Theory and Bioethics

First published Tue May 18, 2010

As a species of practical ethics, bioethics exhibits a complex and contested relationship to philosophical theory. On the one hand, many who teach and write in this interdisciplinary field are philosophers who naturally believe that their specific contribution to the field—their “expertise,” if you will—consists in the application of distinctly philosophical methods, including various kinds of ethical theory, to practical problems arising in biomedical research, clinical medicine, and public health. But on the other hand, many who work in the area of bioethics, including many philosophers, are highly skeptical of the so-called “applied ethics” model of moral reasoning, in which exemplars of high theory (e.g., consequentialist utilitarianism, Kantian deontology, rights-based theories, natural law, etc.) are directly “applied” to practical problems. Indeed, most philosophically-inclined contributors to the bioethics literature have eschewed high moral theory in favor of various modes of moral reasoning falling on a spectrum between the strong particularism of various strains of casuistry or narrative ethics, on one end, and the mid-level norms of the enormously influential “principlism” of Beauchamp and Childress, on the other (Beauchamp and Childress, 2009).[1] According to philosophers Robert K. Fullinwider (2008) and Will Kymlicka (1996), bioethics in the public domain can and should go about its business as a species of ethical reflection independently of any reliance upon high-flying ethical theory.

This article explores the controversy concerning the role of philosophical theory for practical ethics in general and bioethics in particular. The main body of this entry dialectically canvasses the respective claims for “high theory,” for particularistic “anti-theory,” and for various species of “mid-level” theorizing in between these extremes. A discursive taxonomy of the kinds of philosophical theories deployed in practical ethics—i.e., metaethical, normative, metaphysical—is provided in a supplement.


1. What's theory to practice, and practice to theory?

Determining the precise nature of the relationship between bioethics and ethical theory is complicated by the absence of a canonical definition of “theory.” Although philosophers have self-consciously engaged in ethical theorizing since the days of the ancient Greeks, they have not given much thought to what it is that makes certain kinds of ethical reflection distinctly theoretical as opposed to other, more practical intellectual pursuits. So when we inquire into the nature of the relationship between bioethics and moral or political theory, it will obviously matter a great deal whether we define “theory” narrowly—restricting it to a small cluster of paradigmatic examples, such as classical or contemporary versions of utilitarianism or Kantianism—or more broadly so as to encompass many different modes of moral reflection, including feminist critiques of reproductive technologies, virtue ethics, or various conceptual and normative accounts of coercion and exploitation in biomedical research. The broader our definition of “theory,” the more commonsensical will be the claim that theory should play an important role in bioethics.

Things get even more complicated when we recall that bioethics is not a monolithic field; it encompasses a variety of distinct but interrelated activities, some of which might be more amenable to the deployment of philosophical theory than others.[2] At the most concrete and immediate level, there is clinical bioethics, which amounts to the deployment of bioethical concepts, values and methods within the domain of the hospital or clinic. The paradigmatic activity of clinical bioethics is the ethics consult, in which perplexed or worried physicians, nurses, social workers, patients or their family members call upon an ethicist (among others, e.g., psychiatrists and lawyers) for assistance in resolving an actual case. These case discussions take place in real time and they are anything but hypothetical. While those who discuss bioethics in an academic context can afford to reach the end of the hour in a state of perplexed indeterminacy, the clinical ethicist is acutely aware that the bedside is not a seminar room and that a decision must be reached.

Second, there is policy-oriented bioethics. In contrast to the clinical ethicist, who is concerned with the fate of individual patients, the bioethicist cum policy analyst is called upon to assist in the formulation of policies that will affect large numbers of people. Such policy discussions can take place on the level of individual hospitals or health systems, where administrators, medical and nursing staff, and bioethicists debate, inter alia, the merits of competing policies on medical futility or do-not-resuscitate orders; or they can take place in the more rarified atmosphere of various state and national commissions charged with formulating policy on topics such as cloning, access to health care, organ transplantation, or assisted suicide. Although such commissions operate at much higher levels of generality than the clinical ethicist in the trenches, both of these kinds of bioethical activity tend to be intensely practical and result-oriented. The clinical ethicist will usually be wary of invoking philosophical or religious theory because her interlocutors usually have neither the time nor the inclination to discuss matters on this level, while the bioethicist on the national commission will soon realize the impossibility of forging a consensus with his or her peers on the basis of theory alone.

Finally, at the other end of the practice-theory spectrum, there is bioethics as a theoretical pursuit of truth, a variant unhindered by the resolutely practical constraints of the clinic and commission. The academic is free to think as deeply or to soar as high into the theoretical empyrean as she wishes. Unlike the clinical ethicist, she is unhindered by time constraints, medical custom, law, or the need to reach closure on a decision. The seminar lasts all semester, and it might serve a good educational purpose to leave one's students even more confused at the end than they were at the beginning. And unlike the bioethicist cum policy analyst, the academic doesn't have to worry about finding a common language or bending to the necessities imposed by pluralism or sponsoring agencies of government. It is here within the academic domain that the relationship between philosophical-religious theory and bioethics will tend to be most explicit and most welcome, although even here bioethicists need to be responsive to the above constraints should they desire the fruits of their intellectual labors eventually to have some influence on public policy. Presumably, a standard motivation for engaging in practical ethics is to influence practice.

Although I have sketched above three different kinds of activities that can all be lumped under the common rubric of “bioethics,” it should be kept in mind that each of these constituent elements of bioethics influences the others—e.g., bioethical theory can influence reasoning in policy settings, and clinical practice can sometimes prompt the theoretician to reexamine some of his basic assumptions. It should also go without saying that quite often the same individuals can and do engage in various areas of bioethical activity, alternatively, as clinicians, teachers, theoreticians, and as consultants to industry or government.

So much for preliminary remarks. Let us now move on to a more dialectical examination of the role of theory in bioethics. We shall begin with the respective cases for and against deploying high moral theory. We will then proceed to examine the case for anti-theory in bioethics, and will close with a brief on behalf of a “theory modest,” as opposed to theory free, approach to bioethical problems. Interested readers are encouraged to consult the supplement to this entry, which offers a discursive typology of the various kinds of theory deployed in bioethics.

2. The heroic phase of ethical theory and “applied ethics”

2.1 The allure of high theory

As the era of contemporary practical ethics dawned in the early 1970s, it was natural for philosophers and religious moralists to assume that their role in the division of labor within this budding field would call for much more than the modest metaethical chores traditionally allotted to them, such as providing definitions for terms like “right” and “good” (Hare 1952). Inspired by the example of John Rawls' monumental theory of justice (1971), if not always by his methods or conclusions, practically-minded philosophers set out to vindicate not only Rawls's faith in the ability of human reason to justify a particular conception of the basic structure of society, but also their own faith, less obviously shared by Rawls, that moral and political theory could also advance debate across a whole spectrum of practical domains, including medical practice, human experimentation, business, the environment, journalism, law, and politics. It was also quite natural for such philosophers to assume that, over and above their skill in logical criticism, their specific expertise as philosophers would consist in their knowledge of ethical theory and their ability to apply such theory to practical problems, such as paternalism in the physician-patient relationship and access to health care. Finally, they assumed a particular picture or model of ethical theorizing, according to which a vast, tightly organized system of judgments is supported by a pivotally placed keystone composed of one or two principles, such as Kant's categorical imperative. Annette Baier compares this conception of theory to a great vaulting structure (Baier 1994).

