Notes to Tropes

1. “Trope” was a label first suggested by D. C. Williams (1997 [1953]), presumably as a joke (at least according to Bacon (2011) and Schaffer (2001)).The literature is ripe with alternative labels, including, but not limited to, abstract particular (Campbell 1990), moment (Mulligan et al. 1984), qualiton (Bacon 2011), quality instance (Segelberg 1999 [1945,1947,1953]), concrete property (Küng 1967), particular property (Denkel 1996), and unit property (Mertz 1996).

2. This list of early proponents of trope-like entities could of course have been made much longer. Mertz (1996) mentions, besides those already listed, Boethius, Avicenna, Averroës, Leibniz, Locke, and Hume. Mulligan et al. (1984) point to Spinoza and Descartes. They also emphasize the important influence Brentano has had in this context, not just on Husserl, but also on, among others, Carl Stumpf and Alexius Meinong. Another early 20th century proponent of trope-like entities was arguably Cook Wilson (1926). And among Williams's contemporaries, trope-like entities were arguably posited by, among others, P. F. Strawson (1959), Peter Geach (Geach and Anscombe 1961), Guido Küng (1967), and Nicholas Wolterstorff (1970) (for even more examples see Mulligan et al. 1984: 293).

3. G. F. Stout is well-known for his 1923-debate with G. E. Moore on whether properties are particular or universal. At the time, the general impression was that Moore turned out the “winner” in that debate. But according to Fraser MacBride (2011), the impression is in fact the opposite if the discussion is looked upon with contemporary eyes.

4. Although little known by his international contemporaries, Ivar Segelberg is arguably one of the clearest examples—after Husserl—of an early “trope”-theorist. Segelberg only published in Swedish. A translation into English of his complete works did not appear until 1999 (for a discussion of Segelberg's work, see Hochberg 1999).

5. More precisely, they are the inseparable union of a repeatable intension and a nexus which “under the intension links a specific n-tuple of relata” (Mertz 1996: 74). Mertz's views are intriguing, but arguably too different from those of the “main-stream” trope theorist to warrant in-depth treatment here.

6. That tropes can only exist if they are instantiated in some substrate is a view held by e.g., C. B. Martin (1980) and John Heil (2003).

7. These include the suggestion that we need (simple) tropes (and not states of affairs) in order to solve the problem with the Bradley regress (see section 3.2), that we need tropes to account for qualitative persistence (see section 4.1), and that we need tropes to make sense of perception (see section 4.3). For even more reasons to prefer tropes over states of affairs, see Mulligan (2006) (discussed in Hochberg (2011)).

8. And, for someone like Douglas Ehring (2011: 184f.), who holds that exact similarity between tropes is not grounded in the tropes themselves, but is rather to be explained in terms of the primitive classes to which the tropes belong, the objection completely misses its mark. For on this view, “t is different from t*” and “t is exactly similar to t*” are given distinct truthmakers.

9. OI (as well as SI) only holds for exactly resembling tropes. This is because we want our principle of individuation to allow for what seems clearly possible, namely distinct (and different) tropes characterizing the same object (or, in the case of SI, inhabiting the same spatiotemporal position).

10. Other reasons cited against SI include: (1) SI rules out as impossible the existence of enduring stationary and moving tropes, enduring time-travelling tropes, and tropes that extend over space without having any spatial parts (all of which, according to Ehring (2011: 25ff.) are possible kinds of entities); (2) Given SI, the relation between tropes and their location amounts to either complexity in the trope (which is independently problematic, see section 2.2) or to the collapse of distinct yet exactly similar tropes or of distinct yet co-localized tropes (Moreland 1985: 39ff.); (3) SI entails a problematically substantial notion of space-time (Schaffer 2001: 251), and; (4) SI provides us with the means to individuate tropes only if we assume that such a principle of individuation is already in place (Stout 1952: 76–77).

11. Against the view that SI rules out the possibility of non-spatiotemporal existence it has been argued, first, that such existence is ruled out anyway if (the independently justified thesis of) naturalism is accepted (see Schaffer 2001: 252), and, second, that even if naturalism is rejected, SI can be modified so as to make room for non-spatiotemporal tropes, individuated with reference to some analogue of the locational order of space (as argued in Campbell 1997 [1981]: 136). Campbell later (1990: 56) abandons this idea in favor of an outright rejection of SI, mainly because he thinks the result would otherwise be individuating conditions for non-spatiotemporal individuals that would be “too formal to carry conviction” (a claim that is criticized in Schaffer 2001: 252).

12. Proponents of tropes that accept the existence of universals as well as tropes include Husserl (2001[1900/1913]) and, more recently, Lowe (2006).

13. The great majority of the trope theorists agree that exact resemblance is to be formally characterized as an equivalence relation. That is, as a relation that is symmetrical, transitive, and reflexive. As such, exact resemblance partitions the set of tropes into mutually excluding and non-overlapping classes; classes functioning more or less as the traditional universal was supposed to. For the view that exact (trope)resemblance is not an equivalence relation, see Mormann 1995.

14. A third possibility is to regard exact resemblance as a non-relational tie. But this view has not been explicitly defended by any trope proponent and it has been criticized by some trope critics. Hochberg (1988: 189f.) argues that it lends all of its support from a supposed analogy with the view that the exemplification which holds a substrate and a universal together in a state of affairs is a non-relational tie, but that this analogy—for several reasons—fails.

15. But, critics have complained, from the fact that exact resemblance must obtain simply given the existence of its relata, it does not follow that it is no ontological addition to them (Daly 1997 [1994]: 152). This is arguably not a very strong objection, however. For, even though it is true that what supervenes does not have to be considered as a mere “pseudo-addition” to its subvenient base, the important thing here is that it can be.

16. More precisely, two possibilities are ruled out. First, that what happens to constitute the concrete particular could exist and not constitute any particular. This is a possibility most trope theorists regard as empty anyhow (but see Schaffer 2003). Second, that the tropes which constitute the concrete particular could exist and (partly) constitute a number of other concrete particulars. This is the possibility most trope theorists regard as genuine.

17. A rather different version of this response is given in Lowe 2006. According to Lowe, who defends a substrate-attribute view of concrete particulars, and who accepts the existence of universals as well as tropes, the unity of Fa is effected, not by a compresence-relation, but by a non-relational trope which (asymmetrically) depends for its existence both on the existence of the universal of which it is an instance, and on the existence of the substrate it characterizes. Lowe's view arguably struggles with what some trope theorists would consider an unnecessarily inflated ontology (although Lowe himself would argue that all his posits are independently justified).

18. Other solutions to the problem include the radical proposal that the regress is benign because it is infinite (see Orilia 2009; and Swoyer and Orilia 2011). See also the holistic view proposed in Schneider 2002 (inspired by Bacon 1995) and the view that compresence is “self-relating” put forward in Ehring 2011.

19. Schneider agrees that couching your ontology in terms of (mathematical) bundles and cross-sections (i.e., fields) is productive. The only problem, from the perspective of trope theory, is that the best way to achieve all of that while staying mathematically adequate is in terms of an ontology that does not include anything that can in any obvious sense be categorized as tropes (2006: 11).

Copyright © 2013 by
Anna-Sofia Maurin <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free

The SEP would like to congratulate the National Endowment for the Humanities on its 50th anniversary and express our indebtedness for the five generous grants it awarded our project from 1997 to 2007. Readers who have benefited from the SEP are encouraged to examine the NEH’s anniversary page and, if inspired to do so, send a testimonial to