#### Supplement to Transmission of Justification and Warrant

## Bayesian Formalisations of the *Information-Dependence Template*

Bayesian epistemologists have attempted to formalise extant
explanations of transmissivity and non-transmissivity of justification;
they have concentrated on the
*information-dependence template*. Many epistemologists would
claim that an acceptable Bayesian formalisation of this template would
illuminate its rational structure and, in some sense, validate
the explanation of non-transmissivity resting on it. In this
section we present models put forward by Okasha (2004), Chandler
(2010) and Moretti (2012). (Chandler 2013 also provides a belief
revision AGM-style model that we will not survey in this entry.)

The Bayesian assumes that rational belief comes in degrees and that
degrees of rational belief or credences obey the probability calculus.
Consider any proposition *x*. The expression
Pr(*x*)—called the *unconditional probability*
of *x*—is interpreted by the Bayesian as supplying the
degree of credence of a rational subject *s* in
*x*. In probability theory the expression
Pr(*x*|*y*)—called the *conditional probability*
of *x* given a proposition *y*—is customarily defined
as Pr(*x*&*y*)/Pr(*y*) provided that Pr(*y*)
> 0. (Hereafter whenever we use an expression with form
Pr(…|*y*) we will always assume that Pr(*y*) > 0.)
Pr(*x*|*y*) is interpreted by the Bayesian as supplying the
degree of credence that *s* would have in *x* if the truth
of *y* were given to her. The Bayesian says that *y*
(incrementally) *confirms* *x* if and only if
Pr(*x*|*y*) > Pr(*x*). Furthermore the Bayesian
says that *y* (incrementally) confirms *x* *conditional
on* a proposition *z* if and only if
Pr(*x*|*y*&*z*) > Pr(*x*|*z*). All
Bayesian models for transmissivity and non-transmissivity that we
consider here assume that there exists a very close relation between
degrees of epistemic justification and degrees of rational belief, so
that the latter can faithfully represent the former.

Okasha (2004)'s framework rests on two further modelling assumptions:

(A1) the claim that

s'slearningywould provideswith some degree of justification forxand the claim thatyconfirmsxtranslate into one another.(A2) the claim that

s's learningywould provideswith some degree of justification forxgiven background informationzand the claim thatyconfirmsxconditional onztranslate into one another.

Okasha essentially proposes to translate the
*information-dependence template* into the following triad:

(I) Pr( p|e&q) > Pr(p|q).( econfirmspconditional onq.)(II) Pr( p|e) ≤ Pr(p).( edoes not confirmpotherwise.)(III) p⊢q.( pentailsq.)

On the axioms of probability and the definition of conditional probability, (I)–(III) jointly entail:

(IV) Pr( q|e) ≤ Pr(q).( edoes not confirmq.)

When the overall formalism is interpreted as detailed above, the
entailment of (IV) from (I)–(III) is meant to explain why no
justification based on *e* can transmit from *p* to *q*
whenever the *information-dependence template* is instantiated.^{
}More precisely, this framework seems to be meant to account for
non-transmissivity of first-time and quantitatively strengthening
justification. Suppose in fact the *information-dependence template
*is satisfied so that (I)–(III) are true. Then (IV) is true
too. Hence *e* can provide no degree of justification for
*q*. Thus – one might infer – *q* cannot receive
via transmission from *p* any first-time or quantitatively
strengthening justification based on *e*.

In spite of appearance, Okasha's formalism has been found
problematic in different respects. To begin with, (I)–(III)
appear unable to explain *non-trivial* cases of transmission
failure that the *information-dependence template* is deemed to
be able to explain. These are cases in which *e* does
supply *s* with justification for *p* conditional
on *q* because
*q* is in background information, but *e* supplies *s*
with no first-time or quantitatively strengthening justification for
*q*. Note that since *q* is in background information, in
these cases *e* supplies *s* with no first-time
or quantitatively strengthening justification for *q* *given
background information* *q*.

