Supplement to Trinity
Judaic and Islamic Objections
With rare exceptions atheists and naturalists don't bother to criticize trinitarian doctrines, beyond the passing joke or dismissal, rightly seeing issues about theism generally, and about the teachings and status of Jesus Christ as more fundamental. Serious critics of trinitarian doctrines are nearly always fellow Abrahamic theists. Objections by Christians are discussed in the supplementary document on the history of trinitarian doctrines, section 2.2, and the supplementary document on unitarianism; here we survey Islamic and Judaic objections.
- 1. Recent Scriptural and Theological Objections
- 2. Medieval Metaphysical and Theological Objections
- 3. The Persons as Divine Attributes
- 4. Jewish and Muslim Trinitarian Parallels
Recent Muslim apologists argue that Jesus never claimed to be God, but only a servant and messenger of God, Paul and others having changed Jesus' message (Deedat 2008; Mababaya 2004). Unfortunately, such works are often marred by historical inaccuracies such as reliance on the late medieval forgery The Gospel of Barnabas as a guide to Jesus' thought and life (Geisler 2002, 303–7). Muslim apologists have always appealed to several passages in the Qur’an which appear to be directed against the Trinity and Incarnation doctrines, with the complication, however, that these passages seem to presuppose something other than the mainstream doctrines (Wolfson 1976, 304–10).
While recent Jewish polemics against Christianity normally focus on the status of Jesus, his alleged messiahship, and the New Testament use of the Torah, one careful and informed Jewish scholar recently argues at length that the Christian Bible as a whole doesn't support trinitarianism, and properly interpreted teaches many things incompatible with it, such as Jesus' subjection to the Father, and the impersonality of the holy spirit (Sigal 2006).
Both Jewish and Muslim critics emphasize that the New Testament continues the Old Testament emphasis on the oneness of God, and they sometimes criticize trinitarianism as simple tritheism, on the grounds that a “fully divine person” must be a god. Both sometimes allege that the New Testament is inconsistent, some parts affirming Christ to be God while others teach things inconsistent with his deity. Muslims also charge trinitarians with committing the serious sin of “associating” another with God, a charge raised in the Qur’an itself, and hold up Islam as a monotheism unencumbered by mysteries. Jewish critics have also leveled the charge of “association” (Ellenson 2000, 74).
In reply to these objections, trinitarians emphasize that by definition, the doctrine implies monotheism, and they employ arguments like those in the supplementary document on the history of trinitarian doctrines section 2.2 to show that the Bible implicitly teaches three “persons” in the one God. Mysteries, they argue, have been revealed, and we have no grounds to rule out in principle that we'll be faced with them in thinking about a transcendent God. Sometimes they add that non-trinitarians won't be able to avoid (other) theological mysteries themselves. Moreover, they argue that Jesus claimed to be (fully) divine, while being subject to and inferior to God in his human nature only, and nothing has been illegitimately raised to God's level, as it were, as Jesus and his Father are one god, though they are two persons.
While some medieval critics argue that the Christians' own scriptures don't support the trinitarian doctrine (e.g., Taymiyya Correct, 255–325), a number of philosophical objections to trinitarianism were developed by medieval Muslim philosopher-theologians, and later deployed and developed by Jewish philosophers theologians. One such objection was based on Aristotle's claim that “all things that are many in number have matter” (Metaphysics XII.8, 1074a 33–4; Lasker 2007, 48–51; Wolfson 1977, 404–5). Another was the the doctrine implied (as each person was fully divine) that each divine person must also be a Trinity, and so on, resulting in an infinity of trinities (Lasker 2007, 59–60, 72–3). Others urged that the doctrine wrongly implies that God is a substance with accidents, or that nothing divine could be “generated”, as that is incompatible with the divine attributes of absolute perfection, necessary existence, eternal existence, or aseity (existing solely because of oneself, or not because of anything else) (Lasker 2007, 87–8).
Many other objections center around the concept of radical divine simplicity. Muslim philosopher Abu Yusef al-Kindi (ca. 800–70) understood the doctrine to assert that there are three divine persons, three individuals, each composed of the divine essence together with its own distinctive characteristic. But whatever is composed is caused, and whatever is caused is not eternal. So the doctrine, he holds, absurdly claims that each of the persons isn't eternal, and since they're all divine, each is eternal (Adamson 2006, 100; Wolfson 1976, 321–7).
In Jewish and Muslim theological circles where the unity or oneness of God was understood to imply simplicity - that God contains no composition of any kind, not even distinct essential attributes - it was often urged that the trinitarian doctrine is incompatible with God's unity. After all, the Christians mean the persons to be really distinct (not merely distinct in thought), and identify them with or at least ground them in distinct attributes of God (Lasker 2007, 52–5, 61–2, 68, 90–2). (Cf. supplementary document on the history of trinitarian doctrines, section 4.)
Many of the above objections, both scriptural and philosophical, are answered, without citing the non-Christian source, by Thomas Aquinas in various places (Aquinas Gentiles, 35–116 [IV.1–18]; Aquinas Theologiae, I.27–43).
A reoccurring theme in Muslim-Christian and Jewish-Christian debates about God is Christians presenting the doctrine of the Trinity as modalism, the three “persons” in God being his personalities, or three of his properties (e.g., God's life, knowledge, and power), or else God being the Father, with the Son and Spirit as his properties. (See main entry section 1.) This has occurred in both recent and medieval debates (Crescas 1992, 37, 102; Ebied and Thomas 2005, 325–33; Geisler 2002, 269, 273, 276; Lasker 2007, 61–72, 78; Michel 2007a–c; Thomas 2002, 69, 77; van Gorder 2003, 115, 122).
