Truth

First published Tue Jun 13, 2006; substantive revision Tue Jan 22, 2013

Truth is one of the central subjects in philosophy. It is also one of the largest. Truth has been a topic of discussion in its own right for thousands of years. Moreover, a huge variety of issues in philosophy relate to truth, either by relying on theses about truth, or implying theses about truth.

It would be impossible to survey all there is to say about truth in any coherent way. Instead, this essay will concentrate on the main themes in the study of truth in the contemporary philosophical literature. It will attempt to survey the key problems and theories of current interest, and show how they relate to one-another. A number of other entries investigate many of these topics in greater depth. Generally, discussion of the principal arguments is left to them. The goal of this essay is only to provide an overview of the current Theories. Many of the papers mentioned in this essay can be found in the anthologies edited by Blackburn and Simmons (1999) and Lynch (2001b). There are also a number of book-length surveys of the topics discussed here, including Burgess and Burgess (2011), Kirkham (1992), and Künne (2003).

The problem of truth is in a way easy to state: what truths are, and what (if anything) makes them true. But this simple statement masks a great deal of controversy. Whether there is a metaphysical problem of truth at all, and if there is, what kind of theory might address it, are all standing issues in the theory of truth. We will see a number of distinct ways of answering these questions.


1. The neo-classical theories of truth

Much of the contemporary literature on truth takes as its starting point some ideas which were prominent in the early part of the 20th century. There were a number of views of truth under discussion at that time, the most significant for the contemporary literature being the correspondence, coherence, and pragmatist theories of truth.

These theories all attempt to directly answer the nature question: what is the nature of truth? They take this question at face value: there are truths, and the question to be answered concerns their nature. In answering this question, each theory makes the notion of truth part of a more thoroughgoing metaphysics or epistemology. Explaining the nature of truth becomes an application of some metaphysical system, and truth inherits significant metaphysical presuppositions along the way.

The goal of this section is to characterize the ideas of the correspondence, coherence and pragmatist theories which animate the contemporary debate. In some cases, the received forms of these theories depart from the views that were actually defended in the early 20th century. We thus dub them the ‘neo-classical theories’. Where appropriate, we pause to indicate how the neo-classical theories emerge from their ‘classical’ roots in the early 20th century.

1.1 The correspondence theory

Perhaps the most important of the neo-classical theories for the contemporary literature is the correspondence theory. Ideas that sound strikingly like a correspondence theory are no doubt very old. They might well be found in Aristotle or Aquinas. When we turn to the late 19th and early 20th centuries where we pick up the story of the neo-classical theories of truth, it is clear that ideas about correspondence were central to the discussions of the time. In spite of their importance, however, it is strikingly difficult to find an accurate citation in the early 20th century for the received neo-classical view. Furthermore, the way the correspondence theory actually emerged will provide some valuable reference points for the contemporary debate. For these reasons, we dwell on the origins of the correspondence theory in the late 19th and early 20th centuries at greater length than those of the other neo-classical views, before turning to its contemporary neo-classical form.

1.1.1 The origins of the correspondence theory

The basic idea of the correspondence theory is that what we believe or say is true if it corresponds to the way things actually are—to the facts. This idea can be seen in various forms throughout the history of philosophy. Its modern history starts with the beginnings of analytic philosophy at the turn of the 20th century, particularly in the work of G. E. Moore and Bertrand Russell.

Let us pick up the thread of this story in the years between 1898 and about 1910. These years are marked by Moore and Russell's rejection of idealism. Yet at this point, they do not hold a correspondence theory of truth. Indeed Moore (1899) sees the correspondence theory as a source of idealism, and rejects it. Russell follows Moore in this regard. (For discussion of Moore's early critique of idealism, where he rejects the correspondence theory of truth, see Baldwin (1991). Hylton (1990) provides an extensive discussion of Russell in the context of British idealism.)

In this period, Moore and Russell hold a version of the identity theory of truth. They say comparatively little about it, but it is stated briefly in Moore (1899; 1902) and Russell (1904). According to the identity theory, a true proposition is identical to a fact. Specifically, in Moore and Russell's hands, the theory begins with propositions, understood as the objects of beliefs and other propositional attitudes. Propositions are what are believed, and give the contents of beliefs. They are also, according to this theory, the primary bearers of truth. When a proposition is true, it is identical to a fact, and a belief in that proposition is correct. (Related ideas about the identity theory and idealism are discussed by McDowell (1994) and further developed by Hornsby (2001).)

The identity theory Moore and Russell espoused takes truth to be a property of propositions. Furthermore, taking up an idea familiar to readers of Moore, the property of truth is a simple unanalyzable property. Facts are understood as simply those propositions which are true. There are true propositions and false ones, and facts just are true propositions. There is thus no “difference between truth and the reality to which it is supposed to correspond” (Moore, 1902, p. 21). (For further discussion of the identity theory of truth, see Baldwin (1991), Candlish (1999), Cartwright (1987), Dodd (2000), and the entry on the identity theory of truth.)

Moore and Russell came to reject the identity theory of truth in favor of a correspondence theory, sometime around 1910 (as we see in Moore, 1953, which reports lectures he gave in 1910–1911, and Russell, 1910b). They do so because they came to reject the existence of propositions. Why? Among reasons, they came to doubt that there could be any such things as false propositions, and then concluded that there are no such things as propositions at all.

Why did Moore and Russell find false propositions problematic? A full answer to this question is a point of scholarship that would take us too far afield. (Moore himself lamented that he could not “put the objection in a clear and convincing way” (1953, p. 263), but see Cartwright (1987) and David (2001) for careful and clear exploration of the arguments.) But very roughly, the identification of facts with true propositions left them unable to see what a false proposition could be other than something which is just like a fact, though false. If such things existed, we would have fact-like things in the world, which Moore and Russell now see as enough to make false propositions count as true. Hence, they cannot exist, and so there are no false propositions. As Russell (1956, p. 223) later says, propositions seem to be at best “curious shadowy things” in addition to facts.

As Cartwright (1987) reminds us, it is useful to think of this argument in the context of Russell's slightly earlier views about propositions. As we see clearly in Russell (1903), for instance, he takes propositions to have constituents. But they are not mere collections of constituents, but a ‘unity’ which brings the constituents together. (We thus confront the ‘problem of the unity of the proposition’.) But what, we might ask, would be the ‘unity’ of a proposition that Samuel Ramey sings—with constituents Ramey and singing—except Ramey bearing the property of singing? If that is what the unity consists in, then we seem to have nothing other than the fact that Ramey sings. But then we could not have genuine false propositions without having false facts.

As Cartwright also reminds us, there is some reason to doubt the cogency of this sort of argument. But let us put the assessment of the arguments aside, and continue the story. From the rejection of propositions a correspondence theory emerges. The primary bearers of truth are no longer propositions, but beliefs themselves. In a slogan:

A belief is true if and only if it corresponds to a fact.

Views like this are held by Moore (1953) and Russell (1910b; 1912). Of course, to understand such a theory, we need to understand the crucial relation of correspondence, as well as the notion of a fact to which a belief corresponds. We now turn to these questions. In doing so, we will leave the history, and present a somewhat more modern reconstruction of a correspondence theory.

1.1.2 The neo-classical correspondence theory

The correspondence theory of truth is at its core an ontological thesis: a belief is true if there exists an appropriate entity—a fact—to which it corresponds. If there is no such entity, the belief is false.