Thus dawned what we might call the “heroic” phase of practical ethics, in which philosophers attempted to tackle all manner of problems with the aid of moral and political theory. This confidence in the deployment of ethical theory prompted the authors of the leading bioethics texts and anthologies to preface their chapters on particular moral problems or themes with material introducing students to the rudiments of ethical theory, including obligatory sections on consequentialism, deontology, rights, natural law, and so on. [3] Typical examples of this trend might include Joseph Fletcher's (1974) and Peter Singer's (1999) utilitarian approaches to the whole spectrum of bioethical issues, Alan Donagan's explicitly Kantian argument for informed consent in medical practice and research (1977), and Tristram Engelhardt's (1986) critique of redistribution in health care on the basis of libertarian premises borrowed from Robert Nozick (1974). What kinds of motivations might be adduced to explain and endorse such resort to high theory in bioethics?

Theoretical issues crop up everywhere in bioethics, and most of the ethical judgments we bring to bear on them may implicitly but ultimately commit us to some theory or other (Rachels 1998, and Darwall 2003). Most of the time, however, both in our personal lives and on the job, we manage to muddle through whatever moral puzzles might arise by appealing to virtuous habits instilled in us by our parents, or to various rules of thumb that have provided good guidance in the past, or by groping our way analogically from one case to another. Most of the time, such ethical coping mechanisms work well enough, and we get along quite well without resort to ethical theory of any kind; but sometimes they don't, and those are the occasions when we need to seek moral justification at a higher level. Sometimes the problem is unavoidably philosophical, such as the debate over abortion or the derivation and use of human stem cells. Such contested issues turn on unavoidable metaphysical questions bearing on the moral status of human embryos and fetuses. If we want to show respect to our interlocutors on the other side of these arguments, we will need to exchange good reasons with them, and these reasons will inevitably involve theoretical propositions.

Another occasion for moving up the ladder of “justificatory ascent” (Dworkin 1997) is provided by our need to weigh, balance, and adjudicate between the conflicting demands of various mid-level principles. One alleged weakness of pluralistic theories like those of W.D. Ross or the principlism of Beauchamp and Childress is that the various principles that constitute the backbone of such theories can and often do conflict with one another; and when they do, we may need to ascend to a higher level of justification provided by a more comprehensive moral theory. Sidgwick thus famously argued in favor of utilitarianism on the ground that such a theory could help us resolve conflicts among ordinary commonsensical duties, such as duty to keep promises and the duty to rescue strangers in mortal peril, that common sense morality could not resolve on its own (1981, orig. 1884).

A similar point in favor of high theory concerns the role of rules in moral argument. Most of us, perhaps most of the time, successfully navigate moral problems arising in everyday life by means of various rules that have stood the test of time: e.g., keep your promises, do not kill, do not lie, etc. But here too, controversies arise due to conflicting rules or to interpretive difficulties in assessing the nature, point, and weight of various rules in varying circumstances. In order to adjudicate these controversies, we need a normative standard that can articulate the nature of the rules, their respective grounds of justification, and their comparative weight in moral argument—in short, we need theory (Nussbaum 2000a).

Another virtue of theory concerns the importance of achieving consistency in our moral judgments and the value of developing a truly systematic perspective on our moral lives. But given the finite nature of our life span, the urgency of practical concerns, and the limited range of our attention, we fall far short of Dworkin's mythical judge, Hercules, who somehow manages to digest all the imaginable legal precedents in a case, all the institutional history of court and country, and discerns a coherent order in all this flotsam and jetsam with the aid of the best political philosophy available (Dworkin 1977). Usually the best we mere mortals can hope for is to illuminate a few important niches of our collective life, so we try to develop theories bearing, inter alia, on the nature of suffering, the physician-patient relationship, the ethical treatment of children in research, the nature and limits of private property, equal opportunity, and so on.

Here too conflicts may arise between different theories and the weight they give to different principles or values. For example, our regnant theories of the physician-patient relationship are largely dominated by the value of autonomy and the principle of respect for individual choice, but as Alan Wertheimer has shown, our standard approach to research ethics remains paternalistic in some ways that may not be defensible (forthcoming). We charge Institutional Review Boards (IRBs) with the task of protecting potential research subjects from studies that might pose “excessive” risks, and we worry that financial rewards for participation might exercise “undue influence” on subjects, especially those who are poor and socially marginalized.

Although one could attempt to simply muddle through in the face of such inconsistencies, the more rational and, some would say, the more ethically responsible choice is to strive for systematic coherence among the various theories we develop in different contexts. Although we may never arrive at the degree of systematic coherence achieved by Hercules before breakfast, we should at least try to achieve coherence among all the disparate regions of our moral experience.[4]

2.2 The allure of ideal political philosophy

In confronting questions bearing on health inequalities and inequities, bioethics will naturally seek guidance in various contemporary theories of justice, including Rawlsian contractarianism, utilitarian cost-benefit analysis, and libertarian theories of natural rights. In order to present us with a picture of a completely just society, the theorist must make several idealizing assumptions that tend to distance that picture from social reality as we know it. Rawls, for example, famously assumes “full compliance” with the principles of justice in an ideally just society (1971/1999). Everyone would obey laws based upon the principles of equal liberty and the just allocation of social primary goods. There would be no racial discrimination, no crime, no glaring power imbalances between the sexes, and no social or economic inequalities that did not maximally advance the interests of the worst off group in society. On the global level, each nation, according to Rawls, would ideally have sufficient means to govern itself democratically (or at least “decently”), so that in working out the terms of ideal global justice, we need not worry about the sort of widespread, severe poverty and rampant corruption that currently blight the lives of billions of people (Rawls 1999b). In response to the critic who might ask what this idealized picture has to do with the social world that we actually inhabit, Rawls's response would be that the theorist must abstract from such realities precisely in order to present us with an ideal theory of justice. In a perfectly just society, there would indeed be no crime and no shameful class barriers to equal opportunity; if there were, that society would not be perfectly just. Thus, as one philosopher has put it, ideal theory presents us with a picture of our ultimate social objective, Paradise Island (Robeyns 2008).

3. Problems with bioethics conceived as applied high theory

3.1 The ubiquity of moral pluralism

Notwithstanding the many attractions of high theory as an intellectual pursuit, the heroic phase of “applied ethics” was short lived; indeed, it was practically stillborn. Perhaps the main obstacle to the deployment of high theory to moral practice in medicine, research, and public health has been the absence of consensus on which theory should prevail. There are, first of all, many theories from which to choose—utilitarian, Kantian, Rawlsian, libertarian, etc.—and no clear winner among them. This would not be a serious problem were bioethics merely an academic pursuit, but the entire field of practical ethics sees itself as a potentially useful guide to practice. If all interpretive activity within the field were to depend upon the selection of a single, superior moral/political theory, practitioners hoping for assistance in dealing with real world clinical or policy problems would have to suffer a very long wait indeed. (“Be right with you, as soon as we resolve the fundamental disagreements between consequentialists and deontologists.”)

