Eric M. Hammer and Edward N. Zalta*
Center for the Study of Language and Information
Abstract: This paper describes a way of creating and maintaining a `dynamic encyclopedia', i.e., an encyclopedia whose entries can be improved and updated on a continual basis without requiring the production of an entire new edition. Such an encyclopedia is therefore responsive to new developments and new research. We discuss our implementation of a dynamic encyclopedia and the problems that we had to solve along the way. We also discuss ways of automating the administration of the encyclopedia.
Note: This paper appeared in Computers and the Humanities (Volume 31/1, 1997, pp. 47-60). It is reprinted here with permission from the publisher. You may also access the paper in Adobe Acrobat (PDF) format.
Note 2: The system described in this paper was developed in 1995–1996, and was superceded by the system we built with funds from the NEH and NSF under Digital Libraries Initiative. We abandoned the ftp-based system described below in favor of a system of password-protected browser-based file-upload and browser-based remote file-editing and file-comparison of entries in a private portion of our web-server, on the principle that uploaded and edited files must all be refereed before they are moved into webspace. See the Publishing Model described at http://plato.stanford.edu/about.html
The greatest problem with encyclopedias is that they tend to go out of date. Various solutions to this problem have been tried. One is to produce new editions in rapid succession.* Another is to publish supplements or yearbooks on a regular basis.* Another is to publish the encyclopedia in loose-leaf format.* In this paper, we propose a solution to this problem, namely, a `dynamic' encyclopedia that is published on the Internet.* Unlike static encyclopedias (i.e., encyclopedias that will become fixed in print or on CD-ROM), the dynamic encyclopedia allows entries to be improved and refined, thereby becoming responsive to new research and advances in the field. Though there are Internet encyclopedias which are being updated on a regular basis, typically none of these projects gives the authors direct access to the material being published. However, we have developed a dynamic encyclopedia which gives the authors direct access to their entries and the means to update them whenever it is needed, and which does so without sacrificing the quality of the entries. In the effort to produce a dynamic encyclopedia of high quality, we discovered that numerous problems had to be solved and that routine editorial and administrational functions could be automated. By reporting on our project, we hope to facilitate the creation of such reference works in other fields.
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