Facts, for the neo-classical correspondence theory, are entities in their own right. Facts are generally taken to be composed of particulars and properties and relations or universals, at least. The neo-classical correspondence theory thus only makes sense within the setting of a metaphysics that includes such facts. Hence, it is no accident that as Moore and Russell turn away from the identity theory of truth, the metaphysics of facts takes on a much more significant role in their views. This perhaps becomes most vivid in the later Russell (1956, p. 182), where the existence of facts is the “first truism.” (The influence of Wittgenstein's ideas to appear in the Tractatus (1922) on Russell in this period was strong, and indeed, the Tractatus remains one of the important sources for the neo-classical correspondence theory. For more recent extensive discussions of facts, see Armstrong (1997) and Neale (2001).)

Consider, for example, the belief that Ramey sings. Let us grant that this belief is true. In what does its truth consist, according to the correspondence theory? It consists in there being a fact in the world, built from the individual Ramey, and the property of singing. Let us denote this <Ramey, Singing>. This fact exists. In contrast, the world (we presume) contains no fact <Ramey, Dancing>. The belief that Ramey sings stands in the relation of correspondence to the fact <Ramey, Singing>, and so the belief is true.

What is the relation of correspondence? One of the standing objections to the classical correspondence theory is that a fully adequate explanation of correspondence proves elusive. But for a simple belief, like that Ramey sings, we can observe that the structure of the fact <Ramey, Singing> matches the subject-predicate form of the that-clause which reports the belief, and may well match the structure of the belief itself.

So far, we have very much the kind of view that Moore and Russell would have found congenial. But the modern form of the correspondence theory seeks to round out the explanation of correspondence by appeal to propositions. Indeed, it is common to base a correspondence theory of truth upon the notion of a structured proposition. Propositions are again cast as the contents of beliefs and assertions, and propositions have structure which at least roughly corresponds to the structure of sentences. At least, for simple beliefs like that Ramey sings, the proposition has the same subject predicate structure as the sentence. (Proponents of structured propositions, such as Kaplan (1989), often look to Russell (1903) for inspiration, and find unconvincing Russell's reasons for rejecting them.)

With facts and structured propositions in hand, an attempt may be made to explain the relation of correspondence. Correspondence holds between a proposition and a fact when the proposition and fact have the same structure, and the same constituents at each structural position. When they correspond, the proposition and fact thus mirror each-other. In our simple example, we might have:

proposition that Ramey sings
fact <Ramey, Singing>

Propositions, though structured like facts, can be true or false. In a false case, like the proposition that Ramey dances, we would find no fact at the bottom of the corresponding diagram. Beliefs are true or false depending on whether the propositions which are believed are.

We have sketched this view for simple propositions like the proposition that Ramey sings. How to extend it to more complex cases, like general propositions or negative propositions, is an issue we will not delve into here. It requires deciding whether there are complex facts, such as general facts or negative facts, or whether there is a more complex relation of correspondence between complex propositions and simple facts. (The issue of whether there are such complex facts marks a break between Russell (1956) and Wittgenstein (1922) and the earlier views which Moore (1953) and Russell (1912) sketch.)

According to the correspondence theory as sketched here, what is key to truth is a relation between propositions and the world, which obtains when the world contains a fact that is structurally similar to the proposition. Though this is not the theory Moore and Russell held, it weaves together ideas of theirs with a more modern take on (structured) propositions. We will thus dub it the neo-classical correspondence theory. This theory offers us a paradigm example of a correspondence theory of truth.

The leading idea of the correspondence theory is familiar. It is a form of the older idea that true beliefs show the right kind of resemblance to what is believed. In contrast to earlier empiricist theories, the thesis is not that one's ideas per se resemble what they are about. Rather, the propositions which give the contents of one's true beliefs mirror reality, in virtue of entering into correspondence relations to the right pieces of it.

In this theory, it is the way the world provides us with appropriately structured entities that explains truth. Our metaphysics thus explains the nature of truth, by providing the entities needed to enter into correspondence relations.

For more on the correspondence theory, see David (1994) and the entry on the correspondance theory of truth.

1.2 The coherence theory

Though initially the correspondence theory was seen by its developers as a competitor to the identity theory of truth, it was also understood as opposed to the coherence theory of truth.

We will be much briefer with the historical origins of the coherence theory than we were with the correspondence theory. Like the correspondence theory, versions of the coherence theory can be seen throughout the history of philosophy. (See, for instance, Walker (1989) for a discussion of its early modern lineage.) Like the correspondence theory, it was important in the early 20th century British origins of analytic philosophy. Particularly, the coherence theory of truth is associated with the British idealists to whom Moore and Russell were reacting.

Many idealists at that time did indeed hold coherence theories. Let us take as an example Joachim (1906). (This is the theory that Russell (1910a) attacks.) Joachim says that:

Truth in its essential nature is that systematic coherence which is the character of a significant whole (p. 76).

We will not attempt a full exposition of Joachim's view, which would take us well beyond the discussion of truth into the details of British idealism. But a few remarks about his theory will help to give substance to the quoted passage.

Perhaps most importantly, Joachim talks of ‘truth’ in the singular. This is not merely a turn of phrase, but a reflection of his monistic idealism. Joachim insists that what is true is the “whole complete truth” (p. 90). Individual judgments or beliefs are certainly not the whole complete truth. Such judgments are, according to Joachim, only true to a degree. One aspect of this doctrine is a kind of holism about content, which holds that any individual belief or judgment gets its content only in virtue of being part of a system of judgments. But even these systems are only true to a degree, measuring the extent to which they express the content of the single ‘whole complete truth’. Any real judgment we might make will only be partially true.

To flesh out Joachim's theory, we would have to explain what a significant whole is. We will not attempt that, as it leads us to some of the more formidable aspects of his view, e.g., that it is a “process of self-fulfillment” (p. 77). But it is clear that Joachim takes ‘systematic coherence’ to be stronger than consistency. In keeping with his holism about content, he rejects the idea that coherence is a relation between independently identified contents, and so finds it necessary to appeal to ‘significant wholes’.

As with the correspondence theory, it will be useful to recast the coherence theory in a more modern form, which will abstract away from some of the difficult features of British idealism. As with the correspondence theory, it can be put in a slogan:

A belief is true if and only if it is part of a coherent system of beliefs.

To further the contrast with the neo-classical correspondence theory, we may add that a proposition is true if it is the content of a belief in the system, or entailed by a belief in the system. We may assume, with Joachim, that the condition of coherence will be stronger than consistency. With the idealists generally, we might suppose that features of the believing subject will come into play.

This theory is offered as an analysis of the nature of truth, and not simply a test or criterion for truth. Put as such, it is clearly not Joachim's theory (it lacks his monism, and he rejects propositions), but it is a standard take on coherence in the contemporary literature. (It is the way the coherence theory is given in Walker (1989), for instance. See also Young (2001) for a recent defense of a coherence theory.) Let us take this as our neo-classical version of the coherence theory. The contrast with the correspondence theory of truth is clear. Far from being a matter of whether the world provides a suitable object to mirror a proposition, truth is a matter of how beliefs are related to each-other.

The coherence theory of truth enjoys two sorts of motivations. One is primarily epistemological. Most coherence theorists also hold a coherence theory of knowledge; more specifically, a coherence theory of justification. According to this theory, to be justified is to be part of a coherent system of beliefs. An argument for this is often based on the claim that only another belief could stand in a justification relation to a belief, allowing nothing but properties of systems of belief, including coherence, to be conditions for justification. Combining this with the thesis that a fully justified belief is true forms an argument for the coherence theory of truth. (An argument along these lines is found in Blanshard (1939), who holds a form of the coherence theory closely related to Joachim's.)

The steps in this argument may be questioned by a number of contemporary epistemological views. But the coherence theory also goes hand-in-hand with its own metaphysics as well. The coherence theory is typically associated with idealism. As we have already discussed, forms of it were held by British idealists such as Joachim, and later by Blanshard (in America). An idealist should see the last step in the justification argument as quite natural. More generally, an idealist will see little (if any) room between a system of beliefs and the world it is about, leaving the coherence theory of truth as an extremely natural option.

