Supplement to Theory and Bioethics

A Taxonomy of Theoretical Work in Bioethics

For those who wish to delve deeper into the subject of theory in bioethics, I offer here a discursive taxonomy of the various sorts of inquiries that might plausibly be labeled “theoretical” within the big tent of bioethics. Rather than attempting a serviceable definition of theory—or a list of reliable criteria—up front, we'll review a number of theoretical inquiries in bioethics and list en passant whatever crucial defining features they might suggest.

1. Rooting out bad theory

There is a use for theory that even the most anti-theoretical commentators have endorsed: viz., countering all the bad, implicit theory that infects so much public discussion of bioethical matters. Even if we follow Robert Fullinwider's (2007) advice to eschew theory in favor of common morality, actual social practices and institutional norms as our primary sources of practical moral reasoning, we will surely find, as Fullinwider warns, that those very practices and norms are riddled with “bad theory” or “metaphysical baloney” of all kinds, much of it stemming from provincial social attitudes and uncritical religious beliefs.[13] Since cataloguing the vast expanse of bad metaphysics and moral theory embedded in past bioethical debates would itself require an entire encyclopedia entry, I will limit myself here to just a couple of examples, chosen more or less at random.

Cost-effectiveness analysis. Although there is no doubt that cost effectiveness analysis (CEA) can be an extremely useful tool or adjunct in setting health care priorities, there is plenty of reason to be skeptical when CEA operates, as it often does in health policy circles, as unquestioned dogma regarding the sole proper criterion for allocating of health resources. As a direct offshoot of welfare economics and ultimately of utilitarian moral theory, CEA is premised on the notion that justice in the distribution of health-related goods is equivalent to the maximization of benefits or, more colloquially put, to getting the most bang for the health care buck. While such formulations have the ring of common sense about them, and while economists often write and speak as though there were no rational alternatives to CEA (Eddy 1996), philosophers know all-too-well that utilitarian theories of justice are highly controversial at best, and fatally flawed at worst. By focusing exclusively on the maximization of benefits, no matter the fairness of their distribution, utilitarian theory ignores other factors, such as claims of equity on behalf of worst off groups, that many people regard as highly relevant to just outcomes. In this case, the proper response to bad (or at least controversial) theory is not to banish theory from bioethics, but rather to propose a better theory, one that directly addresses issues of equity or fairness in the distribution of goods. (Brock 2004)

(b) Muddled distinctions. During the emergence of contemporary bioethics, decisions to forego life-sustaining treatments were often framed by doctors, lawyers and the public at large in terms of well-worn distinctions between ordinary vs. extraordinary treatments, actions vs. omissions, and killing vs. letting die. Physicians often justified their actions (e.g., withdrawing a ventilator or feeding tube) on the ground that a particular treatment constituted an “extraordinary means;” and in response to worries that withholding or withdrawal a tube might kill the patient, they often claimed that they were “merely omitting” to do something, rather than doing something illicit. But as a devastating report, drafted by philosophers, showed in 1983, such distinctions were inherently vague and tended to focus on morally irrelevant features of such cases (President's Commission 1983). When a physician pulls a feeding tube, is she “merely omitting” to do something, which would presumably be licit, or is she actually doing something, i.e., removing the tube, which would presumably be illicit? Apart from this sort of terminal vagueness, philosophers helpfully pointed out that the moral permissibility of such life and death decisions should rest, not on such metaphysically dubious and morally irrelevant distinctions, but rather, inter alia, on the likely impact of a proposed treatment (or treatment withdrawal) on the patient's overall well-being.

2. Normative theory

2.1 Normative Ethical Theory

The most obvious example of theoretical work in bioethics fits under the traditional rubric of “normative ethical theory.” The point of this kind of theoretical work is most often to justify one's judgments bearing on the rightness or wrongness of various individual actions or social policies. Should Doctor Dan lie to his patient in order to facilitate her recovery or induce her to accept what he regards as beneficial surgery? Should the various states legally permit physician-assisted suicide? Who should have first priority on scarce vaccines in the face of pandemic influenza?