Even if philosophers could overcome their seemingly endless and intractable disagreements bearing on which high theory to adopt, we would still face the problem of balkanization and disagreement within our favored theory. Rule utilitarians disagree with act utilitarians; Rawlsians disagree with each other, inter alia, on the metric of equality and the soundness of the difference principle; and libertarians debate the stringency of their preference for liberty over social equality.

In the face of this proliferation of theoretical possibilities and the extreme unlikelihood of reaching some sort of societal consensus on the best interpretation of the best theory, James Rachels' (admittedly guarded) optimism about our ability to eventually develop an ethical theory, acceptable to all rational persons, as a basis for bioethics would appear to be misplaced (Rachels 1998). The fact that just about every self-respecting ethical theory that we know of condemns slavery—Rachels's key case study suggesting the possibility of a rational consensus on theory—still leaves us a long way from reaching consensus on a theory that could successfully adjudicate the front-burner issues in bioethics, such as access to health care, the ethics of genetic enhancement, and assisted suicide. Indeed, notwithstanding theory's unifying aims, allotting a central role to applied high theory in clinical and policy-oriented bioethics would in all likelihood serve only to increase the amount of disagreement and pluralism in society.

3.2 Shortcomings of ideal political theory

Notwithstanding the value of doing ideal political theory, those seeking practical means of advancing justice in the here and now will immediately discover that some of the most celebrated theories of justice in current circulation are ill-suited to this purpose. This is because the authors of these theories self-consciously advance them as “ideal theories”—i.e., as theories of what a perfectly just society would look like. Although this sounds perfectly unremarkable on first hearing—what else should we expect a theory of justice to do?—attempting to glean practical advice from ideal theories proves to be an extremely problematic endeavor. Why should this be so?

The often yawning gap between our shining ideal theories and tawdry social realities engenders serious problems when we try to envision how we might get from where we are now, mired in all sorts of injustice, to Paradise Island. As many political theorists have pointed out, what might be the correct principles for an ideally just world might not be immediately and directly applicable to the actual world that we inhabit (Sen 2006, Robyns 2008) Knowing what perfect justice requires might shed little light, if any, on the sorts of questions facing us today, such as how various feasible and politically acceptable options might be compared and ranked as incremental steps in the direction of a just society. In assuming complete compliance with just norms, ideal theory ignores the costs and benefits of various actions, which will vary with the degree of compliance. In many cases, individuals who have played fairly for a long time according to putatively less than perfectly just rules actually in place, may rightly feel unjustly treated by societal efforts to abruptly redress such deviations from perfection in one fell swoop (Simmons 2010). When contemplating two or more possible improvements to a less than ideal status quo, ideal theory might well fail to provide us with a reliable guide to ranking them against one another.

3.3 Deliberation as necessary adjunct of theory

It is also doubtful that any high level philosophical theory can be fruitfully “applied” directly so as to yield univocal answers to complex problems of professional practice and public policy. As Amy Gutmann and Dennis Thompson have persuasively argued (1998), whichever theory we happen to embrace—whether it be any flavor of utilitarianism, contractarianism, or natural law—will eventually run out of gas before it reaches the level of concrete decision making required by practical ethics. In most cases, the theorist will have to reluctantly conclude that several policy options are sufficiently just according to their preferred theory, and then rely on a procedural-political solution afforded by some variant of so-called deliberative democracy. Perhaps the most impressive case for the limits of philosophical theory and the necessity of a procedural supplement is made by philosopher Norman Daniels, whose work on the theory of just health care has constituted an attempt, sustained over several decades, to develop an explicitly Rawlsian account of just access to health care and the social determinants of health. Although Daniels at first held out the hope that his theory, based upon a robust account of equal opportunity, could provide the requisite guidance for social policies bearing on access to health care and rationing, he now explicitly acknowledges that philosophical theory is not sufficiently fine-grained for such concrete policy making and must be supplemented by justly structured political deliberation (Daniels 1996, 144–75; Daniels 2007, ch. 4).

3.4 Tension between some versions of high theory and democracy

Another problem with assigning a central role to high theory in clinical and policy-oriented bioethics emerges from the tension between the often rigorous and arcane formulations of high theory and the norms ideally governing a democratic polity. As Rawls has persuasively argued, publicity should be a fundamental norm governing the basic law and policy of a democratic society (Rawls 1971/1999). Those norms establishing the basic structure of rights and entitlements should be capable of public articulation and acceptance by people of ordinary intelligence with restricted leisure time and inclination for theoretical pursuits. In addition to ruling out so-called “government house utilitarianism”—i.e., versions of utilitarianism that provide ultimate justification for law and policy but dare not speak their own name in public—this publicity requirement would also preclude justifications that could be comprehended and accepted only by an elite class of philosophical theoreticians (Bertram 1997). Thus, even if in theory, as it were, a theory could be developed that most closely approximated the ideal demands of morality and justice, but was incomprehensible to the average person lacking the requisite background in the esoteric intricacies of, e.g., decision theory, such a theory could not count, notwithstanding its intrinsic virtues, as an ideal norm for any democratic society. Since ex hypothesi its citizens do not understand it, they could not accept and consent to it speaking in their own names. They would perforce have to rely on the expertise of others, thus defeating the purpose of democracy, which requires that the basic principles of social cooperation be addressable to each and every person of normal capabilities.

This point about the tension between abstruse ethical theory and the requirements of doing bioethics in a democracy shows that one need not be a theory skeptic in order to simultaneously demote the place of high theory within bioethics and to substitute for it various modes of thought, such as versions of principlism, casuistry and narrative, that are closer to the ground and more in touch with common moral understandings (London 2001). As we shall see, some particularists argue against high normative theory on the ground that it is either impossible (Dancy 2006) or of little value. While I do not intend to affirm or deny the substance of this kind of theory skepticism here, it should be noted in passing that one can do high level theory in one's spare time and attach great value to it, while still maintaining that it should not be deployed in practical domains such as bioethics.

3.5 Vaulting theories and moral pluralism

The final problem with appeals to high philosophical theory to be mentioned here applies only to that subset of theories resembling vault-like structures held together by a small number of key principles, such as the Kantian categorical imperative or the principle of utility. Such theories have a tendency to pave over the manifest complexity of our moral lives in order to make the world safe for one or two principles. When confronted with values or principles of ordinary morality that cannot be easily explained by such favored philosophical principles, or that appear to contradict them, the theorist is often driven to concoct explanations that have all the immediate plausibility of Ptolemaic epicycles, a discredited, Rube Goldberg account of planetary motion prior to Copernicus.[5] In discussing the problem of global hunger, for example, Peter Singer has been confronted directly by a contradiction between his version of impartial utilitarianism and common morality's permissiveness for favoring kith and kin (Singer 2004). Should we reduce ourselves to the level of marginal utility in the course of assisting the distant needy, as the theory would dictate, or can we spend large amounts of our income to support our ailing parents in decent nursing homes, as common morality would grant? Utilitarians often try to finesse such objections by means of various rule-based strategies—e.g., all of us will ultimately be better off if we are allowed to favor close relatives in certain circumstances—but such attempts to “save the phenomena” of ordinary morality often lack plausibility. As Bernard Williams once famously noted, in such circumstances consequentialists usually have “one thought too many” (Williams 1973).