The problem for Okasha's formalism is this: given (A2), Okasha
is commited to translating the claim that *s*'s
learning *y* would provide *s* with no degree
of justification for *x* *given background
information* *z* as Pr(*x*|*y*
& *z*) ≤ Pr(*x*|*z*). Thus Okasha should
construe formally the proposition that *s*'s
learning *e* would supply
*s* with no justification for *q* *given background
information* *q* as:

(V) Pr(q|e&q) ≤ Pr(q|q).

Namely, *e* does not confirm *q* *conditional* on
*q* (cf. Moretti 2012). If (V) were a part of Okasha's
framework, the latter could perhaps account for the non-trivial cases
of transmission failure mentioned before. But (V) is no part of
Okasha's framework. Note furthermore that the truth of (I)-(III)
appears *explanatorily irrelevant* for the truth of (V). This is
so because for every *q* and *e* such that Pr(*e* & *q*) > 0,
Pr(*q*|*e* & *q*) = Pr(*q*|*q*) = 1 so
that, *trivially*, Pr(*q*|*e* & *q*) ≤
Pr(*q*|*q*).

Okasha's framework appears affected by a more general difficulty. Although this model doesn't specify any Bayesian principle of transmissivity of justification, the principle implicitly assumed by Okasha is presumably this:

() If Pr(O-Transp|e) > Pr(p) andp⊢q, then Pr(q|e) > Pr(q).

*O-Trans* says that if *e* confirms *p*, and
*p* entails *q*, then *e* confirms *q*. If
justification is represented as confirmation, a deductive argument
with premise *p*, conclusion *q* and evidence *e* for
*p* is *transmissive* (of some degree of justification) if
and only if *O-Trans* is *non-vacuously* true. It's
been known for a long time that *O-Trans* is not true in general;
but that doesn't exclude its being true in some particular
cases, which is what we’re supposed to understand the question
of transmission failure coming to, on Okasha's proposal.

Once *O-Trans* is assumed, it is natural to think that the
*non-transmissivity* of an argument of the same type will
formally be certified by the argument's *falsifying*
*O-Trans*. Yet note that *O-Trans* is, not false, but
*vacuously true* when (I)-(IV) are satisfied. For
*O-Trans*’ antecedent embeds the logical negation of (II)
(cf. Chandler 2010). It is thus unclear whether Okasha's model
actually supplies a formal account of non-transmissivity. (For further
criticism see Chandler 2010 and Moretti 2012.)

Let us turn to Chandler (2010)'s formalisation. This model
intends to be as faithful as possible to the informal notion of
justification that the epistemologists who analyse transmission and
trasmission failure typically presuppose. A proposition is justified,
on this notion, just in case it is *rationally believable* or
*acceptable*. Accordingly, Chandler's framework is
based on the following modelling assumption:

s's learningywould justifyxif and only ifs's learningywould raise her credence inxand would do so over a relevant probability thresholdt∈ [0, 1) sufficient for rational belief or acceptance, i.e. if and only if Pr(x|y) > Pr(x) and Pr(x|y) >t.

The basic version of the principle of transmissivity of justification embedded is this model is the following:

(C-Trans) If Pr(p|e) > Pr(p), Pr(p|e) >tandp⊢q, then Pr(q|e) > Pr(q).

*C-Trans* states that if *e* confirms *p* such that
*p*'s conditional probability given *e* exceeds *t*,
and *p* entails *q*, then *e* confirms *q*. According
to this model, a deductive argument with premise *p*, conclusion
*q* and evidence *e* is *transmissive* of justification
if and only if *C-Trans* is non-vacuously true. Note
that Pr(*p*|*e*) > *t* and *p* ⊢ *q*
jointly entail Pr(*q*|*e*) > *t*. Thus if
*C-Trans* is non-vacuously true, *e* confirms *q* such
that *q*'s conditional probability given *e* exceeds
*t*. A deductive argument with premise *p*,
conclusion *q* and evidence *e* is *non-transmissive*
of justification if and only if *C-Trans* is false.