If we rule out the use of force in imposing answers to such questions, we must engage in the social practice of offering, accepting, and criticizing what we take to be good reasons for our judgments bearing on actions and social policies. While appeals to common sense and standard practices will suffice most of the time, we are often driven to higher levels of moral discourse in order to give a satisfactory justification of our judgments in the face of disagreement and controversy. In working out solutions to the three practical questions posed above, we might begin to wonder about the weight that should be given to consequences versus that given to various commonsensical but non-consequentialist moral obligations, such as truth-telling, respecting human life, or human equality. In doing so, we are already fully engaged in the project of normative ethical theory building. Typical examples of such theory in bioethics include consequentialism in its various incarnations, including utilitarianism (Singer 1999); contractualism, including Rawlsian theories of justice (Rawls 1971/1999; Kantian-style deontology (Donagan 1977), and libertarian political thought (Engelhardt 1996).

2.2 Virtue ethics

Apart from setting out the grounds and scope of moral our obligations and of ethically permissible conduct and policy, normative ethics also deals with questions bearing on what kind of people we should be. Instead of focusing on the grounds and criteria of right and wrong conduct (i.e., the what of ethics), virtue ethics focuses on the quality of moral agency (or the who of ethics). This variety of ethical theory ponders the nature of the virtues and their manifestation in virtuous moral agents. In bioethics, virtue ethics has often focused on the virtues of the good physician or nurse, including conscientiousness, technical skill, empathy, courage, truthfulness, dedication to the patient's good, and justice (Pellegrino 1993, Drane 1995).

2.3 High moral theory

Normative ethical theories vary considerably in terms of their aspirations towards generalization, universality, abstractness, systematic organization, simplicity, and comprehensiveness (Nussbaum 2000, Flynn 2007). Paradigmatic examples of what we'll call “high moral theory” attempt to embody most or all of these defining characteristics. Thus classical utilitarianism, Kantian deontology, and Rawlsian justice as fairness, for example, all strive for the articulation of a theoretical system based upon a small number of abstract fundamental principles (e.g., Mill's principle of utility, Kant's categorical imperative, and Rawls's famous two principles of justice) that they regard as the “keys” to understanding the moral or political life. These principles in their pristine incarnations are capable of being articulated in a perfectly general and universal fashion without any reference to or dependency upon any particular social practices or cultural norms. They apply, so their authors tell us, to all rational agents as such.[14] Beginning from these highly abstract and universally binding moral norms, standard examples of high moral theory ramify into complex systems encompassing basic and derivative moral principles (e.g., respect the autonomy of rational agents), rules based upon such principles (e.g., do not enlist patients in biomedical research without first gaining their informed consent), and, finally, judgments animated by such principles and rules bearing on particular cases (e.g., the Tuskegee syphilis study was unethical).

Although most philosophers might naturally think of such highly abstract and ambitious constructions as paradigmatic examples of moral theory, and most likely have precisely such theories in mind when asked about the relationships between bioethics and ethical theory, they do not exhaust the space of normative theorizing either in bioethics or within the moral life more generally.

2.4 Pluralistic theories

In contrast to typical high, vaulting theory supported by a single keystone, more pluralistic ethical theories also purport to offer normative bases for moral thought but with more broad-based foundations. In addition to the principle of utility or categorical imperative, such theories consist of a set of fairly heterogeneous moral principles or basic capabilities necessary for human flourishing and/or ethical behavior. One classical example of this genre of moral theory can be found in the work of British philosopher W.D. Ross, whose list of so-called prima facie, obligations—fidelity; reparation; gratitude; non-maleficence; justice; beneficence; and self-improvement—clearly anticipated and inspired the dominant “principlist” approach to bioethics championed by Beauchamp and Childress. (Ross 1988, Brody 1988, Frankena 1973)

Importantly, these pluralistic theorists generally refrain from endorsing an a priori ranking—or, as Rawls puts it, a ‘lexical ordering’—of the various interests, values and principles they articulate. Autonomy, beneficence, and justice, for example, might all figure in our deliberations about a particular issue, but their respective weight or importance can only be determined in medias res, given all the particularities of the case at hand. Gauging which values, principles or rules should determine the result in a particular case is said to require good judgment, practical wisdom, or intuition of some sort.