In sum, then, an approach to practical ethics founded upon high ethical theory—and especially on theories exhibiting a vault-like structure—has proven to be a non-starter for bioethics, especially at the levels of clinical consultation and social policy formation. Let us now examine the antithesis of reliance upon high theory: viz., the movement of anti-theory in bioethics.

4. The case for anti-theory in bioethics

At the other extreme, bioethics has witnessed the emergence of several interesting varieties of anti-theory, including various strains or combinations of casuistry, narrative ethics, feminism, and pragmatism. Although each of these alternative methodological approaches features more moderate variants that reserve a legitimate place for moral principles and even for some kinds of theory, their stronger anti-theory incarnations unite in rejecting any justificatory role either for high moral theory or mid-level moral principles.

Whereas theorists tend to favor top-down, deductivist modes of thinking, the anti-theorists embrace bottom-up (but not too far up) modalities of thought, such as common law jurisprudence in which the factual particularities of the case take center stage (Arras 1990). Whereas theorists tend to emphasize the capacity of our ordinary moral experience to be neatly ordered and systematized, the anti-theorists emphasize the cultural embeddedness, particularities, and ineradicable untidiness of our moral lives (Elliott 1999). And whereas theorists aspire to construct symmetrical cathedrals of normative thought, the anti-theorists tend to conceive of the moral life as Wittgenstein conceived of language itself, i.e., as a haphazardly evolving city consisting of a maze of ever-expanding little streets, alleyways and squares.[6]

According to Robert K. Fullinwider (2007), a partisan of the anti-theoretical wing of practical ethics, the right way to think about public policy is to think about public policy, not about metaphysics, epistemology, or normative theory. He believes that, apart from training in clear analytical thinking, most of the contents of the philosopher's standard-issue toolkit are decidedly ill-suited to the task of practical ethics. Dismissing applied moral theory as “an occupational hazard” of philosophers, Fullinwider wishes to resurrect and redeem the approach to moral problems shared by the much-maligned ancient sophists and early modern (Jesuit) casuists, an approach defined by scrupulous attention to context and detail, rhetorical persuasiveness, sympathetic comprehension of social and institutional practices, an aversion to systematic reasoning, and insouciance (or downright hostility) towards moral theory. Dismissing philosophical theory as “cloudland,” Fullinwider argues that common sense morality and actual social practices, positive laws, and institutions should form the basis of practical ethics and social criticism.

4.1 Strongly particularist casuistry

Perhaps the most promising of these anti-theoretical movements in bioethics has been the revival of casuistry at the hands of Stephen Toulmin and Albert Jonsen (1998). According to this rehabilitated form of casuistry, the greatest confidence in our moral judgments resides not at the level of theory, where we endlessly disagree, but rather at the level of the case, where our intuitions often converge without the benefit of theory. More precisely, moral certitude (or our best approximation thereof) is to be found in so-called paradigm cases, where our intuitions are most strongly reinforced. Moral analysis of a given situation begins, then, with a scrupulous inventory of the particular facts of the case—i.e., the who, what, where, how much, for how long, etc.—on which our judgments so often eventually turn. This nexus of particulars is then compared with the details operative in one or more paradigm cases—i.e., clear-cut examples of right or wrong conduct. In bioethics, many of these paradigms are famous legal cases, such as the case of Karen Quinlan in the area of termination of treatment, or the infamous Tuskegee syphilis study in the area of research ethics. The farther the present case takes us from the decisive features of the paradigm, the less confidence we may have in our judgments. And so we traverse the moral landscape by means of triangulating between the present case and related paradigm cases. Eventually, as we discover in the analogous common law tradition, we end up working our way through many related cases over time, and along the way generate a sophisticated typology of cases and governing paradigms that provide us with a rich repository of values for social criticism. As Fullinwider observes, our manifest need to organize and systematize our ethical thinking, and to give good reasons to each other, can be fully met by this kind of casuistry instead of theory.

Importantly, bioethical casuists contend that their method of moral reasoning, which hovers very close to the ground, offers us better chances of reaching agreement with people of very different religious or theoretical persuasions, and is thus ideally suited to resolving clinical or policy disputes in a pluralistic, democratic society (Sunstein 1996). Looking back on his experience with the first Presidential-level commission on research ethics, Stephen Toulmin noted that the commissioners were often able to forge agreement on some contentious issues—for example, research on prisoners and children—even though they never would have agreed on the deepest theoretical/religious reasons animating their respective positions (Toulmin 1982).

For strongly anti-theoretical casuists like Stephen Toulmin, the suspicion of theory extends even to mid-level bioethical principles, which, he argues, serve no justificatory function. In contrast to mainstream bioethical thinkers like Beauchamp and Childress—and even in contrast to more mainstream casuists, like his co-author, Albert Jonsen (1995)—for whom justification involves, inter alia, bringing actions or policies under various specified ethical principles or maxims, Toulmin contends that moral principles serve only an heuristic function; that is, they serve primarily to remind us of salient features of past decisions. Principles are, as it were, the ribbon we wrap around decisions we have already come to on the basis of particularistic casuistical reasoning.

4.2 Epistemological moral particularism

It is precisely on this point that hard-core bioethical casuistry converges with the epistemology of moral particularism as forcefully elaborated in the work of Jonathan Dancy (2006, 2009). According to Dancy, theories that accord an important justificatory role to moral principles, as most methodological approaches in bioethics do, wrongly assume that right- or wrong-making features of various situations must remain constant from one case to another. For example, if a physician lies to a patient, and if we regard that lying as telling against the morality of her action, we assume that lying will be a wrong-making element in any and all future cases. While many theorists who embrace the importance of principles in moral argument (e.g., W.D. Ross, Beauchamp and Childress, et al.) concede that the weight of any given principle may vary tremendously from one set of facts to another, moral particularists like Dancy go farther in denying that the moral valence of any particular element must remain constant from one case to another. In other words, they would contend that in some situations lying might be positively good, not merely a bad to be outweighed by some other element of the situation, so a general rule or principle against lying would inevitably be both overbroad and insufficiently attentive to context.

For strong particularists and hard-core bioethical casuists, then, justification in ethics will not depend upon bringing a set of facts under a suitably interpreted general principle; rather, justification will be a matter of all the discrete elements of a particular decision fitting together or “adding up” holistically in the right way. In some cases, lying will have a positive moral valence, while in others, truth-telling may have a negative valence; everything depends upon the particular constellation of circumstances presented by the case. At least with regard to the business of moral justification, then, there's no room for generalizations of any sort within this kind of strong particularist epistemology. Justification will thus tend to rely upon narrative or sensitive perception rather than logical argument; indeed, Dancy frowns upon “browbeating” people with appeals to moral principle. We thus arrive at the most extreme form of moral particularism. Although this view of morality is obviously a meta-ethical theory, it is a theory that could pretty much rule out the entirety of normative ethical theory, and most of what passes for theory within bioethics as well.