It is possible to be an idealist without adopting a coherence theory. (For instance, many scholars read Bradley as holding a version of the identity theory of truth. See Baldwin (1991) for some discussion.) However, it is hard to see much of a way to hold the coherence theory of truth without maintaining some form of idealism. If there is nothing to truth beyond what is to be found in an appropriate system of beliefs, then it would seem one's beliefs constitute the world in a way that amounts to idealism. (Walker (1989) argues that every coherence theorist must be an idealist, but not vice-versa.)

The neo-classical correspondence theory seeks to capture the intuition that truth is a content-to-world relation. It captures this in the most straightforward way, by asking for an object in the world to pair up with a true proposition. The neo-classical coherence theory, in contrast, insists that truth is not a content-to-world relation at all; rather, it is a content-to-content, or belief-to-belief, relation. The coherence theory requires some metaphysics which can make the world somehow reflect this, and idealism appears to be it. (A distant descendant of the neo-classical coherence theory that does not require idealism will be discussed in section 6.5 below.)

For more on the coherence theory, see the entry on the coherence theory of truth.

1.3 Pragmatist theories

A different perspective on truth was offered by the American pragmatists. As with the neo-classical correspondence and coherence theories, the pragmatist theories go with some typical slogans. For example, Peirce is usually understood as holding the view that:

Truth is the end of inquiry.

(See, for instance Hartshorne et al., 1931–58, §3.432.) Both Peirce and James are associated with the slogan that:

Truth is satisfactory to believe.

James (e.g., 1907) understands this principle as telling us what practical value truth has. True beliefs are guaranteed not to conflict with subsequent experience. Likewise, Peirce's slogan tells us that true beliefs will remain settled at the end of prolonged inquiry. Peirce's slogan is perhaps most typically associated with pragmatist views of truth, so we might take it to be our canonical neo-classical theory. However, the contemporary literature does not seem to have firmly settled upon a received ‘neo-classical’ pragmatist theory.

In her reconstruction (upon which we have relied heavily), Haack (1976) notes that the pragmatists' views on truth also make room for the idea that truth involves a kind of correspondence, insofar as the scientific method of inquiry is answerable to some independent world. Peirce, for instance, does not reject a correspondence theory outright; rather, he complains that it provides merely a ‘nominal’ or ‘transcendental’ definition of truth (e.g Hartshorne et al., 1931–58, §5.553, §5.572), which is cut off from practical matters of experience, belief, and doubt (§5.416). (See Misak (2004) for an extended discussion.)

This marks an important difference between the pragmatist theories and the coherence theory we just considered. Even so, pragmatist theories also have an affinity with coherence theories, insofar as we expect the end of inquiry to be a coherent system of beliefs. As Haack also notes, James maintains an important verificationist idea: truth is what is verifiable. We will see this idea re-appear in section 4.

James' views are discussed further in the entry on William James. Peirce's views are discussed further in the entry on Charles Sanders Peirce.

2. Tarski's theory of truth

Modern forms of the classical theories survive. Many of these modern theories, notably correspondence theories, draw on ideas developed by Tarski.

In this regard, it is important to bear in mind that his seminal work on truth (1935) is very much of a piece with other works in mathematical logic, such as his (1931), and as much as anything this work lays the ground-work for the modern subject of model theory—a branch of mathematical logic, not the metaphysics of truth. In this respect, Tarski's work provides a set of highly useful tools that may be employed in a wide range of philosophical projects. (See Patterson (2012) for more on Tarski's work in its historical context.)

Tarski's work has a number of components, which we will consider in turn.

2.1 Sentences as truth-bearers

In the classical debate on truth at the beginning of the 20th century we considered in section 1, the issue of truth-bearers was of great significance. For instance, Moore and Russell's turn to the correspondence theory was driven by their views on whether there are propositions to be the bearers of truth. Many theories we reviewed took beliefs to be the bearers of truth.

In contrast, Tarski and much of the subsequent work on truth takes sentences to be the primary bearers of truth. This is not an entirely novel development: Russell (1956) also takes truth to apply to sentence (which he calls ‘propositions’ in that text). But whereas much of the classical debate takes the issue of the primary bearers of truth to be a substantial and important metaphysical one, Tarski is quite casual about it. His primary reason for taking sentences as truth-bearers is convenience, and he explicitly distances himself from any commitment about the philosophically contentious issues surrounding other candidate truth-bearers (e.g., Tarski, 1944). (Russell (1956) makes a similar suggestion that sentences are the appropriate truth-bearers “for the purposes of logic” (p. 184), though he still takes the classical metaphysical issues to be important.)

We will return to the issue of the primary bearers of truth in section 6.1. For the moment, it will be useful to simply follow Tarski's lead. But it should be stressed that for this discussion, sentences are fully interpreted sentences, having meanings. We will also assume that the sentences in question do not change their content across occasions of use, i.e., that they display no context-dependence. We are taking sentences to be what Quine (1960) calls ‘eternal sentences’.

In some places (e.g., Tarski, 1944), Tarski refers to his view as the ‘semantic conception of truth’. It is not entirely clear just what Tarski had in mind by this, but it is clear enough that Tarski's theory defines truth for sentences in terms of concepts like reference and satisfaction, which are intimately related to the basic semantic functions of names and predicates (according to many approaches to semantics).

2.2 Convention T

Let us suppose we have a fixed language L whose sentences are fully interpreted. The basic question Tarski poses is what an adequate theory of truth for L would be. Tarski's answer is embodied in what he calls Convention T:

An adequate theory of truth for L must imply, for each sentence φ of L
φ  is true if and only if φ .

(We have simplified Tarski's presentation somewhat.) This is an adequacy condition for theories, not a theory itself. Given the assumption that L is fully interpreted, we may assume that each sentence φ in fact has a truth value. In light of this, Convention T guarantees that the truth predicate given by the theory will be extensionally correct, i.e., have as its extension all and only the true sentences of L .

Convention T draws our attention to the biconditionals of the form

  φ is true if and only if φ ,

which are usually called the Tarski biconditionals for a language L .

2.3 Recursive definition of truth

Tarski does not merely propose a condition of adequacy for theories of truth, he also shows how to meet it. One of his insights is that if the language L displays the right structure, then truth for L can be defined recursively. For instance, let us suppose that L is a simple formal language, containing two atomic sentences ‘snow is white’ and ‘grass is green’, and the sentential connectives ∨ and ¬.

In spite of its simplicity, L contains infinitely many distinct sentences. But truth can be defined for all of them by recursion.

  1. Base clauses:
    1. ‘Snow is white’ is true if and only if snow is white.
    2. ‘Grass is green’ is true if and only if grass is green.
  2. Recursion clauses. For any sentences φ and ψ of L:
    1. φ ∨ ψ is true if and only if φ is true or ψ is true.
    2. ¬φ is true if and only if it is not the case that φ is true.

This theory satisfies Convention T.

2.4 Reference and satisfaction

This may look trivial, but in defining an extensionally correct truth predicate for an infinite language with four clauses, we have made a modest application of a very powerful technique.

Tarski's techniques go further, however. They do not stop with atomic sentences. Tarski notes that truth for each atomic sentence can be defined in terms of two closely related notions: reference and satisfaction. Let us consider a language L′ , just like L except that instead of simply having two atomic sentences, L′ breaks atomic sentences into terms and predicates. L′ contains terms ‘snow’ and ‘grass’ (let us engage in the idealization that these are simply singular terms), and predicates ‘is white’ and ‘is green’. So L′ is like L , but also contains the sentences ‘Snow is green’ and ‘Grass is white’.)

We can define truth for atomic sentences of L′ in the following way.