Another, very different approach to pluralistic normative theory is developed in the related political theories of Martha Nussbaum and A.K. Sen. (Nussbaum 2000, Sen 1999) Instead of plumbing the depths of our common morality for deontological obligations in the manner of Ross, Beauchamp and Childress, Nussbaum offers us a neo-Aristotelian theory of the prerequisites of human well-being or flourishing. In contrast to others within the big Rawlsian tent who would measure progress on achieving equality by focusing on the resources or primary goods held by individuals, both Nussbaum and Sen explicate the “metric of equality” as the measure of what individuals are able “to be and do.” Towards this end, Nussbaum (but not Sen) has developed a list of 10 basic capabilities required for a life that is truly commensurate with human dignity:

  1. Being able to live a life of normal length.
  2. Having adequate bodily health and shelter.
  3. Bodily integrity.
  4. Being able to use one's senses, imagination, and thought; to experience pleasure and avoid pain.
  5. Emotional expression and development.
  6. Practical reason, being able to critically reflect on one's own life, liberty of conscience.
  7. Affiliation with others and possessing equal dignity in society.
  8. Other species. Being able to live with concern for and in relation to animals, plants, and the world of nature.
  9. Play. Being able to laugh, to play, to enjoy recreational activities.
  10. Control over one's environment, both politically and materially.

According to Nussbaum, all of these basic capabilities are crucial prerequisites of human flourishing, and none should be traded away for more of the others. This kind of pluralistic moral/political theory has gained considerable traction in the areas of public health and global bioethics (Powers and Faden 2006).

These pluralistic accounts of normative theory frequently encountered in bioethics usually feature the selective appropriation of various themes or theory fragments borrowed from elements featured in standard high-level theories (Baker and McCullough 2007). The so-called principle of autonomy provides an interesting case in point. As articulated in some of the foundational documents of the contemporary bioethics movement, such as the seminal Belmont Report on the ethics of research with human subjects, and Beauchamp and Childress's Principles of Biomedical Ethics, the principle of autonomy was put to work in the highly successful battle against a well-entrenched medical paternalism that arrogated decision making prerogatives to physicians and biomedical researchers. (President's Commission 1978, Beauchamp and Childress 1977). The interesting thing about this principle of autonomy or “respect for persons” is that it seems to have been cobbled together from a variety of theoretical sources (Beauchamp 2007). Clearly, the principle has unmistakable Kantian overtones. Respect for the moral autonomy of persons is an absolutely fundamental element of Kantian moral theory. But the contemporary understanding of autonomy within the field of bioethics has been distinctly unKantian in its jettisoning of Kant's metaphysics of action and his key distinction between autonomy, defined as allegiance to universal and rational moral law, and heteronomy, defined as the determination of action by “mere” individually defined interests. So in spite of the distinct Kantian flavor of a term like “respect for persons” in the bioethics literature, usually all that remains of the Kantian understanding of autonomy in this field is a broadly defined notion of self-rule or individual choice that is equally compatible with a Millian notion of liberty and with what Kant would have deemed heteronomous springs of action.

Thus, in addition to this Kantian strain in the contemporary bioethical understanding of autonomy, there are distinctly utilitarian or consequentialist motifs borrowed from such works as J.S. Mill's On Liberty and more fully developed by Gerald Dworkin (1972) and Joel Feinberg (1986). One of the bioethicists' strongest arguments against medical paternalism turned out to be the distinctly Millian, rule-utilitarian claim that when it comes to self-regarding choices bearing on medical treatments, paternalistic interventions by physicians will almost always do more harm than good, if not in the short run then at least in the long run as a matter of standard medical practice and social policy. Such fragmentary appropriation of elements drawn from high moral theory is ubiquitous in the field of bioethics.

2.5 Convergence theories

A similarly eclectic approach to high moral theory stresses the convergence of differing theories at the level of action guiding principles. No matter what the differences between, say, utilitarian consequentialism and Kantian deontology at the highest level, it is sometimes claimed that such rival theories will predictably reach the same results both at the level of mid-level principles and at the concrete level of particular judgments. One well-known example of this phenomenon is provided by Beauchamp, who described himself as a rule-utilitarian, and Childress, who described himself as a partisan of religious deontology, in early iterations of their highly influential joint project on the principles of biomedical ethics. Despite their differences at the level of foundational moral theory, both of these philosophers expected their ultimate differences to recede at the level of moral principles, where they could agree, for example, on the importance of the principle of autonomy and its overriding significance in the area of research ethics and the physician-patient relationship, even if their ultimate justifications at the level of high moral theory would tend to diverge (2009, 361-63).