*C-Trans* seems to be meant to account formally for
transmissivity of first-time and quantitatively strengthening
justification, in the senses that any deductive argument with premise
*p*, conclusion *q* and evidence *e* is transmissive of
justification of either type if and only if it satisfies
*C-Trans*. We have transmissivity of first-time justification
only if Pr(*q*) ≤ *t*. We have transmissivity of quantitatively
strengthening justification only if Pr(*q*) > *t*. Note that
*C-Trans* can be false for some *e*, *p* and *q*
because there are probability distributions that verify its antecedent
while falsifying its consequent for any chosen *t* ∈ [0, 1). Thus
*C-Trans* makes room for non-transmissivity of justification.

In Chandler's model, the condition that the justification
from *e* for *p* depends on *q* being in background
information is interpreted as the condidtion that the justification
from *e* for *p* depends on *q* being antecedently
justified, which is translated into the following material
conditional:

(C) If Pr(p|e) >tthen Pr(q) >t.

The *information-dependence template* is formalised by
conjoining the antecedent of *C-Trans* and the above
conditional. The resulting proposition is equivalent to the
following:

(C-Fail) The antecedent ofC-Transis true and Pr(q) >t.

*C-Trans* and *C-Fail* actually capture some feature of
Wright's informal framework (cf. Chandler 2010, 338). However,
while the satisfaction of the information-dependence template is meant
to *suffice* for non-transmissivity, the fulfilment of
*C-Fail* is only *necessary* for non-transmissivity but
*not* sufficient for it. For it can be shown that, necessarily,
*C-Fail* is true if *C-Trans* is false, but there are
probability distributions that make *C-Fail* and *C-Trans*
true at the same time for any chosen *t* ∈ [0, 1).

With the purpose to improve on Chandler's model, Moretti
(2012) suggests turning *C-Trans* into this principle:

(M-Trans) If Pr(p) ≤t, Pr(p|e) >tandp⊢q, then Pr(q) ≤t.

Accepting *M-Trans* involves turning *C-Fail* into this
condition:

(M-Fail) The antecedent ofM-Transis true and Pr(q) >t.

*M-Trans* says that if *p*'s unconditional
probability does not exceed t while the conditional probability of
*p* given *e* does, and *p* entails *q*, then
*q*'s unconditional probability does not exceed *t*.
*M-Trans* accounts formally for transmissivity of first-time
justification in the sense that any deductive argument with premise
*p*, conclusion *q* and evidence *e* is *transmissive
of first-time justification* if and only if *M-Trans* is
non-vacuously true. (Note again that Pr(*p*|*e*) > *t* and
*p* ⊢ *q* entail Pr(*q*|*e*) > *t*.)
Since
*M-Fail* is just the condition of falsehood of *M-Trans*,
*M-Fail* provides a formal condition *sufficient* for
non-transmissivity of first-time justification.

As we have seen in Sect 3.2, the satisfaction of the
*information-dependence template* might turn out to be a
sufficent condition for non-transmissivity of both first-time and
quantitatively strengthening justification. Yet note that if
*M-Fail* were sufficient for non-transmissivity of quantitatively
strengthening justification, *M-Fail* would prevent *any*
deductive argument whatsoever concluding in *q* from being
transmissive of quantitatively strengthening justification. For the
clause in *M-Fail* according to which Pr(*q*) > *t* is
intuitively a *necessary* condition for transmission of
quantitatively strengthening justification to *q*. This would be
an unpalatable result because (as we have seen in Sect. 2) some
deductive arguments appear capable of transmitting quantitatively
strengthening justification (cf. Moretti 2012).

Moretti tentatively proposes a new Bayesian formalisation including a
condition alternative to *M-Fail* that appears sufficient for
non-transmissivity of both first-time and quantitatively strengthening
justification. See Moretti (2012) for details.