5. Some problems for the strong casuistry / anti-theory position

Eschewing high theory in bioethics does not necessarily commit us to a strongly particularistic variant of casuistry. As it developed historically, casuistry has always concerned itself with the proper application or interpretation of moral principles or maxims to difficult cases. Developed as it was in the context of highly deontological religious ethical systems with strong rules against lying, taking innocent life, etc., casuistry's primary task has been to adjudicate between such rules or principles in complicated cases where they conflict or their application is unclear. Historically, at least, the task of casuistry has thus been to interpret conflicting moral principles within the prism of individual “cases of conscience,” not to abolish principles or maxims as sources of moral justification (Arras 1998, Jonsen 1995).

It is also extremely unlikely that casuistry could be developed into a completely freestanding method without any connection to moral principles or a larger ethical vision. As an analogical method of thinking, casuistry attempts to extend the judgments reached in so-called paradigm cases to new cases that present somewhat different fact patterns. The casuists' persistent questions are: (1) “Is this new case (X) more like paradigm Y or paradigm Z?” and (2) “If the present case better fits within the orbit of paradigm Y than Z, is the fit with Y close enough to confer confidence in our moral judgment?” Showing that X bears more resemblance to Y than to Z means that an interpretation of the present case as falling within the analogical sphere of Y will provide us with the best justification for our present action. Our confidence in this analogical process stems from our confidence that the moral principle(s) embedded in Y extend to the present case, notwithstanding a certain number of factual differences. As the factual differences mount, we might conclude that the principle still holds, but does so only weakly, with less confidence. And at a certain point, the differences may become so great that the original principle animating our judgment in Y loses its justifying force entirely, at which point we begin reaching for another paradigm.

The crucial point here is that analogical reasoning is not self-directed. It requires principles or maxims, a sense of what's ethically relevant, or a background moral vision of some sort in order to give it direction. If we think of casuistry as an engine of moral justification, it is natural to ask about the steering wheel that provides a sense of direction to our analogical reasoning. In the most influential version of casuistry practiced today, as articulated by Albert Jonsen (1995), moral principles or generalizations provide this sense of direction. Paradigm cases are defined here as those cases in which a given principle applies most clearly, straightforwardly, and powerfully. To the extent that we are at all able to approximate certainty in moral matters, it will be in the context of a strong match between a principle and a paradigmatic set of facts. Generalizations or principles also provide us with the crucially important understanding of what's morally relevant and why, which drives analogical reasoning forward. In conceding these pivotal roles to moral principles, Jonsen both distanced himself from Toulmin's more radically particularistic brand of casuistry and softened the differences between casuistry and its principal methodological rival, the principlism of Beauchamp and Childress.[7]

What then to make of Dancy's particularistic, anti-principled, and anti-theoretical moral epistemology that appears to pose such a threat to business as usual in bioethics? Although this isn't the place for a full-blown examination of Dancy's subtle and philosophically sophisticated position,[8] we can sound a couple of cautionary observations. First, we can all agree with Dancy that sound moral judgment depends upon the particularities of moral situations in all their individuality and complexity. Blundering into a situation armed with inflexible and invariant moral principles that must hold everywhere and always in the same way, no matter what the facts on the ground, is, we can concede to Dancy, a big mistake, although identifying actual theorists who are guilty of such ham-handed blundering might prove to be a challenge.

Second, however, it is unclear that Dancy's reliance upon nuanced moral perception and narrative epistemology can really provide us with a plausible, let alone serviceable, notion of moral justification. If someone asks us for a moral justification of our stand on a particular issue, they are most likely going to be unsatisfied with such responses as: “All the facts just seemed to me to add up in a way that yields this conclusion,” or “My heightened skills of moral perception indicate that this is the correct judgment to make about this particular constellation of facts.” Instead, we will most likely want to hold out for some sort of inference or argument that moves from some sort of moral generalization (e.g., “lying is wrong”) to an all-things-considered judgment about this particular instance of lying (which might gain justificatory support from other elements of the situation) (Lance and Little 2006, Little 2001).

Third, the distance between Dancy's anti-principlist position and the standard approach to moral principles taken by, e.g., W.D. Ross and Beauchamp-Childress, is in practice not that great, and the remaining differences tend to tell in favor of the latter position rather than the former. Let us recall that the standard view of principles in bioethics, following Ross, is that various elements of action (e.g., the fact that an action involved a lie or cruelty) might well retain the same valence from one situation to another – i.e., lying will be a bad-making consideration in all cases—but that their weight will indeed vary from one situation to another, depending upon the facts. So it is quite possible to imagine cases where the wrong-making element of telling a lie might be vastly outweighed by other good-making considerations. (Think of the case of the Nazis banging on your door, asking about Jews you've been harboring.) In cases of this sort, Dancy's strong particularist epistemology will reach the same result, and only for a slightly different reason. While he would discern no negative valence in such an act of lying (“What Jews?”) and would instead see a positive valence, the Ross-Beauchamp-Childress approach would ascribe a negative valence to any act of lying, but would assign zero weight to that element in coming to the conclusion that lying is permissible in this particular context due to a host of countervailing positive factors.

Pragmatically, then, so long as the defenders of principles remain sensitive to context, it seems there is little, if anything, to be gained by embracing strong particularism, but perhaps something of value may be lost. Again, according to the strong particularist, the valence of any contextual element is not fixed in any way outside of particular contexts. Considerations that have told in favor of past actions might tell against other actions in the future. Although Dancy concedes that some properties of actions (e.g., lying, killing) may consistently present themselves to us as having a more or less stable valence, he denies that this sort of inductively derived pattern carries with it any justificatory force. Some particularists are prepared to bite this bullet, steadfastly maintaining that such “default valences” are mere summaries of moral knowledge restricted to specific past acts of moral decision making, wherein all the factors “added up” in a certain way; but others lament the loss of explanatory power resulting from such a dismissal of generalizations. For this rival particularist camp, principles and moral generalizations give us real knowledge about certain types of action and what makes them right or wrong (Lance and Little 2006, Little 2001). While conceding to Dancy that the standard conditions that make them right or wrong may not hold in aberrant or idiosyncratic cases (e.g., lying in the Nazi case above, or perhaps killing a friend about to be burned to death by implacable enemies, as in the film version of Last of the Mohicans), these more moderate particularists maintain that certain properties of action, under standard circumstances, give us real knowledge that can and should form the basis of inferences and arguments in particular cases.

These more moderate particularists, troubled by Dancy's moral epistemology, would also include the advocates of “theory modest” casuistry in bioethics. His brand of strong particularism would threaten not only the methodology of standard issue principlists like Beauchamp and Childress, but it would also trouble moderate casuists like Albert Jonsen, whose method commits them to the value of consistency in analogically passing from one case to another (G. Dworkin 2006). If a certain general feature (e.g., deception) figured prominently in a paradigm case, if we decided that case the way we did because of the presence of that feature, then, the other key factors being more or less equal, we should decide future cases in a similar fashion. Jonsen's moderate casuistry requires consistency in such cases, and appeals to consistency constitute a reasoned argument offered to those who might initially disagree with our judgment in the instant case. Were Dancy correct, consistency would drop out entirely as a moral reason to do anything, and moral argument would be replaced with the ability to correctly perceive a given set of situational features as “adding up” in just the right way (whatever that is).