Many medieval Muslim and Jewish critics seem to understand the trinitarian doctrine as a form of modalism (that the Trinity is simply the claim that God has three essential attributes or that there's a Trinity of God and his two essential attributes). This probably arises from four sources. First, some of their Christian opponents may be speaking loosely, for sake of convenience. Second, some of the non-Christians simply misunderstand the trinitarians, reading too much into their use of certain modalism-suggesting analogies. Third, some apologists may have “spun” the pro-Nicene view in order win the argument, misrepresenting it, in polemical contexts, as a kind of modalism. Fourth, some Christians probably equated the doctrine of the Trinity with a kind of modalism, not fully grasping pro-Nicene or Latin views on the Trinity. (See supplementary document on the history of trinitarian doctrines, sections 3.3 and 4.1, and main entry section 2.) In any case, one finds Christians addressing their opponents with this sort of appeal:
If only [the Muslims] knew… that we only intend by this [trinitarian doctrine] to affirm the teaching that God the exalted is living and articulate, they would not disapprove… (Ebied and Thomas 2005, 91)
Muslim and Jewish critics sometimes object that trinitarianism is simply tritheism, or alternately that it is modalism. In the former case, they argue that both their own and the Christians' scriptures clearly teach monotheism. In the latter case, they argue that the Christians arbitrarily stop at three “persons”. If a “person” is simply a divine attribute, then God has many more than three. That they stop with the stated three shows the move to be ad hoc and not their actual reason for believing in the Trinity (Crescas 1992, 43; Haddad 1995, 89; Lasker 2007, 55–7, 60, 68–9, 88–9; Taymiyya 1984, 255–9; Wolfson 1977, 405–6). Again, if the doctrine is spun as merely the claim that God is called by three names (i.e., the most extreme kind of modalism, discussed in the main entry, section 1), they reply that God has many more than three names (Taymiyya Correct, 266–7). In reply, Christians argue that they are being misunderstood, for trinitarianism is neither tritheism nor modalism.
Jewish antitrinitarian polemics are complicated by medieval mystical writings about the sefirot of God, some of which are sometimes portrayed of as “stages of God's being, aspects of the divine personality” (Matt 1983, 33). Of them, the Zohar (c. 1286 CE) says “It [Ein Sof, the Infinite, i.e., God] is they [the sefirot], and they are it” (ibid.; cf. Scholem 1974, 101). And an early 13th century kabbalistic writing spoke what one commentator calls “a kind of kabbalistic trinity”, namely “three hidden lights” in “the root of all roots” [i.e., God] which “constitute one essence and one root” (Scholem 1974, 95). The similarities between these and various trinitarian doctrines even led some medieval Jews to make the anachronistic claim that the trinitarian doctrine was based on a misunderstanding of the kabbalistic traditions (Lasker 2007, 75). Later, some renaissance and early modern Christians turned this around, attempting to argue from kabbalistic writings to versions of the Trinity and the Incarnation doctrines (Antognazza 2007; Coudert 1999; Scholem 1974, 196–201). And some recent Jewish scholars see the Zohar and other Kabbalistic texts as being influenced by medieval Christian trinitarianism (Sigal 2006, 140–1, 144). (See also the section on Kabbalah and Monotheism in the entry on monotheism.)
A final complication for some Jewish Aristotelians was distinguishing their claim that God is thinker, thinking, and thought from Augustinian Trinity analogies (see supplementary document on the history of Trinity theories, section 3.3.2). (Lasker 2007, 77–83)
Muslim polemics are complicated by the fact that early Muslims accepted, probably under Christian influence, the doctrine that there are many real, distinct attributes or characteristics in God (Wolfson 1976, 112–238). This doctrine, especially noting the modalistic twist given to the doctrine of the Trinity noted above (section 3), made it hard to draw a sharp line between Muslim and Christian conceptions of God's unity.
Another complicating factor was the Muslim doctrine of the eternal Qur’an. Certain verses in the Qur’an were interpreted to mean that the earthly Qur’an was the revelation of a pre-existing, heavenly exemplar, a sort of heavenly Qur’an. Thus, early Muslims believed, like many Jews, that their holy book had been created prior to the cosmos. At various points the Qur’an refers to itself as “God's word(s)”, “knowledge”, and “wisdom”. And so when belief in distinct eternal attributes in God was dominant, belief in a created, pre-existent Qur’an was replaced by belief in an eternal, uncreated Qur’an, an attribute of God. This Word of God, is supposed to be in some sense what Muslims recite, hear, or read. But how can this eternal, non-physical reality be present in an earthly book, or in an episode of Arabic speech? Wolfson discusses this as the problem of “inlibration”, parallel to the Christian doctrine of the incarnation of the Word, also, in some sense (in the pro-Nicene and Latin traditions) a divine attribute (Wolfson 1976, 235–91; cf. Geisler 2002, 99–105; van Gorder 2003, 52). A long and complicated controversy ensued over the status of the Qur’an, but the point is that Muslim objectors had to take care when objecting to the doctrines of the Trinity and the Incarnation of Christ, lest they say something incompatible with their preferred views about the Qur’an.