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Why Philosophy Needs a Dynamic Encyclopedia of Philosophy

[This piece was authored by John Perry and Edward N. Zalta in November 1997.]

Sections

Introduction

At the Center for the Study of Language and Information (CSLI), we have developed a solution to the problem of updating encyclopedias, namely, a ‘dynamic’ encyclopedia that is published on the Internet. Unlike static encyclopedias (i.e., encyclopedias that will become fixed in print or on CD-ROM), a dynamic encyclopedia allows entries to be updated, thereby becoming responsive to new research and advances in the field. A dynamic encyclopedia gives the authors direct electronic access to their entries and the means to update them whenever it is needed, and it does this without compromising the quality of the entries. Whereas static encyclopedias must publish supplements or an entire new edition to become current, a dynamic encyclopedia simply evolves and quickly adapts to reflect advances in research. The process of updating an encyclopedia never ceases, and the very concept of a dynamic encyclopedia takes account of this fact.

The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy is our working prototype of a dynamic encyclopedia. This prototype implements the technical specifications developed in the paper ‘A Solution to the Problem of Updating Encyclopedias’, which was coauthored by Eric Hammer and Edward N. Zalta (Computers and the Humanities, Volume 31/1, 1997, pp. 47-60).

We are now working towards the goal of turning this working prototype into a mature dynamic encyclopedia that will be useful both to professional scholars and the general public. It will not be a ‘finished’ product because dynamic encyclopedias are never finished. But within a few years, we will have refined the operation of this new and innovative kind of dynamic reference work so that it will continue to prove its worth far into the future. We believe that the principles upon which our encyclopedia is based will contribute to a reconceptualization the nature of reference works for the age of the Internet.

Basic Description

To implement our dynamic encyclopedia, we connected a multi-user Unix workstation (plato.stanford.edu) to the Internet and installed a World Wide Web server. We then created a cover page, a table of contents, an editorial page, and a directory entitled entries accessible to the web server. We recruited (and are still recruiting) Editorial Board members for the job of identifying topics, soliciting authors, and reviewing the the entries and updates when they are received. These Board members have begun recruiting authors who have a strong interest in and commitment to the topics on which they write and who will be motivated to keep their entries abreast of the latest advances in research.

However, the innovative technical feature of our encyclopedia is that authors are given a "file-upload" account on plato.stanford.edu, i.e., the computer that runs the encyclopedia's World Wide Web server. Once an Editorial Board member decides on a topic and finds or approves an author to write it, he or she then forwards the information (via email) to the Editor of the encyclopedia, who then creates a file-upload account for the author on plato.stanford.edu and sends the author detailed information on how to prepare the entry and upload the entry (or update) when it is ready. When an author uploads an entry or an update (using a web browser) to his or her private directory on plato.stanford.edu, only the editorial staff can view it (they have password protected access). The Editorial Board member responsible for that entry is automatically notified that the entry has been put online or changed. The Board member then inspects the new material, and if he/she approves it, the new material is then published in public webspace; otherwise, the author is sent suggestions for improvements (and in some cases, the entries must be rejected and a new author must be commissioned).

Innovative Features

The most obvious innovative feature of an encyclopedia fitting this description is that it will not go out of date. When new ideas are published in books and journals of philosophy, the authors of our encyclopedia can summarize the ideas and update their entries. Since the encyclopedia will be accessible to web-browsers such as Netscape or Internet Explorer, a wide audience (academics, students, and the general public) may become informed of the latest advances in thought more quickly. We believe that this will speed up the dissemination of new philosophical ideas to a wide audience.

The other innovative features of a dynamic encyclopedia that has been organized on the above plan are:

  1. The entries in a dynamic encyclopedia can be improved and refined over the course of time. As Board members and colleagues read the entry and give the author feedback, the author can enhance the article to make it more readable, make it more logical in form, repair typographical errors, etc.
  2. The encyclopedia eliminates the often large span of time that appears between productions of large-scale ‘static’ encyclopedias. The Macmillan Encyclopedia of Philosophy (edited by Paul Edwards) was published in 1967. The Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy (edited by Edward Craig) will come out in 1998. During the 30 year gap, no up-to-date full-scale encyclopedia has been available. In 2003, when the Routledge Encyclopedia starts to show a few signs of going out of date, ours will still be current. In 2008, the differences will be even more striking.
  3. The encyclopedia eliminates the lag time between the writing and publication of the entries. There won't be the usual two year delay between the time the article is written and the time the encyclopedia is published. Some of the articles written for the forthcoming Routledge Encyclopedia will already be several years old when they appear in print in 1998.
  4. The encyclopedia can be expanded indefinitely; there is no limit to its inclusiveness or size. New or previously unrecognized topics within a given discipline can be included as soon as they are discovered and judged to be important.
  5. For certain controversial topics, the encyclopedia can include more than one entry on a single topic, each one representing a different point of view. This feature reduces the bias that affects other encyclopedias. The forthcoming Routledge Encyclopedia, by contrast, will contain just a single entry on each topic. Biases of the author may sometimes go unremarked and unsophisticated readers will be unaware of the alternative point of view. We are in a position to publish two or more entries on controversial topics in the philosophy of mind, medical ethics (euthanasia, abortion), political philosophy, etc.
  6. Not only will the Bibliography sections be up to date when entries first come online (since there is no lag time between the writing and publication of the entry), but also, for the first time, encyclopedia entries can be accompanied by more comprehensive bibliographies. Print- and CD-ROM-based encyclopedias have a fixed amount of space to publish bibliographies and so the authors can list only a small number of first-rank articles in the field. Our authors can give a complete listing of first-rank articles and books. If the list proves to be overwhelming, they can further divide the list into first-rank articles and books that must be read and those that should be read. If the list of first-rank articles and books is not overwhelming, the author may develop a more inclusive bibliography. The bibliographies of our entries will therefore become the place to look for references to a given philosophical topic. We expect our authors to update their bibliography once a year.
  7. The encyclopedia will have an automatic cross-referencing system. When new entries come online, the keywords in the section ‘Related Entries’ will be automatically linked to the other entries in the Encyclopedia and the keyword in the other entries referring to the new entry will be linked to the new entry.
  8. The encyclopedia will include not only internal links that cross-reference the entries, but each entry will contain updatable external links in a special section called ‘Other Internet Resources’. The authors may judge which other Internet sites are worthy of being linked into this section of their entry. For example, Andrew Irvine's entry on Bertrand Russell has both internal and external links. In the section ‘Other Internet Resources’ in this entry, there are links to the online Russell Archives at McMaster University, the Bertrand Russell Society web page, the web page of the Bertrand Russell Editorial Project, etc. These updatable links cannot be included in print- or CD-ROM-based encyclopedias, much less be maintained and kept up to date. The entry on Russell in the forthcoming Routledge Encyclopedia will lack such connections to these invaluable Internet resources!
  9. The internet format avoids most of the expenses of production and distribution connected with a major reference work. It eliminates many of the expenses of producing a printed document or CD-ROM: typesetting, copy-editing, printing, and distribution expenses are no longer necessary. We provide authors with an HTML template so that they can easily typeset their entries in HTML using an HTML-editor such as Netscape Navigator Gold (there are now over 10 such HTML-editors on the market, many of which are free for academic use).[1] The editing will be done collaboratively by the editorial assistants, authors, board members, and Editor as a routine function of the quality control systems.
  10. A dynamic encyclopedia can change in response to new technology as new tools and languages develop. For example, if Java becomes more widespread, Encyclopedia entries on neural nets, turing machines, prisoner's dilemmas, evolutionary game theory, etc., can include demonstrations and ‘applets’ that the user of the Encyclopedia can download to learn interactively the concepts being discussed.
  11. Statistics software can process the information in the access log of the encyclopedia web server and identify which sites users access it from, which entries they access most, which topics they search for, etc. Such information can help inform decisions about which entries to add, where to advertise, etc. This information is absolutely invaluable to the editors of an encyclopedia, and yet, no such access statistics can be maintained for static encyclopedias. Since numerous copies of static encyclopedias exist, there is no way to track the frequency individual entries are read. Our access log, which excludes the accesses by our own computers and recognizable WWW indexing worms, indicates that just in the period from September 15, 1996 to September 20, 1997, there were over 19,000 accesses from the U.S. educational (edu) domain, over 24,000 from the commercial (com) domain, over 1000 from the U.S. government (gov) domain, over 300 from the U.S. military (mil) domain, close to 20,000 from the network (net) domain, and over 1000 from the non-profit organization (org) domain (another 27,000 accesses were unresolved). These logs also show that during that same period, the Encyclopedia has been accessed from over 90 different countries, that Andrew Irvine's entry on Bertrand Russell has been accessed nearly 10,000 times, and that our encyclopedia has recently started to average over 8000 accesses per week. (See the Recent Access Statistics page (General Statistical Summary for the period of September 15, 1996 -- September 20, 1997), which is linked into the Editorial Information page of the Encyclopedia.)

