Encyclopedias are, in some sense, a collaborative effort. It seems natural, therefore, to analyze the task of building a dynamic encyclopedia in terms of `computer supported collaborative work' (CSCW).* For example, since both the Editor and the author will have write access to an entry, the place on the disk where the entry is stored constitutes a `group workspace'.* Thus version control may seem necessary to prevent simultaneous editing by different `group members'.
Version control could prove useful on those rare occasions when the Editor, as opposed to the author, changes an entry to repair a typographical error or fix some problematic HTML code. Although the Editor will typically leave such tasks to the authors, there may be times when quick action by the Editor is necessary. On such occasions, authors and Editor could find themselves in the situation of attempting to modify the entry simultaneously. However, to avoid such conflicts, we instruct our authors to follow a protocol for revising their work, namely, to begin both by notifying the Editor of their intentions and by downloading the current version of their entry from the Encyclopedia. Such a procedure will prevent author and editor from overwriting each others modifications.*
Coauthored entries will obviously be highly collaborative, but these constitute only a very small percentage of the entries. If we ignore coauthored entries, it is striking that some of the distinguishing features of CSCW are absent. For example, no member of the group of authors requires information on the current status of the work being done by other group members.* Moreover, no member of the group of authors requires information about the history of other authors' collaborative activities. Nor do members of the group of authors require information about the process of collaboration (e.g., the roles and responsibilities of other members, and which group members fit into which roles).
These features of CSCW, however, do apply to the Editor, who requires information on the current status of the work by the authors, on aspects of the history of the authors' activities, and on the process of collaboration. In addition, members of the Board of Editors will need information about the history of the activities of those authors writing on topics under their editorial control; for example, a board member needs to know as soon as such an author has updated an entry. And, finally, if the encyclopedia project has the financial resources to maintain a large central staff, then such CSCW concepts as conferencing, bulletin boards, structured messaging, meeting schedulers, and organizational memory could play a role in the design of administrative procedures.
Since we are operating on a much smaller scale, these last CSCW concepts will play almost no role in what follows. The CSCW features that do apply will become features of the central administrative control of the encyclopedia and can be managed by properly defined databases and updating procedures. Thus, the CSCW concept most relevant to our enterprise is `work flow management'. By analyzing the way in which the Encyclopedia would typically function (i.e., the sequence of tasks of the parties involved and the sequence of transactions among the parties), one can predict and address many of the problems that would affect the smooth operation of the Encyclopedia. These will be discussed in the next two sections. Even the choice of technologies was to some extent dictated by this analysis of work-flow. For example, we investigated SGML as a possible markup language for the Encyclopedia entries and we created a Document Type Definition for a typical encyclopedia entry (thereby defining tags that the authors would use to mark up their entries). Although SGML is superior in many respects, several factors prompted us to choose standard HTML, including (i) the availability of HTML editors and guides (which makes it easy for authors to produce entries in the proper format without extensive training), and (ii) the availability of good, free HTML search engines. Many other choices about the construction of the encyclopedia were made on the basis of such work-flow considerations.
It should be clear from our brief description that a dynamic encyclopedia poses very interesting questions concerning work-flow management. With adequate financial resources, a project of this type might consider buying, adapting, and/or modifying some off-the-shelf commercial workflow management system.* But few of the systems available seem to be designed to solve the specific problems of the dynamic encyclopedia concept that we wanted to implement. We therefore decided to develop our own solution to the problems of work-flow, one tailored to our specific needs. Having Unix and perl as resources, we have been able to address the special problems that arise in working out the idea of a dynamic encyclopedia.