Notes to Chauncey Wright

1. Treatments of Wright in relation to American pragmatism include Kennedy 1935, Ratner 1936, Schneider 1946, 439-441, and Wiener, 1945 and 1949. See Schneider's review, 1950, of Wiener; also Madden 1953 and 1963, and Giuffrida 1978. Ratner, Kennedy, and Wiener all see a close connection between Wright's scientific methodology and pragmatism, while Schneider emphasizes Wright's relation to traditional empiricism. Madden and Giuffrida analyze Wright's verificationism, contrasting it to Peirce, James, and the later logical positivists. Some of these articles are collected, along with other interpretations of Wright, in Ryan and Madden 2000, vol. 3.

2. For testimony to Wright's influence on all three, see Peirce's “A Definition of Pragmatic or Pragmatism” in Peirce 1960, 5.12 and 5.64. For his influence on William James, see Perry 1935, I, ch. XXXI. For Wright's influence on Holmes, see Holmes 1953, I, 565, where Holmes began his appreciation of Wright by expressing skepticism about Peirce:

It seemed to me that [Peirce] was rather overrated especially allowing for what he owed to Chauncey Wright — (I remember old James, the father, who had the Irish impatience of logic, which William inherited, saying once: ‘There was Chauncey Wright like a great brass pot listening to the sound of his own emptiness.’) Chauncey Wright taught me that you couldn't affirm necessity of the Universe.

Holmes referred to this lesson several times (see for instance Holmes 1953, I, 634). In correspondence with Morris Cohen, he again linked Peirce and Wright. In the context of criticizing Peirce's writings on evolution and cosmology (collected by Cohen in Chance, Love, and Logic) Holmes said, “That we could not assert necessity of the order of the universe I learned to believe from Chauncey Wright long ago” (Cohen 1948, 34-35). It was a tenet of nineteenth and early twentieth century positivism that no necessity could be inferred to belong to nature or the cosmos but only to our theories or logical systems.

3. Chief sources of biographical information about Wright are PD vii-xxiii, L, ch. I and the letter by E. W. Gurney, L, ch. X, this last reprinted in Madden 1958. See Fiske 1885, ch. VI, and James' obituary notice (James 1875) reprinted in James 1987, 15-17 and in Madden 1958, 143-45. All of these sources are reprinted in Ryan and Madden 2000.

4. Wright 1877 and 1878. Philosophical Discussion is hereafter cited in text as PD. Letters is cited as L. These works are reprinted in Ryan and Madden 2000, vol. 1 and 2.

5. For a treatment of Wright's understanding of the empirically given in relation to scientific inference, see Madden 1972, reprinted in Ryan and Madden 2000, vol. 3.

6. See Ernst Mach 1960 and Comte 1853. Given Wright's limitations in reading foreign languages (L 373), he may have used the abridgement and English translation of Comte by Harriet Martineau (Comte 1853), hereafter cited as Comte). For Wright's views on Comte, see Wright 1866, quoted in Wiener 1945, 43. For his knowledge of German positivism, see his general remarks in “German Darwinism,” PD 398-405.

7. For the parallel in Comte, see Comte 39. This comparison casts doubt on Fiske's conjecture that Wright knew Comte's works only “by hearsay” (Fiske 1885, 103).

8. For Wright's understanding of meaning as distinguished from the later American pragmatists, see Giuffrida 1978.

9. ‘Consilience’ is a term used by E.O. Wilson in 1998 (Consilience: the Unity of Knowledge, New York: Knopf) to describe what he saw as a developing synthesis of science with the humanities, based on principles of natural science.

10. See the section the Philosophy of Science in the entry on William Whewell.

11. For a treatment of the relation of natural selection and utilitarian ethics for Wright, see Chambliss 1960.

12. Peirce certainly was aware of Wright's caution against appropriating evolution for metaphysical speculation but did not heed it. See Wiener 1949, ch. 3 and 4, and Holmes' criticism (Cohen 1948, 34-35). Wright's influence on James with respect to evolution was in the area of psychology. See Wiener 1949, 54-55 and ch.5.

13. For more on this topic, see Madden 1993.

Copyright © 2009 by
Jean De Groot <degroot@cua.edu>

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