  1. Base clauses:
    1. ‘Snow’ refers to snow.
    2. ‘Grass’ refers to grass.
    3. a satisfies ‘is white’ if and only if a is white.
    4. a satisfies ‘is green’ if and only if a is green.
  2. For any atomic sentence t is P : t is P is true if and only if the referent of t satisfies P.

One of Tarski's key insights is that the apparatus of satisfaction allows for a recursive definition of truth for sentences with quantifiers, though we will not examine that here. We could repeat the recursion clauses for L to produce a full theory of truth for L′.

Let us say that a Tarskian theory of truth is a recursive theory, built up in ways similar to the theory of truth for L′. Tarski goes on to demonstrate some key applications of such a theory of truth. A Tarskian theory of truth for a language L can be used to show that theories in L are consistent. This was especially important to Tarski, who was concerned the Liar paradox would make theories in languages containing a truth predicate inconsistent.

For more, see the entries on axiomatic theories of truth, the Liar paradox, and Tarski's truth definitions.

3. Correspondence revisited

The correspondence theory of truth expresses the very natural idea that truth is a content-to-world or word-to-world relation: what we say or think is true or false in virtue of the way the world turns out to be. We suggested that, against a background like the metaphysics of facts, it does so in a straightforward way. But the idea of correspondence is certainly not specific to this framework. Indeed, it is controversial whether a correspondence theory should rely on any particular metaphysics at all. The basic idea of correspondence, as Tarski (1944) and others have suggested, is captured in the slogan from Aristotle's Metaphysics Γ 7.27, “to say of what is that it is, or of what is not that it is not, is true” (Ross, 1928). ‘What is’, it is natural enough to say, is a fact, but this natural turn of phrase may well not require a full-blown metaphysics of facts.

Yet without the metaphysics of facts, the notion of correspondence as discussed in section 1.1 loses substance. This has led to two distinct strands in contemporary thinking about the correspondence theory. One strand seeks to recast the correspondence theory in a way that does not rely on any particular ontology. Another seeks to find an appropriate ontology for correspondence, either in terms of facts or other entities. We will consider each in turn.

3.1 Correspondence without facts

Tarski himself sometimes suggested that his theory was a kind of correspondence theory of truth. Whether his own theory is a correspondence theory, and even whether it provides any substantial philosophical account of truth at all, is a matter of controversy. (One rather drastic negative assessment from Putnam (1985–86, p. 333) is that “As a philosophical account of truth, Tarski's theory fails as badly as it is possible for an account to fail.”) But a number of philosophers (e.g., Davidson, 1969; Field, 1972) have seen Tarski's theory as providing at least the core of a correspondence theory of truth which dispenses with the metaphysics of facts.

Tarski's theory shows how truth for a sentence is determined by certain properties of its constituents; in particular, by properties of reference and satisfaction (as well as by the logical constants). As it is normally understood, reference is the preeminent word-to-world relation. Satisfaction is naturally understood as a word-to-world relation as well, which relates a predicate to the things in the world that bear it. The Tarskian recursive definition shows how truth is determined by reference and satisfaction, and so is in effect determined by the things in the world we refer to and the properties they bear. This, one might propose, is all the correspondence we need. It is not correspondence of sentences or propositions to facts; rather, it is correspondence of our expressions to objects and the properties they bear, and then ways of working out the truth of claims in terms of this.

This is certainly not the neo-classical idea of correspondence. In not positing facts, it does not posit any single object to which a true proposition or sentence might correspond. Rather, it shows how truth might be worked out from basic word-to-world relations. However, a number of authors have noted that Tarski's theory cannot by itself provide us with such an account of truth. As we will discuss more fully in section 4.2, Tarski's apparatus is in fact compatible with theories of truth that are certainly not correspondence theories.

Field (1972), in an influential discussion and diagnosis of what is lacking in Tarski's account, in effect points out that whether we really have something worthy of the name ‘correspondence’ depends on our having notions of reference and satisfaction which genuinely establish word-to-world relations. (Field does not use the term ‘correspondence’, but does talk about e.g., the “connection between words and things” (p. 373).) By itself, Field notes, Tarski's theory does not offer an account of reference and satisfaction at all. Rather, it offers a number of disquotation clauses, such as:

  1. ‘Snow’ refers to snow.
  2. a satisfies ‘is white’ if and only if a is white.

These clauses have an air of triviality (though whether they are to be understood as trivial principles or statements of non-trivial semantic facts has been a matter of some debate). With Field, we might propose to supplement clauses like these with an account of reference and satisfaction. Such a theory should tell us what makes it the case that the word ‘snow’ refer to snow. (In 1972, Field was envisaging a physicalist account, along the lines of the causal theory of reference.) This should inter alia guarantee that truth is really determined by word-to-world relations, so in conjunction with the Tarskian recursive definition, it could provide a correspondence theory of truth.

Such a theory clearly does not rely on a metaphysics of facts. Indeed, it is in many ways metaphysically neutral, as it does not take a stand on the nature of particulars, or of the properties or universals that underwrite facts about satisfaction. However, it may not be entirely devoid of metaphysical implications, as we will discuss further in section 4.1.

3.2 Representation and Correspondence

Much of the subsequent discussion of Field-style approaches to correspondence has focused on the role of representation in these views. Field's own (1972) discussion relies on a causal relation between terms and their referents, and a similar relation for satisfaction. These are instances of representation relations. According to representational views, meaningful items, like perhaps thoughts or sentences or their constituents, have their contents in virtue of standing in the right relation to the things they represent. On many views, including Field's, a name stands in such a relation to its bearer, and the relation is a causal one.

The project of developing a naturalist account of the representation relation has been an important one in the philosophy of mind and language. (See the entry on mental representation.) But, it has implications for the theory of truth. Representational views of content lead naturally to correspondence theories of truth. To make this vivid, suppose you hold that sentences or beliefs stand in a representation relation to some objects. It is natural to suppose that for true beliefs or sentences, those objects would be facts. We then have a correspondence theory, with the correspondence relation explicated as a representation relation: a truth bearer is true if it represents a fact.

As we have discussed, many contemporary views reject facts, but one can hold a representational view of content without them. One interpretation of Field's theory is just that. The relations of reference and satisfaction are representation relations, and truth for sentences is determined compositionally in terms of those representation relations, and the nature of the objects they represent. If we have such relations, we have the building blocks for a correspondence theory without facts. Field (1972) anticipated a naturalist reduction of the representation via a causal theory, but any view that accepts representation relations for truth bearers or their constituents can provide a similar theory of truth. (See Jackson (2006) and Lynch (2009) for further discussion.)

Representational views of content provide a natural way to approach the correspondence theory of truth, and likewise, anti-representational views provide a natural way to avoid the correspondence theory of truth. This is most clear in the work of Davidson, as we will discuss more in section 6.5.

3.3 Facts again

There have been a number of correspondence theories that do make use of facts. Some are notably different from the neo-classical theory sketched in section 1.1. For instance, Austin (1950) proposes a view in which each statement (understood roughly as an utterance event) corresponds to both a fact or situation, and a type of situation. It is true if the former is of the latter type. This theory, which has been developed by situation theory (e.g., Barwise and Perry, 1986), rejects the idea that correspondence is a kind of mirroring between a fact and a proposition. Rather, correspondence relations to Austin are entirely conventional. (See Vision (2004) for an extended defense of an Austinian correspondence theory.) As an ordinary language philosopher, Austin grounds his notion of fact more in linguistic usage than in an articulated metaphysics, but he defends his use of fact-talk in Austin (1961b).

