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18th Century German Philosophy Prior to Kant

First published Sun Mar 10, 2002; substantive revision Wed Apr 4, 2007

In Germany, the eighteenth century was the age of enlightenment, the age, that is, that called for the independence of reason. Although the ethos of this age found its clearest (and certainly its most famous) articulation towards the end of the century with Immanuel Kant and his critical philosophy, he was not the first to issue this call. Instead, that task fell to Christian Thomasius (Thomas) at the end of the seventeenth century. It was then taken up and further developed in a theological (pietist) direction by a number of minor figures, the Thomasians, and reissued in a rationalist direction in the early and middle part of the eighteenth century by Christian Wolff and his followers. The development of their position(s) as well as their philosophical (dis)agreements took place by and large at the University of Halle and against the context of pietism.

1. Christian Thomasius (1655–1728)

Although Thomasius is now largely forgotten, he was a pivotal figure in early eighteenth century enlightenment thought. In this context, however, he was also a somewhat ambiguous figure. On the one hand, he was clearly an innovator. Both a lawyer and a philosophy professor, he advocated the independent use of healthy reason, fought against prejudice, against belief in any of the then prevailing superstitions, against any form of (religious) persecution, against the witch-hunt and the use of torture, and in general, against any form of intolerance. He took issue with dependence on authority and the school philosophy's dependence on the syllogism. He lectured in German rather than the traditional Latin or the then fashionable French and was the first person, in Germany, to found a popular monthly journal, written by and large in German, devoted to book reviews, the Monatsgespräche (Monthly Conversations). On the other hand, especially when it came to matters of morality, he was more of a traditionalist. Here he retained distinctly non-Enlightenment ideas, particularly the belief in an evil will and the belief in the necessity of God's salvation.

1.1 Biography/Work

By way of background to both Thomasius's and Wolff's life it is important to note that the Germany of the eighteenth century was a country split into numerous states, each of which had its own government. There was no central government. Reeling from the effects of the Thirty Years War, many of its states did not have freedom of speech, freedom of religion, or, for that matter, a ‘national’ culture, though, given the variety of state governments, some states had relatively more freedom than others. It may seem surprising, therefore, that Christian Thomasius was able to issue the call to the enlightenment at the end of the seventeenth century, though not at all surprising that both Thomasius and Wolff were subject to arbitrary political power.

The son of jurist and philosopher Jakob Thomasius, Christian received his education at the University of Leipzig and his law degree at the University of Frankfurt an der Oder (in Eastern Germany) in 1679. He spent the early part of his career in his hometown Leipzig (in the state of Saxony), as a lawyer and (private) lecturer at the university there, but his controversial views and manner of expressing them, in particular, in the monthly journal Monatsgespräche, led to the prohibition to publish and hold lectures (private and academic) in Leipzig (and Saxony) in 1690. He was, however, welcome in the neighboring and comparatively more open-minded Halle (in the state of Brandenburg/Prussia), and was instrumental in founding the university there in 1694. He remained in Halle for the rest of his life, refusing an invitation to return to Leipzig in 1709.

Thomasius's body of work can be roughly divided into three parts. In his early Leipzig years, he was primarily interested in matters of law, particularly, following his father, in Pufendorf's natural law theory. This period ends around 1688 with the publication of Institutiones jurisprudentiae divinae (Institutions of Divine Jurisprudence) in which he sought to complete Pufendorf's project of divorcing natural law from theology. This year, as well, saw the publication of Introductio ad philosophiam auliam (Introduction to Court Philosophy), a text that is somewhat misnamed since it has less to do with proper conduct or even thought at court than with the proper use of reason, a topic that Thomasius would take up in greater detail in his 1691 Introduction to the Doctrine of Reason.

In general, 1687–8 seems to have marked an endpoint of sorts and the beginning of the second major stage, the more clearly philosophical one, of Thomasius's life. Even though he would remain in Leipzig for another two years, he had clearly broken with tradition by 1687, when he began lecturing and publishing in German. In 1688, he began the publication of the controversial Monatsgespräche (which appeared monthly until April 1690) and turned his attention to matters of theoretical and practical philosophy. Here two sets of books, the Einleitung and Ausübung der Vernunftlehre (Introduction and Application of the Doctrine of Reason), and the Einleitung and Ausübung der Sittenlehre (Introduction and Application of Moral Theory) that appeared in Halle between 1691 and 1696 mark the second part of his career. Written by and large in German with a minimum of technical terminology, these books were intended not for an audience of experts, but instead, as the subtitle to the Introduction to the Doctrine of Reason specifies, for a general audience of “all rational persons of whatever social standing and sex…”

During the late 1690s (and after a religious crisis that led to an at least temporary (re)affirmation of his pietist beliefs), Thomasius produced two works on metaphysics that endorsed a mystical variety of vitalism. In subsequent years, his interests shifted back to matters of law. This was the third part of his life and will not be further considered in this context.