2.6 Common morality theories

Two rival “common morality” theories, elaborated respectively by Beauchamp & Childress and Bernard Gert, currently dominate the field of bioethics (Beauchamp and Childress 2009, Gert 2006, Arras 2009). Whereas pluralistic moral theories are defined in terms of the number and kind of basic moral norms they defend, common morality theories focus on the ultimate source of our principles, rules, and ideals. Both of these approaches trace that source to a common morality supposedly shared by all people of good will. Such theories are, however, also decidedly pluralist insofar as they encompass moral rules, principles and ideals that address a host of disparate consequentialist and deontological moral concerns bearing on killing, lying, beneficence, justice, etc.[15]

Beginning with the third edition of the Principles of Biomedical Ethics, published in 1989, Beauchamp and Childress relocated the source of their mid-level bioethical principles from high philosophical theory to what they have termed ‘‘the common morality.’’ By insisting on the definite article here, they meant to distinguish the wide variety of particular moralities found in different eras, cultures, and professions from their source in a morality that is common, as they put it, to all persons in all times and places who are committed to living a moral life. This morality encompasses both rules of obligation (e.g., do not kill or cause suffering for others, tell the truth, keep promises, do not steal, prevent evil or harm from occurring, rescue persons in danger, do not punish the innocent, obey the law, treat all persons with equal moral consideration, etc.) and standards of moral character, such as nonmalevolence, honesty, integrity, truthfulness, fidelity, lovingness, and kindness.

Beauchamp and Childress assert that the content of the common morality is dictated by the primary objectives of morality, which include the amelioration of human misery, the avoidance of premature death, and the predictable consequences of indifference, conflict, hostility, scarce resources, limited information, and so on. Adhering to the norms of the common morality is necessary, Beauchamp claims, “to counteract the tendency for the quality of people's lives to worsen or for social relationships to disintegrate” (Beauchamp 2003, p. 261).

The moral authority of the common morality is thus established, according to Beauchamp and Childress, neither by means of ethical theory nor by means of a priori reasoning or reflection on the meaning of moral terms; rather, moral normativity is established historically or pragmatically through the success of these norms in all times and places in advancing the cause of human flourishing. Their account is thus historicist, but unlike most historicisms it does not embrace moral relativism. The norms of the common morality, they insist, are universally binding.

Providing a mere thumbnail sketch of Bernard Gert's approach to common morality will prove to be a much more daunting task because, in contrast to Beauchamp and Childress, Gert's primary contribution to ethics and practical ethics just is his account of common morality. More specifically, Gert begins with a conception of the point and purpose of morality, which then yields the descriptive core of common morality, including lists of the various moral rules and moral ideals, and a decision procedure for determining when it is justified to violate any of the moral rules. This descriptive core is then shored up by Gert's theory of common morality, which attempts to provide a justification for the entire edifice. Although Gert concedes that his particular theory of common morality might well be problematic in various ways, although he doubts it, he insists that his account of the descriptive content of common morality is both true and universally embraced by all rational persons. For Gert, then, the point of ‘‘doing ethics’’ is not to come up with some nifty new theory of morality, but rather to provide a faithful descriptive and interpretive rendering of the moral rules, ideals, and decision procedures that we all share. Borrowing a page from Wittgenstein, Gert declares that his account changes nothing in common morality, which does not change over time, leaving its central precepts and decision procedures in place and intact (Gert 2004, p. 4).

Gert begins his account with the claim that the whole point and purpose of morality is to lessen the amount of evil or harm suffered in the world [2004, p. 26], a goal similar to that posited by Beauchamp and Childress. He then dips into a quasi-Hobbesian account of human nature, arguing that beings like us—i.e., vulnerable, mortal, rational, and fallible (p. 8)—would favor adopting common morality as a public system that impartially applied to everyone. The content of common morality consists of moral rules and moral ideals. Given the point of morality, all ten of the rules (a Decalogue!) proscribe actions that either directly cause harm, (e.g., killing, lying, causing pain, disabling, depriving of freedom or pleasure) or tend to produce harmful results (e.g., do not deceive, break promises, cheat, disobey the law, or fail to do your duty). Whereas the moral rules categorically prohibit violations (unless sufficient reasons can be provided), the moral ideals merely encourage people to prevent or relieve the sorts of harms covered by the rules.