In a somewhat more Tarskian spirit, formal theories of facts or states of affairs have also been developed. For instance, Taylor (1976) provides a recursive definition of a collection of ‘states of affairs’ for a given language. Taylor's states of affairs seem to reflect the notion of fact at work in the neo-classical theory, though as an exercise in logic, they are officially n-tuples of objects and intensions.

There are more metaphysically robust notions of fact in the current literature. For instance, Armstrong (1997) defends a metaphysics in which facts (under the name ‘states of affairs’) are metaphysically fundamental. The view has much in common with the neo-classical one. Like the neo-classical view, Armstrong endorses a version of the correspondence theory. States of affairs are truthmakers for propositions, though Armstrong argues that there may be many such truthmakers for a given proposition, and vice versa. (Armstrong also envisages a naturalistic account of propositions as classes of equivalent belief-tokens.)

Armstrong's primary argument is what he calls the ‘truthmaker argument’. It begins by advancing a truthmaker principle, which holds that for any given truth, there must be a truthmaker—a “something in the world which makes it the case, that serves as an ontological ground, for this truth” (p. 115). It is then argued that facts are the appropriate truthmakers.

In contrast to the approach to correspondence discussed in section 3.1, which offered correspondence with minimal ontological implications, this view returns to the ontological basis of correspondence that was characteristic of the neo-classical theory.

For more on facts, see the entry on facts.

3.4 Truthmakers

The truthmaker principle is often put as the schema:

If φ , then there is an x such that necessarily, if x exists, then φ .

(Fox (1987) proposed putting the principle this way, rather than explicitly in terms of truth.)

The truthmaker principle expresses the ontological aspect of the neo-classical correspondence theory. Not merely must truth obtain in virtue of word-to-world relations, but there must be a thing that makes each truth true.

The neo-classical correspondence theory, and Armstrong, cast facts as the appropriate truthmakers. However, it is a non-trivial step from the truthmaker principle to the existence of facts. There are a number of proposals in the literature for how other sorts of objects could be truthmakers; for instance, tropes (called ‘moments’, in Mulligan et al., 1984). Parsons (1999) argues that the truthmaker principle (presented in a somewhat different form) is compatible with there being only concrete particulars.

As we saw in discussing the neo-classical correspondence theory, truthmaker theories, and fact theories in particular, raise a number of issues. One which has been discussed at length, for instance, is whether there are negative facts. Negative facts would be the truthmakers for negated sentences. Russell (1956) notoriously expresses ambivalence about whether there are negative facts. Armstrong (1997) rejects them, while Beall (2000) defends them. (For more discussion of truthmakers, see the papers in Beebee and Dodd (2005).)

4. Realism and anti-realism

The neo-classical theories we surveyed in section 1 made the theory of truth an application of their background metaphysics (and in some cases epistemology). In section 2 and especially in section 3, we returned to the issue of what sorts of ontological commitments might go with the theory of truth. There we saw a range of options, from relatively ontologically non-committal theories, to theories requiring highly specific ontologies.

There is another way in which truth relates to metaphysics. Many ideas about realism and anti-realism are closely related to ideas about truth. Indeed, many approaches to questions about realism and anti-realism simply make them questions about truth.

4.1 Realism and truth

In discussing the approach to correspondence of section 3.1, we noted that it has few ontological requirements. It relies on there being objects of reference, and something about the world which makes for determinate satisfaction relations; but beyond that, it is ontologically neutral. But as we mentioned there, this is not to say that it has no metaphysical implications. A correspondence theory of truth, of any kind, is often taken to embody a form of realism.

The key features of realism, as we will take it, are that:

  1. The world exists objectively, independently of the ways we think about it or describe it.
  2. Our thoughts and claims are about that world.

(Wright (1992) offers a nice statement of this way of thinking about realism.) These theses imply that our claims are objectively true or false, depending on how the world they are about is. The world that we represent in our thoughts or language is an objective world. (Realism may be restricted to some subject-matter, or range of discourse, but for simplicity, we will talk about only its global form.)

It is often argued that these theses require some form of the correspondence theory of truth. (Putnam (1978, p. 18) notes, “Whatever else realists say, they typically say that they believe in a ‘correspondence theory of truth’.”) At least, they are supported by the kind of correspondence theory without facts discussed in section 3.1, such as Field's proposal. Such a theory will provide an account of objective relations of reference and satisfaction, and show how these determine the truth or falsehood of what we say about the world. Field's own approach (1972) to this problem seeks a physicalist explanation of reference. But realism is a more general idea than physicalism. Any theory that provides objective relations of reference and satisfaction, and builds up a theory of truth from them, would give a form of realism. (Making the objectivity of reference the key to realism is characteristic of work of Putnam, e.g., 1978.)

Another important mark of realism expressed in terms of truth is the property of bivalence. As Dummett has stressed (e.g., 1959; 1976; 1983; 1991), a realist should see there being a fact of the matter one way or the other about whether any given claim is correct. Hence, one important mark of realism is that it goes together with the principle of bivalence: every truth-bearer (sentence or proposition) is true or false. In much of his work, Dummett has made this the characteristic mark of realism, and often identifies realism about some subject-matter with accepting bivalence for discourse about that subject-matter. At the very least, it captures a great deal of what is more loosely put in the statement of realism above.

Either the approach makes the theory of truth—or truth-and-reference—the primary vehicle for an account of realism. A theory of truth which substantiates bivalence, or a determinate reference relation, does most of the work of giving a realistic metaphysics. It might even simply be a realistic metaphysics.

We have thus turned on its head the relation of truth to metaphysics we saw in our discussion of the neo-classical correspondence theory in section 1.1. There, a correspondence theory of truth was built upon a substantial metaphysics. Here, we have seen how articulating a theory that captures the idea of correspondence can be crucial to providing a realist metaphysics. (For another perspective on realism and truth, see Alston (1996). Devitt (1984) offers an opposing view to the kind we have sketched here, which rejects any characterization of realism in terms of truth or other semantic concepts.)

In light of our discussion in section 1.1.1, we should pause to note that the connection between realism and the correspondence theory of truth is not absolute. When Moore and Russell held the identity theory of truth, they were most certainly realists. The right kind of metaphysics of propositions can support a realist view, as can a metaphysics of facts. The modern form of realism we have been discussing here seeks to avoid basing itself on such particular ontological commitments, and so prefers to rely on the kind of correspondence-without-facts approach discussed in section 3.1. This is not to say that realism will be devoid of ontological commitments, but the commitments will flow from whichever specific claims about some subject-matter are taken to be true.

For more on realism and truth, see Fumerton (2002) and the entry on realism.

4.2 Anti-realism and truth

It should come as no surprise that the relation between truth and metaphysics seen by modern realists can also be exploited by anti-realists. Many modern anti-realists see the theory of truth as the key to formulating and defending their views. With Dummett (e.g., 1959; 1976; 1991), we might expect the characteristic mark of anti-realism to be the rejection of bivalence.

Indeed, many contemporary forms of anti-realism may be formulated as theories of truth, and they do typically deny bivalence. Anti-realism comes in many forms, but let us take as an example a (somewhat crude) form of verificationism. Such a theory holds that a claim is correct just insofar as it is in principle verifiable, i.e., there is a verification procedure we could in principle carry out which would yield the answer that the claim in question was verified.

So understood, verificationism is a theory of truth. The claim is not that verification is the most important epistemic notion, but that truth just is verifiability. As with the kind of realism we considered in section 4.1, this view expresses its metaphysical commitments in its explanation of the nature of truth. Truth is not, to this view, a fully objective matter, independent of us or our thoughts. Instead, truth is constrained by our abilities to verify, and is thus constrained by our epistemic situation. Truth is to a significant degree an epistemic matter, which is typical of many anti-realist positions.