In sum, then, the anti-theory position in both its strong casuist and strong particularist incarnations is problematic. Although we can and should learn from the anti-theorist critique, and pay special heed to its insistence upon the importance of particular circumstances for moral judgment, the most uncompromising versions of casuistry and particularism threaten to replace reasoned argument by the delicate and nuanced perceptions of sensitive moral judges. Many will find this to be a deficient or at least incomplete mode of moral justification.

6. Towards a “theory modest” bioethics: Defining “theory” down

Having duly noted the appeal and shortcomings both of high moral theory and of particularist anti-theory, it is time to move toward a more plausible middle ground marking the intersection of bioethics and philosophical theory. Is there then a role for theory in bioethics, and, if so, what kinds of theory?

6.1 Nonideal theory in bioethics

In addition to ideal political theory, which provides us with an objective to aim at, we also need nonideal theory, which takes account of messy realities on the ground in charting a practical course towards that objective. Unlike the ideal theorist, the nonideal theorist must consider whether a proposed policy is:

  • Sufficiently gradual in its proposed transition from a less than fully just society to a more just state of affairs. For example, does it abruptly pull the rug out from under people who have heretofore reasonably relied on less than fully just social practices in ordering their lives? (Simmons, 2010)
  • Likely to be effective as part of a strategy towards the elimination of injustice.
  • Politically acceptable—e.g., a single-payer health system might be ideally just and efficient, but will it be acceptable to the public and the wide variety of powerful interest groups within a particular country?
  • Directed at remedying those social injustices with the greatest priority. (Simmons 2010, Powers-Faden 2006)

Notwithstanding its manifest importance for practical ethics, there has been relatively little self-conscious scholarly work on nonideal justice theory in either political philosophy or bioethics. The need for such theorizing is perhaps most obvious and compelling in the area of global bioethics, where biomedical research is conducted against a backdrop of appalling disparities between rich and poor nations. What norms should govern the conduct of international research (and post-trial access to benefits flowing therefrom) when the subjects of such research often lack access to even the most rudimentary forms of health care and public health? Should a single ethical standard representing perfect justice be applied within rich and poor nations alike (Macklin 2004)? Or will the attempt to impose rules required by perfect justice backfire, making the worst off even worse off than they might have been under policies that acknowledged the need to recognize and compensate for past and present injustices (Wertheimer forthcoming)?

One important exception to the neglect of nonideal theory within bioethics is provided by the work of Madison Powers and Ruth Faden (2006). In developing a theory of social justice for deployment in the areas of health care and public health, these authors begin with an account of human well being, similar to the capabilities approach of Sen and Nussbaum, but then insist that unjust inequalities provide the real world context in which questions of justice arise for us. For them, the “job of justice” in our nonideal world is to figure out how basic social structures act independently or, more usually, in combination to thwart the development of human well-being. Determining priorities for health care and public health requires both normative and empirical studies bearing on the cumulative effects of various structural inequalities on prospects for human flourishing, and thus cannot be accomplished within the ambit of standard-brand ideal theories of justice.

6.2 Nonideal modalities of argument

Bioethics should also be nonideal in terms of its assumptions about those who are engaged in the public bioethical discussion. As we saw above in Sec. 3.4, there is potential tension between the quest for truth in philosophical theory and the requirements of democracy. The reasons we offer in favor of our basic social arrangements must not be so esoteric and technical that citizens of average intelligence and normal capacities cannot comprehend them. Democracy requires comprehensible rationales for its basic norms as a matter of respect for each person. “Rule by experts” is undemocratic insofar as it fails to show such respect.

Although this kind of publicity argument is perhaps strongest when it comes to justifying and articulating the basic rules of social cooperation, what Rawls called the “basic structure” of society, it also plausibly extends to the full range of issues that encompass the field of bioethics. Patients, families, potential research subjects, health care providers, public health officials, and the public itself generally lack both the specialized intellectual skills of philosophical theoreticians and the time and inclination to develop such skills; yet, as members of a democratic polity, all those engaged in the activities of medicine, nursing, biomedical research, and public health deserve a set of policies whose respective rationales can be explained to them in language that they can understand (London 2001). This is yet another reason why clinical and policy-oriented bioethics should not be grounded in some versions of high philosophical theory. Just as theorists must take account of various nonideal factors, such as the existence of deeply entrenched social inequalities within society as we know it, so too must we take account of the fact that most people in society lack the time, inclination, and perhaps the intellectual aptitude to engage in rigorous philosophical theorizing. The intellectual moorings of public bioethics should, then, be sought primarily in modes of thought and policy analysis that are more down to earth and publicly accessible. Further, deeper justifications in terms of esoteric philosophical theory would, of course, be welcome, but only insofar as they remained consistent in principle with public “mid-level” justifications of the same policies.

6.3 Convergence on method

It is no accident, then, that since its inception in the 1960s and ‘70s, the field of bioethics has largely eschewed both high moral theory and direct application of ideal political philosophy. Instead, most of the contributors to this field, including most bioethicist-philosophers, have embraced one or more methods designed, in the clumsy but accurate phrase of Cass Sunstein (1996), to facilitate “incompletely theorized agreements” on moral problems in medicine, public health, and biomedical research. These mid-level methods include the principlism of Beauchamp and Childress; the casuistry of Jonsen and Baruch Brody; the focus on “narrative ethics” and interpretive techniques championed by Howard Brody (2002), Katherine Montgomery (Hunter) (1991), and Rita Charon (2006); the virtue ethics of Pellegrino (1993) and Drane (1995; the pragmatism of Frank Miller and Joseph Fins (1996); and the feminism of Margaret Little (1996), Susan Sherwin (2008) and many others.[9] Although casuistry, narrative, virtue ethics, pragmatism, and feminism first emerged in contemporary debates as challengers to the regnant method of principlism during the 1980s and-90s, each claiming supremacy over both principlism and other methods, the boundaries between these rival methodologies have blurred significantly in the intervening years, so much so that all of these methods might now be said to be mutually complementary, non-exclusive modes of moral inquiry for doing ethics in the public domain. (Beauchamp 1995, Arras 2007)

The convergence of all these initially rival methodologies into a widely shared mid-level approach to bioethical problems has been facilitated by two developments in the literature. First, each faction has made a convincing case for its particular methodological emphasis. This has required each approach to acknowledge or incorporate elements drawn from other methodologies and, accordingly, to soften its claims to methodological supremacy. For example, the casuistry of Jonsen and Toulmin arose as a robust particularist challenge to the principlism of Beauchamp and Childress. They took the latter to task for the abstractness and deductivism allegedly on display in early editions of the Principles of Biomedical Ethics, arguing instead for a case-based, “bottom up” approach to ethics that resembled the Anglo-American common law both in its emphasis upon concrete particulars and in its conception of principles as emerging from our engagement with cases. This challenge led Beauchamp and Childress to concede the important role of particularized case judgments in the identification and specification of moral principles. Following this critical exchange, the avatars of an allegedly deductive principlism acknowledged a two-way relationship between moral principles and case judgments. Conversely, the exchange with principlism led the proponents of casuistry to soften their initial claims that bioethics should be theory free and that principles only played a heuristic (but not justificatory) role in moral judgment. Both sides emerged from this confrontation agreeing upon a critical role for ethical principles and maxims, and upon a constructive role for case judgments in the development and refinement of principles. The differences between these rival methodologies now appeared to be more a matter of emphasis than of principle (or the lack thereof) (Kuczewski 1998).