In what sense are the common morality approaches of Beauchamp-Childress and Gert moral theories? While the former have not abandoned their belief that their principles of biomedical ethics could be derived from disparate but converging high level theories (2009, 361-63), they now stress the origin of their principles in ordinary, universally shared moral beliefs rather than in some special moral sensibility, pure reason, rationality, natural rights, or some grand normative ethical theory. Echoing Rawls's comment on the pivotal role of so-called “considered moral judgments,” Beauchamp and Childress now consider any conflicts between common morality and moral theory to tell against the credibility of the theory.[16] Taking this common morality as a given of human history and experience, Beauchamp-Childress are prepared to defend its principles on pragmatic grounds and to deploy those same principles in concrete moral and policy analyses through a process of increasing specification and balancing. Although they thus distance themselves from theory as a source of ultimate justification for their working principles, they still refer to their position as a “common morality theory” in order to distinguish it from other fundamental approaches to bioethics.

As for Gert, he too regards the repository of common morality to be a given of sorts. All people committed to the spirit of morality will, he asserts, agree on the basic rules and ideals embedded in common morality. And like Beauchamp and Childress, Gert does not found the tenets of common morality upon any of the usual moral theories, about which he tends to be fairly dismissive. On the other hand, Gert regards the elaboration, interpretation, and systematic defense of the common morality to be his own contribution to philosophical theory.

2.7 Normative theories of limited scope

Another more modest version of normative theory (compared to high theory) includes theories of relatively narrow scope and ambition, focused upon particular problems or recurring themes. In contrast to common conceptions of high theory, which envision it as perched on a shelf, more or less already fully articulated and awaiting any and all applications to particular moral problems, some normative theories grow out of particular struggles with particular moral problems and thus have a more limited scope than more paradigmatic normative theories, such as utilitarianism or deontology. In attempting to characterize his own very creative approach to the linked problems of abortion and euthanasia, Ronald Dworkin (a frequent contributor to the bioethical literature, even if not a bioethicist malgré lui) refers to his own approach alternatively as a theory developed from the inside of these moral problems, as a theory “made for the occasion” rather than prefabricated, a theory, in short, tailored on Saville Row rather than mass produced on Seventh Avenue. Thus, instead of invoking various familiar moral theories bearing on liberty and autonomy, Dworkin develops a theory of value focused upon clashing views of the “sacredness” of human life as manifested in debates over abortion and euthanasia (Dworkin 1993). As we saw in the main body of this entry (Sec. 6), a wide variety of mid-level theories of limited scope constitute perhaps the greatest theoretical contribution of philosophy to bioethics.

3. Metaethical theory

Although most theorizing in bioethics falls squarely under the heading of normative ethical theory—i.e., substantive accounts of what is good, virtuous, obligatory, etc.—theoretical issues of another kind, i.e., so-called “metaethical” concerns, often lurk in the background. These deeper, more fundamental questions have traditionally encompassed controversies surrounding the very point and purpose of ethics, the meanings of ethical terms (e.g., “right” and “good”), what it means to hold an ethical view (i.e., do ethical judgments merely express subjective preferences?), the objectivity of moral judgments and the possibility of ethical truth, and how we might best justify our moral judgments.

Although most working stiff practical ethicists manage to get through their careers without bothering too much about the debate between metaethical internalists and externalists—i.e., whether there is an internal, necessary connection between one's moral beliefs about doing X and one's corresponding motivations regarding the doing of X—some distinctly metaethical questions are harder to avoid, even within a practical field like bioethics. For example, one very fundamental and much discussed question in bioethics has to do with the sources and limits of moral justification. According to one influential view, our actions or policies are morally justified insofar as they are validated by some moral principle or other, but rival metaethical views contend, for example, that moral justification is achieved, not by appealing to principles alone, but rather by appeal to various paradigm cases, as in casuistry, or to the harmonious totality of our intuitions, rules, principles, moral theories, and background social theories (i.e., reflective equilibrium). Thus, the entire debate among bioethicists concerning the respective merits and demerits of various methods of conducting bioethical inquiry—including principlism, narrative, casuistry, and reflective equilibrium—is itself an unavoidable metaethical question. Indeed, the entire present essay is itself an extended metaethical exercise.