No print or CD-ROM based edition of an encyclopedia has the above features and this includes the Routledge Encyclopedia forthcoming in 1998.

Future Significance

What is the future significance of this project, in the context of present availability of encyclopedias in philosophy? In 1998, we will see the publication of a major new reference work, the vast Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy. A new supplementary volume for 1967 Macmillan Encyclopedia was released last year. At least ten other reference works in philosophy have been released recently.[2] It might seem, then, that the reference needs of philosophers are well-served, and that there is little need for the project of an online Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

This is not so, however. The last major, comprehensive encyclopedia before Routledge's was the 1967 Macmillan Encyclopedia. Even in a relatively slow moving field such as philosophy, 30 years is a long time to wait between encyclopedias. As fine as the Macmillan Encyclopedia was, by the time it was five years old, its value as a reference work for the philosophy profession had greatly diminished. By the mid to late 1970s, a student might go to an encyclopedia looking for information about the Kripke/Donnellan theory of reference, the Lewis and Armstrong identity theories of mind, Putnam's functionalist theory of mind, or Rawls's theory of justice and find nothing of value in the Macmillan Encyclopedia. So the philosophy community went for 20 -- 25 years before the recent handbooks and dictionaries attempted to fill the gap.

In this context, the Routledge Encyclopedia will be a welcome addition and a wonderful new tool. But within the next five to ten years, it too will be out of date, along with the other reference works in philosophy cited. There are more professional philosophers, more journals, more articles, more books than every before in history. There is much valuable and interesting work being done that will be cited in undergraduate classes long before another encyclopedia is due on the present thirty year cycle.

Moreover, the philosophy profession cannot be confident that there will ever be another major print encyclopedia. The Routledge encyclopedia represents an enormous investment. The cost of purchase is also enormous, about $2500 for the CD-ROM edition. Routledge will not be quick to replace it. And yet even the CD-ROM technology is already dated for reference tools. By contrast, the Internet is ideal for reference tools, but not ideal (as far as one can see at present) for traditional private print publishers to make money.

Those academic disciplines deemed more scientific and essential to national goals or business interests than philosophy will have many more ways to subsidize their reference needs. We believe a partnership between CSLI and the philosophy profession to develop an online philosophy encyclopedia represents the best chance for the profession not to be left behind and without adequate reference tools in the future.

Our online encyclopedia, by its nature, will never be ‘finished’. But we project that it will be mature, in the sense of having virtually all presently planned entries complete, in about four years. Within two years thereafter, its inventory of articles should be very close to that of the Routledge. That means our Encyclopedia will be available as a full-fledged alternative for philosophy students at about the time that the Routledge encyclopedia begins to show signs of age, and at a time when students will increasingly be familiar with the web and expect to use it for reference work. Because of the fact that our Encyclopedia is ‘alive’, it will stay current.

Thus, we propose not to redo the work that has already been done for the Routledge Encyclopedia, but to to use new technology to begin working on the next generation of reference tools for philosophers and their students.

Funding the Encyclopedia

Most of the effort that goes into the creation and maintenance of the Encyclopedia will be donated by those who welcome the opportunity to advance the serious study of their favorite topics and figures. Our plan is that the authors, the Board of Editors and the Advisory Board will be unpaid (unless the Encyclopedia resolves its funding problems). For the foreseeable future, CSLI will provide an office for the Encyclopedia staff and computer, backup systems, and cover other indirect costs. If in the future CSLI goes out of existence or is unable to provide this support, it seems likely some other institution could be found that would do so, either here at Stanford or on some other campus. The amount of space and computer power are not that great, by the standards of late twentieth century American academia.

However, we do not believe the Encyclopedia can function on a completely volunteer basis. At a minimum, we must pay for a part-time Editor, part-time editorial assistants and at least one part-time computer programmer. Some equipment and supplies have to be purchased and telephone and other services (e.g., networking) need to be paid for. We estimate costs (November 1997) as follows:

1. Staff Salaries: $100,000
2. Staff Benefits: $25,000
3. Supplies, equipment, services, etc.: $25,000
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4. Total: $150,000

Print encyclopedias are funded by sales to individual and institutional users. Our hope is our dynamic encyclopedia will remain free to all individual users. There should be as few obstacles to the serious study of philosophy as possible. We hope that the online encyclopedia will be available to anyone anywhere with access to the net.