As Dummett says, the verificationist notion of truth does not appear to support bivalence. Any statement that reaches beyond what we can in principle verify or refute (verify its negation) will be a counter-example to bivalence. Take, for instance, the claim that there is some substance, say uranium, present in some region of the universe too distant to be inspected by us within the expected lifespan of the universe. Insofar as this really would be in principle unverifiable, we have no reason to maintain it is true or false according to the verificationist theory of truth.

Verificationism of this sort is one of a family of anti-realist views. Another example is the view that identifies truth with warranted assertibility. Assertibility, as well as verifiability, has been important in Dummett's work. (See also works of McDowell, e.g., 1976 and Wright, e.g., 1976; 1982; 1992.)

Anti-realism of the Dummettian sort is not a descendant of the coherence theory of truth per se. But in some ways, as Dummett himself has noted, it might be construed as a descendant—perhaps very distant—of idealism. If idealism is the most drastic form of rejection of the independence of mind and world, Dummettian anti-realism is a more modest form, which sees epistemology imprinted in the world, rather than the wholesale embedding of world into mind. At the same time, the idea of truth as warranted assertibility or verifiability reiterates a theme from the pragmatist views of truth we surveyed in section 1.3.

Anti-realist theories of truth, like the realist ones we discussed in section 4.1, can generally make use of the Tarskian apparatus. Convention T, in particular, does not discriminate between realist and anti-realist notions of truth. Likewise, the base clauses of a Tarskian recursive theory are given as disquotation principles, which are neutral between realist and anti-realist understandings of notions like reference. As we saw with the correspondence theory, giving a full account of the nature of truth will generally require more than the Tarskian apparatus itself. How an anti-realist is to explain the basic concepts that go into a Tarskian theory is a delicate matter. As Dummett and Wright have investigated in great detail, it appears that the background logic in which the theory is developed will have to be non-classical.

For more on anti-realism and truth, see the papers in Greenough and Lynch (2006) and the entry on realism.

4.3 Anti-realism and pragmatism

Many commentators see a close connection between Dummett's anti-realism and the pragmatists' views of truth, in that both put great weight on ideas of verifiability or assertibility. Dummett himself stressed parallels between anti-realism and intuitionism in the philosophy of mathematics.

Another view on truth which returns to pragmatist themes is the ‘internal realism’ of Putnam (1981). There Putnam glosses truth as what would be justified under ideal epistemic conditions. With the pragmatists, Putnam sees the ideal conditions as something which can be approximated, echoing the idea of truth as the end of inquiry.

Putnam is cautious about calling his view anti-realism, preferring the label ‘internal realism’. But he is clear that he sees his view as opposed to realism (‘metaphysical realism’, as he calls it).

Davidson's views on truth have also been associated with pragmatism, notably by Rorty (1986). Davidson has distanced himself from this interpretation (e.g., 1990), but he does highlight connections between truth and belief and meaning. Insofar as these are human attitudes or relate to human actions, Davidson grants there is some affinity between his views and those of some pragmatists (especially, he says, Dewey).

4.4 Truth pluralism

Another view that has grown out of the literature on realism and anti-realism, and has become increasingly important in the current literature, is that of pluralism about truth. This view, developed in work of Lynch (e.g. 2001b; 2009) and Wright (e.g. 1992; 1999), proposes that there are multiple ways for truth bearers to be true. Wright, in particular, suggests that in certain domains of discourse what we say is true in virtue of a correspondence-like relation, while in others it is its true in virtue of a kind of assertibility relation that is closer in spirit to the anti-realist views we have just discussed.

Such a proposal might suggest there are multiple concepts of truth, or that the term ‘true’ is itself ambiguous. However, whether or not a pluralist view is committed to such claims has been disputed. In particular, Lynch (2001b; 2009) develops a version of pluralism which takes truth to be a functional role concept. The functional role of truth is characterized by a range of principles that articulate such features of truth as its objectivity, its role in inquiry, and related ideas we have encountered in considering various theories of truth. (A related point about platitudes governing the concept of truth is made by Wright (1992).) But according to Lynch, these display the functional role of truth. Furthermore, Lynch claims that on analogy with analytic functionalism, these principles can be seen as deriving from our pre-theoretic or ‘folk’ ideas about truth.

Like all functional role concepts, truth must be realized, and according to Lynch it may be realized in different ways in different settings. Such multiple realizability has been one of the hallmarks of functional role concepts discussed in the philosophy of mind. For instance, Lynch suggests that for ordinary claims about material objects, truth might be realized by a correspondence property (which he links to representational views), while for moral claims truth might be manifest by an assertibility property along more anti-realist lines.

For more on pluralism about truth, see the entry on pluralist theories of truth.

5. Deflationism

We began in section 1 with the neo-classical theories, which explained the nature of truth within wider metaphysical systems. We then considered some alternatives in sections 2 and 3, some of which had more modest ontological implications. But we still saw in section 4 that substantial theories of truth tend to imply metaphysical theses, or even embody metaphysical positions.

One long-standing trend in the discussion of truth is to insist that truth really does not carry metaphysical significance at all. It does not, as it has no significance on its own. A number of different ideas have been advanced along these lines, under the general heading of deflationism.

5.1 The redundancy theory

Deflationist ideas appear quite early on, including a well-known argument against correspondence in Frege (1918–19). However, many deflationists take their cue from an idea of Ramsey (1927), often called the equivalence thesis:

  φ is true has the same meaning as φ.

(Ramsey himself takes truth-bearers to be propositions rather than sentences. Glanzberg (2003b) questions whether Ramsey's account of propositions really makes him a deflationist.)

This can be taken as the core of a theory of truth, often called the redundancy theory. The redundancy theory holds that there is no property of truth at all, and appearances of the expression ‘true’ in our sentences are redundant, having no effect on what we express.

The equivalence thesis can also be understood in terms of speech acts rather than meaning:

To assert that φ is true is just to assert that φ.

This view was advanced by Strawson (1949; 1950), though Strawson also argues that there are other important aspects of speech acts involving ‘true’ beyond what is asserted. For instance, they may be acts of confirming or granting what someone else said. (Strawson would also object to my making sentences the bearers of truth.)

In either its speech act or meaning form, the redundancy theory argues there is no property of truth. It is commonly noted that the equivalence thesis itself is not enough to sustain the redundancy theory. It merely holds that when truth occurs in the outermost position in a sentence, and the full sentence to which truth is predicated is quoted, then truth is eliminable. What happens in other environments is left to be seen. Modern developments of the redundancy theory include Grover et al. (1975).

5.2 Minimalist theories

The equivalence principle looks familiar: it has something like the form of the Tarski biconditionals discussed in section 2.2. However, it is a stronger principle, which identifies the two sides of the biconditional—either their meanings or the speech acts performed with them. The Tarski biconditionals themselves are simply material biconditionals.

A number of deflationary theories look to the Tarski biconditionals rather than the full equivalence principle. Their key idea is that even if we do not insist on redundancy, we may still hold the following theses:

  1. For a given language L and every φ in L, the biconditionals   φ is true if and only if φ hold by definition (or analytically, or trivially, or by stipulation …).
  2. This is all there is to say about the concept of truth.

We will refer to views which adopt these as minimalist. Officially, this is the name of the view of Horwich (1990), but we will apply it somewhat more widely. (Horwich's view differs in some specific respects from what is presented here, such as predicating truth of propositions, but we believe it is close enough to what is sketched here to justify the name.)

The second thesis, that the Tarski biconditionals are all there is to say about truth, captures something similar to the redundancy theory's view. It comes near to saying that truth is not a property at all; to the extent that truth is a property, there is no more to it than the disquotational pattern of the Tarski biconditionals. As Horwich puts it, there is no substantial underlying metaphysics to truth. And as Soames (1984) stresses, certainly nothing that could ground as far-reaching a view as realism or anti-realism.

