Notes to Value Pluralism

1. For example, it has been argued that all moral theories can be described in consequentialist terms, and so consequentialism is trivial, and it has been argued that virtue ethics is not a structurally distinct theory from consequentialism or deontology. See the entries on consequentialism and on virtue ethics. However, it is certainly the case that deontologists and consequentialists tend to talk about value in a different way. Here I shall remain neutral on whether or not these different ways of talking really reflect different views about the nature of value.

2. I shall return to the complicated question of what kind of pluralist Ross is.

3. See the entry on hedonism or more about hedonist theories. Utilitarians have also suggested desire or preference satisfaction as the value to be maximized. Not all utilitarians are monists. Some argue that there is a plurality of goods to be maximized, and of course not all consequentialists restrict these goods to welfare type goods—some argue that goods like justice and equality ought to be included. Additionally, not all apparently monist forms of consequentialism are genuinely monist—take a utilitarianism which claims that happiness ought to be maximized: this view must find something to say about unhappiness, which is not merely the absence of happiness (as one can be both happy and unhappy), and if unhappiness is taken to be a distinct disvalue (as opposed to being merely the absence of value), then the theory is pluralist.

4. This is the famous open question argument. Moore establishes his preliminary conclusion that when we say ‘x is good’ we do not mean anything naturalistic like ‘x is pleasure’ by pointing out that there is always an open question of the form, ‘but is pleasure good?’. So according to Moore, the naturalistic fallacy consists in thinking that there is a naturalistic account of goodness. See the entry on Moore's moral philosophy.

5. There is still an ambiguity here: in order for the theory to be foundationally monist we must assume that the judgment of the expert judges is univocal—it would be less ambiguous if we thought in terms of one expert judge. I return to preference satisfaction accounts below.

6. The distinction was introduced by Bales (1971). For more on its use in consequentialism see the entries on consequentialism and on rule consequentialism. In recent discussions of consequentialist theories, the strategy has often been used to argue that a consequentialist agent need not be motivated purely by the (monist) good, but can also be motivated by such things as her friends, her relationships, and her personal projects. This is an example of decision procedural pluralism.

7. There are too many such discussions to cite here: see entries on friendship, on pleasure, and on Kant's moral philosophy. Feldman's view is presented in Feldman (2004). It should be noted that Feldman's overall view is not a monist one, as he includes values such as justice and desert as well as pleasure in his account of what ought to be done.

8. Griffin's account of value is complex and subtle. His view is a foundational monist one on my classification: he thinks that the basic value is informed desire fulfillment, and he is a normative pluralist because he thinks that we desire irreducibly plural things, and so from our point of view there are plural values. Furthermore, the things we desire are values in a deep sense—I discuss Griffin's view in detail in the section on preference satisfaction views.

9. Of course, Mill himself may have intended his higher and lower pleasures as foundational plural values—but that debate can be left aside.

10. Griffin presents a similar view in his later book, Value Judgment. In that book Griffin's view is more identifiable as foundational pluralism.

Copyright © 2011 by
Elinor Mason <>

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