The institutions most closely associated with users include Philosophy departments, universities (and their libraries), and professional organizations for philosophers (such as the APA, CPA, AAP, etc.). Universities should be able, in the long run, to support online encyclopedias and other online resource materials from the same budget lines used for print materials that now serve these purposes. One strategy for funding the Encyclopedia would be to charge university libraries a nominal yearly access (subscription) fee. This subscription fee would give computers based at those universities the right to access the Encyclopedia. If 1000 universities each pay $150/year for unrestricted access to the Encyclopedia, the Encyclopedia's projected annual budget would be covered. The $150/year access fee could simply represent an average---the fee could be set so that universities with larger (smaller) budgets or student populations pay a proportionally larger (smaller) access fee. This would keep the Encyclopedia free to the public.

However, in the short run, we do not expect to be able to tap these resources. Our Encyclopedia won't be mature for another 3 - 5 years. Right now, we want University libraries to use their funds to purchase the much anticipated Routledge Encyclopedia. Until our encyclopedia has matured, we will need to look elsewhere for support.

We feel that Philosophy departments and professional organizations are natural sources of funding. Philosophy departments differ enormously in the amount of discretionary funds available to them, with the mean amount extremely low. Some departments do have such funds, however, and a few hundred dollars from a number of such departments could help significantly. However, we prefer not to approach individual departments until there is mature product that will be useful to them. (We might make an exception for a number of the most well-endowed departments, some of which are represented on our Editorial Board.) At the startup phase, it seems more appropriate to approach those institutions part of whose mission, or enlightened self-interest, is to help projects like this get off the ground. Within philosophy, this means professional organizations like the APA. At this point, the Pacific APA and the CPA have made generous contributions, and we have approached the Central and Eastern APA. Of course, a commitment at the national level would be preferable.

Among the funding sources that are not directly connected to Encyclopedia users, we distinguish between government sources, foundations, and businesses. We have received a 2-year grant from the NEH. They will give us $120,000 to develop the Encyclopedia, to be delivered over two years (AY 1998-99 and 1999-2000). We will apply for an NSF grant through the Digital Libraries II initiative. If this proposal proves successful, this would take care of our funding needs until 2003, at which point the Encyclopedia will be close to maturity.

We are just beginning to solicit funds from appropriate foundations. The development and fund-raising staffs at CSLI and Stanford are being most helpful in this respect.

It seems to us that Netscape, Microsoft, Yahoo, and other companies with a stake in the future of the Internet might have multiple reasons for investing in our Encyclopedia. In this regard, it would be very helpful to discover philosophers within such companies who would be willing to help us identify and approach the relevant people with funding authority.

(Some of these companies have been indirectly funding the Encyclopedia for the past two years through CSLI's Industrial Affiliates program. CSLI was founded in 1983 with a grant from the Systems Development Foundation. These funds were exhausted long ago. Since 1993, the Industrial Affiliates program has been the principal source of CSLI's operating budget.)

A final possibility for money from the private sector is advertising. One can imagine tasteful and wholly appropriate links from the Encyclopedia home page to the websites of publishers of philosophy books. Whether these publishers will find this to be a economical use of their advertising budgets remains to be seen.

We would welcome comments from the APA membership on any aspect of fund-raising. Anything from leads concerning fund-raising in industry to comments about the appropriateness of advertising would be welcome.

John Perry and Edward N. Zalta
CSLI/Philosophy Department
Stanford University
November 1997


Footnotes

1. When using such HTML-editors, the author simply selects (highlights) text and then uses ‘menu’ functions to format the text in various ways (such as to italicize, to put the text in a list environment, to create a link and use the text as the label on that link, etc). The HTML-editor then creates the appropriate HTML code in the underlying HTML file. (return to text)

2. The list includes: A Companion to the Philosophy of Language (Blackwell, 1997), Companion Encyclopedia of Asian Philosophy (Routledge, 1997), Routledge History of Philosophy (Routledge, 1997), Oxford Dictionary of Philosophy (Oxford University Press, 1996), Blackwell Companion to Philosophy (Blackwell, 1996), Biographical Dictionary of Twentieth Century Philosophers (Routledge, 1995), Cambridge Dictionary of Philosophy (Cambridge University Press, 1995), Oxford Companion to Philosophy (Oxford University Press, 1995), A Companion to Metaphysics (Blackwell, 1995), A Companion to Epistemology (Blackwell, 1992), A Companion to the Philosophy of Mind (Blackwell, 1994), and Handbook on Metaphysics and Ontology (Philosophia Verlag, 1991). (return to text)