5.3 Other aspects of deflationism

If there is no property of truth, or no substantial property of truth, what role does our term ‘true’ play? Deflationists typically note that the truth predicate provides us with a convenient device of disquotation. Such a device allows us to make some useful claims which we could not formulate otherwise, such as the blind ascription ‘The next thing that Bill says will be true’. (For more on blind ascriptions and their relation to deflationism, see Azzouni, 2001.) A predicate obeying the Tarski biconditionals can also be used to express what would otherwise be (potentially) infinite conjunctions or disjunctions, such as the notorious statement of Papal infallibility put ‘Everything the Pope says is true’. (Suggestions like this are found in Leeds, 1978 and Quine, 1970.)

Recognizing these uses for a truth predicate, we might simply think of it as introduced into a language by stipulation. The Tarski biconditionals themselves might be stipulated, as the minimalists envisage. One could also construe the clauses of a recursive Tarskian theory as stipulated. (There are some significant logical differences between these two options. See Halbach (1999) and Ketland (1999) for discussion.) Other deflationists, such as Beall (2005) or Field (1994), might prefer to focus here on rules of inference or rules of use, rather than the Tarski biconditionals themselves.

There are also important connections between deflationist ideas about truth and certain ideas about meaning. These are fundamental to the deflationism of Field (1986; 1994), which will be discussed in section 6.3. For an insightful critique of deflationism, see Gupta (1993).

For more on deflationism, see the entry on the deflationary theory of truth.

6. Truth and language

One of the important themes in the literature on truth is its connection to meaning, or more generally, to language. This has proved an important application of ideas about truth, and an important issue in the study of truth itself. This section will consider a number of issues relating truth and language.

6.1 Truth-bearers

There have been many debates in the literature over what the primary bearers of truth are. Candidates typically include beliefs, propositions, sentences, and utterances. We have already seen in section 1 that the classical debates on truth took this issue very seriously, and what sort of theory of truth was viable was often seen to depend on what the bearers of truth are.

In spite of the number of options under discussion, and the significance that has sometimes been placed on the choice, there is an important similarity between candidate truth-bearers. Consider the role of truth-bearers in the correspondence theory, for instance. We have seen versions of it which take beliefs, propositions, or interpreted sentences to be the primary bearers of truth. But all of them rely upon the idea that their truth-bearers are meaningful, and are thereby able to say something about what the world is like. (We might say that they are able to represent the world, but that is to use ‘represent’ in a wider sense than we saw in section 3.2. No assumptions about just what stands in relations to what objects are required to see truth-bearers as meaningful.) It is in virtue of being meaningful that truth-bearers are able to enter into correspondence relations. Truth-bearers are things which meaningfully make claims about what the world is like, and are true or false depending on whether the facts in the world are as described.

Exactly the same point can be made for the anti-realist theories of truth we saw in section 4.2, though with different accounts of how truth-bearers are meaningful, and what the world contributes. Though it is somewhat more delicate, something similar can be said for coherence theories, which usually take beliefs, or whole systems of beliefs, as the primary truth-bearers. Though a coherence theory will hardly talk of beliefs representing the facts, it is crucial to the coherence theory that beliefs are contentful beliefs of agents, and that they can enter into coherence relations. Noting the complications in interpreting the genuine classical coherence theories, it appears fair to note that this requires truth-bearers to be meaningful, however the background metaphysics (presumably idealism) understands meaning.

Though Tarski works with sentences, the same can be said of his theory. The sentences to which Tarski's theory applies are fully interpreted, and so also are meaningful. They characterize the world as being some way or another, and this in turn determines whether they are true or false. Indeed, Tarski needs there to be a fact of the matter about whether each sentence is true or false (abstracting away from context dependence), to ensure that the Tarski biconditionals do their job of fixing the extension of ‘is true’. (But note that just what this fact of the matter consists in is left open by the Tarskian apparatus.)

We thus find the usual candidate truth-bearers linked in a tight circle: interpreted sentences, the propositions they express, the belief speakers might hold towards them, and the acts of assertion they might perform with them are all connected by providing something meaningful. This makes them reasonable bearers of truth. For this reason, it seems, contemporary debates on truth have been much less concerned with the issue of truth-bearers than were the classical ones. Some issues remain, of course. Different metaphysical assumptions may place primary weight on some particular node in the circle, and some metaphysical views still challenge the existence of some of the nodes. Perhaps more importantly, different views on the nature of meaning itself might cast doubt on the coherence of some of the nodes. Notoriously for instance, Quineans (e.g., Quine, 1960) deny the existence of intensional entities, including propositions. Even so, it increasingly appears doubtful that attention to truth per se will bias us towards one particular primary bearer of truth.

6.2 Truth and truth conditions

There is a related, but somewhat different point, which is important to understanding the theories we have canvassed.

The neo-classical theories of truth start with truth-bearers which are already understood to be meaningful, and explain how they get their truth values. But along the way, they often do something more. Take the neo-classical correspondence theory, for instance. This theory, in effect, starts with a view of how propositions are meaningful. They are so in virtue of having constituents in the world, which are brought together in the right way. There are many complications about the nature of meaning, but at a minimum, this tells us what the truth conditions associated with a proposition are. The theory then explains how such truth conditions can lead to the truth value true, by the right fact existing.

Many theories of truth are like the neo-classical correspondence theory in being as much theories of how truth-bearers are meaningful as of how their truth values are fixed. Again, abstracting from some complications about meaning, this makes them theories both of truth conditions and truth values. The Tarskian theory of truth can be construed this way too. This can be seen both in the way the Tarski biconditionals are understood, and how a recursive theory of truth is understood. As we explained Convention T in section 2.2, the primary role of a Tarski biconditional of the form   φ is true if and only if φ is to fix whether φ is in the extension of ‘is true’ or not. But it can also be seen as stating the truth conditions of φ. Both rely on the fact that the unquoted occurrence of φ is an occurrence of an interpreted sentence, which has a truth value, but also provides its truth conditions upon occasions of use.

Likewise, the base clauses of the recursive definition of truth, those for reference and satisfaction, are taken to state the relevant semantic properties of constituents of an interpreted sentence. In discussing Tarski's theory of truth in section 2, we focused on how these determine the truth value of a sentence. But they also show us the truth conditions of a sentence are determined by these semantic properties. For instance, for a simple sentence like ‘Snow is white’, the theory tells us that the sentence is true if the referent of ‘Snow’ satisfies ‘white’. This can be understood as telling us that the truth conditions of ‘Snow is white’ are those conditions in which the referent of ‘Snow’ satisfies the predicate ‘is white’.

As we saw in sections 3 and 4, the Tarskian apparatus is often seen as needing some kind of supplementation to provide a full theory of truth. A full theory of truth conditions will likewise rest on how the Tarskian apparatus is put to use. In particular, just what kinds of conditions those in which the referent of ‘snow’ satisfies the predicate ‘is white’ are will depend on whether we opt for realist or anti-realist theories. The realist option will simply look for the conditions under which the stuff snow bears the property of whiteness; the anti-realist option will look to the conditions under which it can be verified, or asserted with warrant, that snow is white.

There is a broad family of theories of truth which are theories of truth conditions as well as truth values. This family includes the correspondence theory in all its forms—classical and modern. Yet this family is much wider than the correspondence theory, and wider than realist theories of truth more generally. Indeed, virtually all the theories of truth that make contributions to the realism/anti-realism debate are theories of truth conditions. In a slogan, for many approaches to truth, a theory of truth is a theory of truth conditions.