1.2 Philosophy

Thomasius's philosophical stance was an empiricist one, not the rationalism that we find in much of the philosophical tradition and with Wolff. It is true that his belief in natural human reason and its capacity to find truth suggests a mild rationalism, but Thomasius abhorred innate ideas and maintained that all knowledge, all thought, begins with sense perception. This strong sensationism (which has similarities with Locke's position) was coupled, as has already been noted, with an enlightenment stance, in the sense that it was governed by the conviction that knowledge, truth and morality are the purview of everyone, not merely the elect few. The latter is particularly evident in the differentiation between Gelehrtheit and Gelahrtheit that he drew at the outset of the Introduction to the Doctrine of Reason.Gelehrtheit or academic learning is the domain of experts who are familiar with syllogistic logic, metaphysics, epistemology, and theology, but Gelahrtheit or practical learning is available to everyone with a healthy reason who pursues knowledge not for its own sake but for the use-value it has in daily life.

Thomasius's enlightenment convictions are similarly evident in his eclecticism. Though generally deemed a negative stance, this is not the case for Thomasius. He considers it positively as a corrective to any form of sectarian dogmatism. By his own account, he was influenced by several of his predecessors, notably, in Germany, Grotius and Pufendorf and, in England, Hobbes and Locke, and he appropriated those aspects of their theories that he found conducive to his overall aim: the spread of the Enlightenment ethos, understood here as the project of ensuring a healthy reason, one that can discover truth, that can lay open contradictions and fight prejudices.

Given Thomasius's basic presuppositions of where knowledge is likely to be found (in daily life rather than abstract speculation) and who is most likely to attain it (the person who has a healthy reason, not one corrupted by prejudices), it is likely not surprising that his epistemology was not a theoretical one. His two books on theoretical philosophy, the Introduction to the Doctrine of Reason and the Application of the Doctrine of Reason, are books on truth. They are not, however, books on truth in the traditional sense. Thomasius did not develop a philosophical conception of truth or of the condition of its possibility. He seems to have simply adopted a correspondence theory of truth and to have taken the harmony of thought and thing as a given. Certainly, this harmony was not the problem for him that it was for 17th century thought and that it would be again in the later part of the 18th century (with Wolff, Knutsen and Kant). What mattered to Thomasius is the enlightenment optimism that truth is possible and, moreover, accessible to everyone. His Introduction, accordingly, was presented, as specified by the book's subtitle, as providing the means by which "all rational persons, of whatever social standing and sex, are shown in an understandable manner, and without the aid of syllogisms, how to differentiate between the true, the probable and the false, and to find new truths." It is a book of instruction in proper or correct use of healthy reason.

His Application continued this theme, though this time by providing people with the means of avoiding error. Avoiding error involves the eradication of prejudices, which are among the causes of the corruption of reason. That, in turn, is accomplished through what he identifies as dogmatic doubt, not the Cartesian doubt that deems everything false so as to find a first indubitable principle, a useless enterprise, according to Thomasius. Dogmatic doubt is the doubt about particular things, beliefs, and opinions, and this he found healthy and conducive to preventing error.

Thomasius's enlightenment convictions are not, however, as straightforward as might appear. He did believe in natural reason's capacity to overcome corruption, but even as he adhered to this view, he held that an evil will is at the root of this corruption, and that we require God's grace. This conflict is particularly evident in his moral philosophy. While his initial presentation was an optimistic affirmation of the viability of a moral position he identified as one involving "rational love" (vernünftige Liebe) as the only means to a "happy, courteous and cheerful life," as indicated by the subtitle of the Introduction to Moral Theory, by 1696, he had become disenchanted with this view. Human self-interest and an evil will stand in its way.