6.4 Converging on reflective equilibrium

The second major development leading to a convergence on a theory-modest method within bioethics was the widespread adoption of reflective equilibrium as a widely shared method of moral justification (Arras 2007). Initially deployed by Rawls in the design of his contractualist “original position” in political philosophy, this method attempts to harmonize all the elements contributing to moral judgment, including intuitions about cases, moral principles, moral theories, and background theories of moral agency and social organization. Reflective equilibrium is “holistic” and non-foundationalist insofar as it emphasizes the importance of all these disparate elements fitting together in a satisfactory way. In contrast to earlier methodological formulations within bioethics that gave foundational status to, say, moral principles or intuitions about paradigm cases, reflective equilibrium finds justification through the coherence of all these elements, each of which impinges on all the others in a multi-directional dialectic. To simplify just a bit, principles and moral theories function within this method to organize, explain, criticize, and extend our intuitive responses to cases, but those very responses can, in turn, help us to amend and sharpen our principles and theories when they prove inadequate to the complexities of emerging cases.

One important implication of adopting the method of reflective equilibrium is a blurring of the allegedly sharp boundary between practical ethics and ethical theory. Indeed, one common rationale for inquiring into the relationship between bioethics and ethical theory is the widespread presumption that these two activities must operate within entirely different spheres: ethical theory addresses fundamental questions at a high level, divorced from the messy reality of everyday practice, while bioethics is thought merely to apply the ready-made findings of ethical theory to practical problems. If we are guided by a holistic method like reflective equilibrium, however, we should expect theory to shed critical light on our responses to cases, but we should also expect reflection on cases to shape the sort of principles and theory we eventually develop. Ethical reflection is a two-way street (Beauchamp 1984, Brock 1996).

Reflective equilibrium can, however, be interpreted in two different ways, each of which yields a different gloss on the relationship between bioethics and moral theory (Arras 2007). On a narrow reading, reflective equilibrium encompasses our intuitions about cases and the moral principles we use to explain, organize, critique, and extend such intuitions. According to some philosopher-bioethicists, the complete set (so far) of intuitions and principles in equilibrium just is what we should mean by “moral theory” (DeGrazia 1996, B. Brody 1988). Accordingly denominated “narrow reflective equilibrium” (NRE), this gloss accounts for much scholarly and critical commentary within bioethics. One salient example was on display in the famous “Baby Doe” controversy of the mid-1980s in which the Reagan Justice Department attempted to impose a “non-discrimination principle” upon health care workers in neonatal intensive care units. Subsequent commentary debated the appropriateness of applying a principle governing discrimination against racial minorities and women in education, jobs, and housing to decisions to terminate medical care for some extremely ill or malformed newborns. Many physicians and bioethicists contended that the nondiscrimination principle was far too blunt an instrument to do justice to such enormously delicate and complex cases, and sought to amend the moral principles governing such cases in a way that would capture such complexity (Rhoden and Arras 1985).

On a much broader and ambitious reading, reflective equilibrium encompasses not just sets of intuitive responses to cases and matching moral principles, but also a reasoned choice among the full panoply of live options in moral and political theory, as well as background theories of human agency, personhood, and the workings of social systems (Daniels 1996). The rationale for buttressing NRE with these additional moral, political and social theories is that a relatively narrow focus upon our most confident intuitions and the principles that organize and explain them could engender an uncritical provincialism in our moral outlook. As the computer scientists put it, “Garbage in, garbage out.”[10] If many of our basic, most confidently held moral intuitions are eventually rejected by subsequent generations as fatally flawed—see, e.g., once dominant views denying social equality to women, minorities, and gays—a moral system based upon such intuitions might also be fatally flawed. Hence the need to supplement our intuitions and organizing principles with the best moral, political, and social theories we can muster. Holding our intuitions, principles and corrective theories together in one coherent body of beliefs amounts to “wide reflective equilibrium” (WRE).

Since both narrow and wide reflective equilibrium posit a relationship characterized by mutual dependency and critical tension among our intuitions, principles, and theories, both methods would effectively blur the alleged dichotomy between moral theory and practical ethics. By engaging in practical ethics via reflective equilibrium of any sort, we are already thereby engaging in a form of ethical theorizing, albeit perhaps at a lower level of abstraction than traditional high theory. But because WRE would have us choose among various live options in moral and social theory, it would yield a different kind of relationship between bioethics and theory. By incorporating a reasoned choice among various moral and social theories as part of its method of justification, WRE might provide independent theoretical discipline to our intuitions and moral principles,[11] but it does so at the cost of vastly enlarging our methodological ambitions and the complexity of the task at hand. Rather than simply redefining “theory” as the modest result of NRE, WRE requires a robust, critical role for many kinds of traditional moral, political, and social theories in constraining the results of NRE, such as those reached at the level of fields like bioethics.

Although WRE might well be the optimal method for the ultimate justification of our moral judgments—i.e., the optimal method for Dworkin's Hercules—two problems loom for it as a method of moral inquiry in practical ethics. First, if WRE requires reasoned choices among various live options in moral, political and social theory, this will no doubt reintroduce many of the problems we have already canvassed with regard to using high moral theory in bioethics. Were the constraints of WRE taken seriously by practitioners of bioethics, we would have to postpone judgment on the particular case or policy question before us until we had reached closure on the best theories governing ethics, politics, and social organization. Needless to say, this could result in a very long delay. It would also be a contentious delay, since the likelihood of achieving widespread agreement on any version of high theory would be low. WRE would most likely reintroduce the same social fissures at the level of theory that we have already witnessed at the level of intuitions and moral principles (Arras 2007).

Second, the most credible and philosophically sophisticated glosses on WRE have literally nothing to say about exactly how we should go about making choices from among the various live options in political, moral, and social theory. They don't give us criteria for judging what an optimal theory would look like, and they therefore make no effort to rank the various theories against one another. In other words, the criteria for choosing among various theories would have to be drawn from sources outside the ambit of WRE, which, in turn, casts doubt upon its potential as a stand-alone method of moral and political thought, at least at the level of practice.

6.4.1 The role of mid-level theories

The field of bioethics has been fertile ground for the development of relatively modest, mid-level theories on a vast range of topics. In contrast to the vaulting structures so disfavored by Annette Baier—i.e., grand theories held together by one or two norms placed as keystones—most mid-level theorizing in bioethics more closely resembles what Baier calls a “mosaic” approach to theory-building, which starts closer to the ground and erects, brick by brick, theoretical structures of modest scope (1994). Another illuminating metaphor for this kind of theorizing is Claude Lévi-Strauss's notion of “bricolage,” i.e., working by hand at odd jobs with whatever resources happen to be available within a repertoire of inherited tools and assorted bric-a-brac. Whereas Lévi-Strauss viewed the bricoleur as a good example of the so-called “savage mind,” in contrast with the modern mind-set of the engineer, Jeffrey Stout has plausibly argued that every work of moral philosophy, great or modest, involves some degree of bricolage. Like the handyman surrounded by a garage full of tools accumulated for past purposes, the moral philosopher takes stock of the problem at hand, surveys her shelves for available conceptual resources, and then attempts to solve the problem by taking things apart, reordering, culling out, weighing, specifying, splicing in, and putting them all back together. (Stout 1988, p. 75) Philosophers in bioethics are bricoleurs par excellence.