6.3 Truth conditions and deflationism

Any theory that provides a substantial account of truth conditions can offer a simple account of truth values: a truth-bearer provides truth conditions, and it is true if and only if the actual way things are is among them. Because of this, any such theory will imply a strong, but very particular, biconditional, close in form to the Tarski biconditionals. It can be made most vivid if we think of propositions as sets of truth conditions. Let p be a proposition, i.e., a set of truth conditions, and let a be the ‘actual world’, the condition that actually obtains. Then we can almost trivially see:

p is true if and only if ap.

This is presumably necessary. But it is important to observe that it is in one respect crucially different from the genuine Tarski biconditionals. It makes no use of a non-quoted sentence, or in fact any sentence at all. It does not have the disquotational character of the Tarski biconditionals.

Though this may look like a principle that deflationists should applaud, it is not. Rather, it shows that deflationists cannot really hold a truth-conditional view of content at all. If they do, then they inter alia have a non-deflationary theory of truth, simply by linking truth value to truth conditions through the above biconditional. It is typical of thoroughgoing deflationist theories to present a non-truth-conditional theory of the contents of sentences: a non-truth-conditional account of what makes truth-bearers meaningful. We take it this is what is offered, for instance, by the use theory of propositions in Horwich (1990). It is certainly one of the leading ideas of Field (1986; 1994), which explore how a conceptual role account of content would ground a deflationist view of truth. Once one has a non-truth-conditional account of content, it is then possible to add a deflationist truth predicate, and use this to give purely deflationist statements of truth conditions. But the starting point must be a non-truth-conditional view of what makes truth-bearers meaningful.

Both deflationists and anti-realists start with something other than correspondence truth conditions. But whereas an anti-realist will propose a different theory of truth conditions, a deflationists will start with an account of content which is not a theory of truth conditions at all. The deflationist will then propose that the truth predicate, given by the Tarski biconditionals, is an additional device, not for understanding content, but for disquotation. It is a useful device, as we discussed in section 5.3, but it has nothing to do with content. To a deflationist, the meaningfulness of truth-bearers has nothing to do with truth.

6.4 Truth and the theory of meaning

It has been an influential idea, since the seminal work of Davidson (e.g., 1967), to see a Tarskian theory of truth as a theory of meaning. At least, as we have seen, a Tarskian theory can be seen as showing how the truth conditions of a sentence are determined by the semantic properties of its parts. More generally, as we see in much of the work of Davidson and of Dummett (e.g., 1959; 1976; 1983; 1991), giving a theory of truth conditions can be understood as a crucial part of giving a theory of meaning. Thus, any theory of truth that falls into the broad category of those which are theories of truth conditions can be seen as part of a theory of meaning. (For more discussion of these issues, see Higginbotham (1986; 1989) and the exchange between Higginbotham (1992) and Soames (1992).)

A number of commentators on Tarski (e.g., Etchemendy, 1988; Soames, 1984) have observed that the Tarskian apparatus needs to be understood in a particular way to make it suitable for giving a theory of meaning. Tarski's work is often taken to show how to define a truth predicate. If it is so used, then whether or not a sentence is true becomes, in essence, a truth of mathematics. Presumably what truth conditions sentences of a natural language have is a contingent matter, so a truth predicate defined in this way cannot be used to give a theory of meaning for them. But the Tarskian apparatus need not be used just to explicitly define truth. The recursive characterization of truth can be used to state the semantic properties of sentences and their constituents, as a theory of meaning should. In such an application, truth is not taken to be explicitly defined, but rather the truth conditions of sentences are taken to be described. (See Heck, 1997 for more discussion.)

6.5 The coherence theory and meaning

Inspired by Quine (e.g., 1960), Davidson himself is well known for taking a different approach to using a theory of truth as a theory of meaning than is implicit in Field (1972). Whereas a Field-inspired representational approach is based on a causal account of reference, Davidson (e.g., 1973) proposes a process of radical interpretation in which an interpreter builds a Tarskian theory to interpret a speaker as holding beliefs which are consistent, coherent, and largely true.

This led Davidson (e.g. 1986) to argue that most of our beliefs are true—a conclusion that squares well with the coherence theory of truth. This is a weaker claim than the neo-classical coherence theory would make. It does not insist that all the members of any coherent set of beliefs are true, or that truth simply consists in being a member of such a coherent set. But all the same, the conclusion that most of our beliefs are true, because their contents are to be understood through a process of radical interpretation which will make them a coherent and rational system, has a clear affinity with the neo-classical coherence theory.

In Davidson (1986), he thought his view of truth had enough affinity with the neo-classical coherence theory to warrant being called a coherence theory of truth, while at the same time he saw the role of Tarskian apparatus as warranting the claim that his view was also compatible with a kind of correspondence theory of truth.

In later work, however, Davidson reconsidered this position. In fact, already in Davidson (1977) he had expressed doubt about any understanding of the role of Tarski's theory in radical interpretation that involves the kind of representational apparatus relied on by Field (1972), as we discussed in sections 3.1 and 3.2. In the “Afterthoughts” to Davidson (1986), he also concluded that his view departs too far from the neo-classical coherence theory to be named one. What is important is rather the role of radical interpretation in the theory of content, and its leading to the idea that belief is veridical. These are indeed points connected to coherence, but not to the coherence theory of truth per se. They also comprise a strong form of anti-representationalism. Thus, though he does not advance a coherence theory of truth, he does advance a theory that stands in opposition to the representational variants of the correspondence theory we discussed in section 3.2.

For more on Davidson, see Glanzberg (2013) and the entry on Donald Davidson.

6.6 Truth and assertion

The relation between truth and meaning is not the only place where truth and language relate closely. Another is the idea, also much-stressed in the writings of Dummett (e.g., 1959), of the relation between truth and assertion. Again, it fits into a platitude:

Truth is the aim of assertion.

A person making an assertion, the platitude holds, aims to say something true.

It is easy to cast this platitude in a way that appears false. Surely, many speakers do not aim to say something true. Any speaker who lies does not. Any speaker whose aim is to flatter, or to deceive, aims at something other than truth.

The motivation for the truth-assertion platitude is rather different. It looks at assertion as a practice, in which certain rules are constitutive. As is often noted, the natural parallel here is with games, like chess or baseball, which are defined by certain rules. The platitude holds that it is constitutive of the practice of making assertions that assertions aim at truth. An assertion by its nature presents what it is saying as true, and any assertion which fails to be true is ipso facto liable to criticism, whether or not the person making the assertion themself wished to have said something true or to have lied.

Dummett's original discussion of this idea was partially a criticism of deflationism (in particular, of views of Strawson, 1950). The idea that we fully explain the concept of truth by way of the Tarski biconditionals is challenged by the claim that the truth-assertion platitude is fundamental to truth. As Dummett there put it, what is left out by the Tarski biconditionals, and captured by the truth-assertion platitude, is the point of the concept of truth, or what the concept is used for. (For further discussion, see Glanzberg, 2003a and Wright, 1992.)

Whether or not assertion has such constitutive rules is, of course, controversial. But among those who accept that it does, the place of truth in the constitutive rules is itself controversial. The leading alternative, defended by Williamson (1996), is that knowledge, not truth, is fundamental to the constitutive rules of assertion. Williamson defends an account of assertion based on the rule that one must assert only what one knows.

For more on truth and assertion, see the papers in Brown and Cappelen (2011) and the entry on assertion.

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Related Entries

Davidson, Donald | facts | James, William | liar paradox | Peirce, Charles Sanders | realism | Tarski, Alfred: truth definitions | truth: axiomatic theories of | truth: coherence theory of | truth: correspondence theory of | truth: deflationary theory of | truth: identity theory of | truth: pluralist theories of

Acknowledgments

Thanks to Josh Parsons for advice on metaphysics, and to Jc Beall, Justin Khoo, Jason Stanley, Paul Teller, and an anonymous referee for very helpful comments on earlier drafts.

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