Another important metaethical issue concerns the very possibility of ethical truth, objectivity, or justification within the sphere of secular bioethics. H. Tristram Engelhardt, Jr. has argued forcefully, if not entirely convincingly, that there is quite simply no canonical articulation or ordering of values in the secular, public square, and thus that there can be no foundational public bioethics based upon content-full conceptions of things like dignity, equality, or liberty (1996). Because we cannot agree on such fundamental matters in our so-called “post-Christian,” “postmodern” age, contends Engelhardt, most of contemporary bioethics, and especially those views that aspire to articulate and justify our “common morality,” are essentially fraudulent. Worse yet, he claims, the state or medical profession cannot act upon the edicts of contemporary bioethics without violating the autonomy or dignity of all those (usually flinty, contrarian, well off Texans) who happen to disagree with today's bien pensant bioethicists. Were it convincing, Engelhardt's metaethical theory thus would have important normative theoretical consequences—for example, we would all have to be libertarians “by default.”

4. Metaphysical theories

For all of its emphasis on down-to-earth practice, bioethics harbors a number of explicitly metaphysical controversies that ultimately play important roles in normative argument. Unsurprisingly, many of these controversies arise on the borderlands between life and death. The problem of abortion poses the question, “When, exactly, does a full-fledged human being or ‘person’ with the full panoply of human rights come into being?” At the other end of life's journey, we ask, “When, exactly, does a person die?”, and in order to address this question, we need to proffer a definition of death itself. Is death best defined in terms of the human organism or rather in terms of the person's ability to reason or her embodied brain? Although some might prefer to finesse such difficult questions by appealing straightaway to more tractable normative arguments bearing, respectively, on harms to women stemming from illegal abortions or the diminished value of life in a persistent vegetative state, a satisfactory account of such issues will require an explicitly metaphysical examination of the nature of being human and of personal identity (DeGrazia 2005, McMahan 2003).

Bioethics is thus fraught with important metaphysical debates that simply cannot be finessed by appeals to common sense or institutional practices. In addition to the well-worn metaphysical debates over moral status and personhood, so prevalent in the literature on abortion and brain death, the theme of personal identity plays an important role across a number of fronts in bioethics, including debates over advance directives and reproductive ethics. One particularly interesting and important contribution involves the deployment of Derek Parfit's so-called “non-identity problem” in the context of reproductive ethics (Parfit 1986). Critics of various reproductive technologies (such as cloning, surrogate parenting, and in vitro fertilization) often claim that such controversial techniques can result in harms to the children conceived with their assistance and, thus, should either be banned or highly regulated. Such harms might include various birth defects, the sequelae of premature birth, social stigma, or the psychological damage associated with being a clone or an object of commercial transaction between contracting parents and surrogates (President's Council 2002). As Parfit has shown, such allegations often assume a standard account of harm according to which an action adversely affects the welfare of a single, enduring, identifiable person—for example, a mother's heavy drinking might engender severe neurological deficits in her developing fetus, which would otherwise have enjoyed normal health.

But what are we to make of reproductive choices that will determine the very identities of the children they usher into existence? For such children (e.g., those born as a direct result of standard surrogacy arrangements or IVF) the choice isn't between a future threatened by possible psychological or physical harms and another perfectly “normal” future without such harms; rather, assuming arguendo that there are psychological and somatic risks involved in these new reproductive technologies, the choice regarding the child is either for a life with a risk of some harm versus no life at all. A decision on the part of worried parents to opt for standard coital reproduction rather than surrogacy or IVF would bring a different child, with a different identity, into being. Thus, if Parfit is correct, we cannot say that a child suffering from psychological or physical burdens resulting from her high tech conception has been harmed by being brought into existence. We might still want to say that the parents of such a child acted irresponsibly, assuming the controversial premise that the risks of harm were indeed high, but we cannot do so on the ground that the reproductive arrangement harmed the child, who owed her very existence to it. Although the alternative account we give of such parental irresponsibility will no doubt depend upon a normative moral theory—e.g., the parents have brought an excessive amount of needless suffering into the world (Brock 1995)—the need for an alternative explanation is demonstrated by Parfit's expressly metaphysical argument.

To summarize the main results of this brief typology: (1) The field of bioethics is saturated with theories of different sorts (normative, metaethical, and metaphysical) that exhibit different levels of generality and comprehensiveness. (2) Invocations of theory in bioethics will be more or less appropriate depending upon the particular level of bioethical practice in play—for example, whether one is engaging in a clinical consult, advising a hospital committee or public ethics commission on policy, or teaching an undergraduate course or graduate seminar.

Copyright © 2010 by
John Arras <jda3a@virginia.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free