes Velleman's concern to be one of reconciling shared activity with the autonomy of the participants. This is certainly one aspect of Velleman's worry. But he also is concerned with the problem of shared discretion, which, if anything, is closer to worries about causal exclusion: if whether we J is up to me, how could it also be up to you?

34. Velleman 1997a, 36ff. Velleman is inspired by a plausible reading of some earlier work of Gilbert such as Gilbert 1990, 7. Gilbert 1989 is also cited. No page references are given, but presumably he has in mind pp. 198, 409–10.

35. For discussion, see Roth 2004, 373–80; Bacharach 2006, 137ff. While addressing Robins 2002 and a precursor of Roth 2004, Gilbert 2002 disavows the interdependent conditional view attributed to her by Velleman, Roth, and Robins. See also Gilbert 2003, 2009.

Velleman himself is sensitive to something like this worry (1997a, 39) and it shapes how he formulates the content of the conditional intention. To be fair to Velleman, it should also be noted that the thesis of interdependent conditional intentions is only a part of his proposal. A further element of the view is that the public event constituted by the expressions of these conditional intentions by each party is, on causal/functional grounds, an intention. It's in this way that individual (participatory) conditional intentions are supposed to “add up” to a joint or shared categorical intention. Note also that at the individual level—i.e. the participatory intention—the conditional character of the intention is never lost. See Velleman 2001. Presumably, it's the crucial element to capture how intentions are shared in a way that respects the agency of other participants, or in a way that makes them genuinely interdependent. (That's why Velleman doesn't really hold the view that one person has the conditional intention and the other intends categorically, a view that would avoid the problem with the settling condition.)

36. Bratman 1997, in Bratman 1999, 155. For debate about prediction of one's own actions, see Goldman 1968, 1970 and Hampshire 1965.

37. To use the well known example from Gilbert 1990.

38. See note 13 above for references concerning circularity.

39. The reasoning must be characterized in a way that doesn't presuppose the notions we're seeking to explicate.

40. For team reasoning, see Bacharach 2006, Hurley 1989 and Anderson 2001. For application of team reasoning to characterizing participatory intentions, see Bacharach 2006, 138; Gold & Sugden, 2007. Tuomela 2003 holds a related view, although not motivated from considerations of game theory.

41. Another passage: “As long as people are out on a walk together, they will understand that each has an obligation to do what he or she can to achieve the relevant goal.” (1996, 184). See also Gilbert 1989, 162, 409, 411.

42.Scanlon's Principle F in his 1998, 304. For recent discussion of Scanlon and promising that bears on shared activity, see Shiffrin 2008. For another reductivist response to Gilbert see MacMahon 2005, 299ff. For some recent discussion of mutual obligation, see Roth 2004, Alonso 2009.

43. Gilbert 2009; 2008, 497. This connects with recent discussion of “bipolar normativity” see Darwall 2006, also Thompson 2004.

44. Korsgaard 2009, 189 understands “everyday interaction” (which presumably includes acting together) along similar lines, invoking the notion of ownership, but also that of promising. See also Scanlon's Principle F mentioned above. One advantage Scanlon sees for his view over the rival social practice view of promising is that it better reflects the directed nature of the obligation, and thus better captures who is primarily wronged when one fails to keep a promise (Scanlon 1998, 316).

45. For example, though Sue might be able to release Jack from the commitment, if they are doing something together, she might in addition have more of an active role in determining how he goes about fulfilling his commitment, and how he modifies the commitment in changing circumstances.

46. Although Gilbert 2009, 183 does appeal to ownership again in showing how her notion of joint commitment explains directed obligation.

47. Something that would be secured if individuals could act directly on each other's intentions much in the way each may act on his or her own prior intentions. See Roth 2004.

48. Pettit is less clear in earlier pieces on how the decision procedure—and the policy of maintaining rationality at the collective level—is implemented (Pettit 2001, 2003). More recently, Pettit and Schweikard 2006 have dispelled some of this mystery, with the suggestion that shared activity (understood along Bratmanian and Tuomelan lines) figure in implementing the decision procedure and rationality at the collective level. They do so, however, at the risk of weakening the case for group minds.

Copyright © 2010 by
Abraham Sesshu Roth <roth.263@osu.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free