Theories of limited scope, built up from materials at hand, play an important conceptual and normative function in debates over abortion and euthanasia (Dworkin 1993) and over such pivotal concepts as “coercion,” “commodification,” “harm,” and “exploitation” in the broad areas of research and reproductive ethics. In response to a good deal of sloppy criticism of new reproductive technologies and research in developing countries, usually claiming that various practices should be morally condemned for allegedly being harmful, coercive or exploitative, words that seem to have become all-purpose terms of abuse for disfavored practices, philosophers have engaged in fruitful mid-level theorizing about the meaning and moral import of such concepts. Most often, this kind of theorizing gets done without any appeals to ultimate high-level moral theory. It begins by taking stock of a problem at hand; the theorist then looks around for available conceptual resources for shedding light on it. Sometimes those resources will be culled from high theory (e.g., the Kantian notion of respect for persons or Parfit's non-identity problem), but more often than not they will be inspired by philosophers such as Joel Feinberg (1984–1988) and Alan Wertheimer (forthcoming), who do not wear their ultimate philosophical allegiances on their respective sleeves. The analysis grows out of attentive descriptions of ordinary linguistic usage and common moral and legal responses to various situations, and then proceeds to ask exactly what it is about harmful, coercive or exploitative behaviors that should merit our moral disapprobation, and under what circumstances (Emanuel and Hawkins 2008). This kind of theorizing is both unavoidable and indispensible in a field like bioethics, and it has done much to clarify and advance often heretofore muddled public debates; but it need not claim allegiance to any particular denomination of high moral theory.

Another important example of this kind of modest theorizing is provided by philosophical reflections on the theme of “equal opportunity” as related to the allocation of health care and the social determinants of health (Daniels 2007). Although Norman Daniels's influential account of “just health” is obviously inspired by Rawlsian political theory, and although his particular gloss on equal opportunity also happened to be favored by Rawls, Daniels notes that one need not be a Rawlsian to agree with his theory. All that is required to reach his conclusions, he suggests, is a robust principle of equal opportunity, one that is compatible with a variety of political theories and finds broad (though not universal) acceptance in society at large.

Mid-level theorizing about equal opportunity also plays a prominent role in important contemporary debates about social policy on disability and the ethics of genetic enhancement . The latter topic is especially interesting because it provides us with a good example of how bioethics can pose a constructive challenge to traditional understandings in ethical-political theory and, thus, a good example of how influence between bioethics and theory runs in both directions. As Daniels and his colleagues have demonstrated, the advent of genetic technologies and the promise of direct intervention on the human genome raise a host of interesting challenges to our standard notions of equal opportunity (Buchanan et al. 2000). Now that our basic human capabilities are slowly becoming matters of deliberate choice rather than the random results of the genetic lottery, we suddenly become morally responsible for possible actions or omissions available to us. Should we restrict our understanding of equality of opportunity to those standard deficiencies in the social structure (e.g., sexism, racism) that inhibit people from enjoying opportunities for schooling, employment, housing, etc.? Or should we expand the demands of equal opportunity under the aegis of the new genetics to include the possession of a normal (or perhaps enhanced) human genome? If some people enjoy lesser life prospects due to lesser intelligence or an unsightly appearance, why not intervene directly through genetic or surgical technologies so as to even things out?

Many additional examples of helpful mid-level theorizing in bioethics could be adduced and discussed at length here, but space precludes a leisurely, comprehensive inventory. I shall, then, limit myself here to just flagging several especially salient examples and encouraging interested readers to consult the supplementary document A Taxonomy of Theoretical Work in Bioethics, where many more examples of theory in bioethics are cited and discussed.

  • Reflections on the nature and moral import of informed consent to medical treatment and participation in research (Miller and Wertheimer 2009, Manson and O'Neill 2007, Blustein et al. 1999).
  • Roles of family in medical decision making (Nelson and Nelson 1995).
  • Theories focused on the ethics of research with human subjects and the pivotal concept of “clinical equipoise” (Freedman 1987, Weijer 2003, Miller 2004, London 2007, Wertheimer forthcoming).
  • Accounts of justice in international research ethics, bearing on what researchers from developed nations owe to individuals and communities at research sites in the developing world (Emanuel 2003, Macklin 2004, Pogge 2008, London 2005, Wertheimer forthcoming).
  • Theories of suffering in the context of end-of-life care (Cassell 1991).
  • Accounts of personal identity and precedent autonomy developed in the context of debates over the force of advance directives and terminal care (Dworkin 1993, Dresser 1989, Rhoden 1988, Buchanan and Brock 1989).
  • Theorizing on priorities in health care allocation, focusing on the prospects and limits of cost-effectiveness analysis (Brock, 2004).
  • Debates over the allocation of organs and their possible commodification (Childress 1996, Murray 1996).
  • Philosophical reflection on the moral status of embryos in the context of controversies surrounding abortion, embryo research, and parental responsibilities for offspring (Steinbock 1996, Robertson 1996, Glover 2006).
  • development of a “population-based” ethic for public health. (Powers and Faden 2006, Anand et al., 2006, Jennings and Arras 2010, Battin et al. 2009).
  • Feminist theories of abortion and reproductive technologies (Little 2003, Sherwin 2008).
  • Reflection on the ethics of enhancing human traits through genetic manipulation (Glover 2006, Buchanan 2010, Green 2007, Harris 2007, President's Council 2003).

7. Conclusion

Again, what's theory to bioethics, and bioethics to theory? As we have seen all-too-well by now, there is no short answer to this question. Everything depends upon how we characterize bioethics (i.e., as clinical, policy-oriented, or academic), and how we understand theory: i.e., as high, vaulting theory, mid-level theorizing tailored to specific problems, the result (or an element) of reflective equilibrium, and so on. I suspect that the paradigm of high theory inspires (or haunts) most anguished inquiries into the relationship between practical ethics, including bioethics, and philosophical/moral theory. But once we realize (1) that high theory, especially in its non-pluralistic forms, is a spectacularly ill-suited medium for bioethical reflection in the clinic and policy circles, and (2) that ideal political theory, while providing us perhaps with a description of Paradise Island, doesn't provide us with a map telling us how to get there under nonideal conditions, then it becomes clear that nonideal, mid-level theorizing is the site of the philosophical action in bioethics and related fields.[12] Understood in this more modest sense, “theory” is a completely natural and should be an entirely uncontroversial element of bioethics or of any practical ethical reflection. Indeed, it's hard to imagine what the field would look like without it.

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Other Internet Resources

  • Theoretical Medicine and Bioethics, a good journal that regularly features papers on theory in bioethics.
  • Ethics Matters, resources on ethics hosted by Lawrence Hinman (U. San Diego).
  • Ethics, by James Fieser (U. Tennessee/Martin), in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Related Entries

ethics: virtue | feminist (interventions): ethics | metaethics | moral particularism | personal identity | reflective equilibrium

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