Thomasius's moral theory is a theory of the will. He held that in moral matters, the will dominates reason. Though human beings have free choice if not externally constrained, the will is not free. Rather, it is dominated by human affects; our passions, impulses, and desires. Like Hobbes, Thomasius believed that even though subject to such inner (psychological) constraints, the will still chooses (with the aid of reason); it consciously wills. And a conscious choice is precisely what is required for a (good) action to be considered moral, a good instinct or good inclinations may make us good, may even be desirable, but by itself this is not enough to make us moral. Morality requires a conscious act of will. The trouble with morality arises because the will is determined by evil desires, in particular, lust, ambition, and avarice. Although there are noble sentiments as well, which similarly influence the will, they are in conflict with the negative dispositions. The conflict can be brought to a positive conclusion only by appeal to divine grace (God's salvation).

This ambivalence and return to theology aside, Thomasius's moral position is an interesting one. The theory of rational love is based on the fundamental equality of human beings as well as on their ability to think and choose independently (of authority). Ultimately, Thomasius's ethics is a social ethics. The theory is other-directed, and given the absence of laws and principles, constitutes a nice contrast to the formalist universalist ethics Kant would develop by the end of the next century. At the same time, the lack of any way of making this theory applicable in a context governed not by similar but instead by conflicting interests, makes something like a fomalist ethics an inevitability. By the end of the Introduction to Moral Theory, even Thomasius recognises that “rational love” will function only in relatively harmonious contexts, in others, particularly those characterised by unequal power positions, justice may well be required.

2. Christian Wolff (1679–1754)

It is without question that Christian Wolff was the most important German philosopher in the early and middle portion of the eighteenth century. Dissatisfied with the, to his mind, arbitrary eclecticism advocated by Thomasius and his ‘school,’ and equally dissatisfied with the scholastic school metaphysics which, he thought, lacked rigour, he produced a systematic philosophical system in reply. Indeed, his philosophy is reputed to constitute the most coherent systematic whole produced in the 18th century prior to Kant. As an enlightenment thinker, albeit a rationalist one, he was, like Thomasius, committed to public education. He saw philosophy, which he conceived as world-wisdom (Welt-Weisheit), as the means to public enlightenment and, in line with the mood of the time, the purview of everyone, not just of philosophers or experts. To make it accessible, he wrote in German, at least during his Halle years, and introduced much of the German philosophical terminology that is still used (the concepts of Bewußtsein, Vorstellung, and Begriff have their origin here).

2.1 Biography/Work

Wolff's birthplace was Breslau (then in Eastern Germany, now in Poland). At an early age, dissatisfied with orthodox theology, he turned to the study of mathematics as offering the best means to certainty. He studied theology and mathematics at the University of Jena and gained his Master's degree in Leizpig in 1702. Influenced by von Tschirnhaus and while working in Leipzig as a private lecturer, he wrote a dissertation seeking to apply the mathematical method to problems in practical philosophy. This drew Leibniz's attention to him. They began a correspondence that continued until Leibniz's death in 1716. Sponsored by Leibniz and von Tschirnhaus, he was appointed Professor of Mathematics and Natural Science at the University of Halle in 1707.

Since his position in Halle was predominantly as a teacher of mathematics — a task at which he excelled — Wolff did not begin lecturing and writing on philosophical matters until 1710. In mathematics, he produced textbooks, a four volume history of mathematics in 1710 and a mathematical dictionary in 1711. His philosophical lectures were in the first instance expositions of Leibniz's philosophy, which led his opponents (the representatives of the Thomasius ‘school’) to identify his philosophy as the Leibniz-Wolffian philosophy, a designation that remained despite his objection. He began an extensive series of publications, in German and often identified as his German works, on philosophical topics — the “German Logic” in 1713, the “German Metaphysics” in 1719, the “German Ethics” in 1720, the “German Politics” in 1721, the “German Cosmology” in 1723, and the “German Theology” in 1724, along with numerous short essays. Given his success as a teacher and fame as an author, he gained increasing prominence in Halle, much to the dismay of the “Thomasians” who had dominated philosophical instruction there. It did not contribute to a smooth collegial relationship that Wolff did not like Thomasius's eclectic philosophy and did not hide his dislike. Matters came to a head in 1721 when some political maneuvering on the part of his opponents (the “Thomasians” and the pietists) likely prompted by his own increasing fame and popularity with the students combined with his apparently difficult personality, brought him to the attention of the emperor in Berlin, Friedrich Wilhelm I, who expelled him from Prussia in 1723 on threat of hanging.

Having earlier been invited to the University of Marburg, he took up the position there. At the time Marburg was a more cosmopolitan place than Halle, and Wolff now had students from other countries. He saw himself as speaking to Europeans, not merely Germans, and began writing in Latin. In fact, he produced a second series of books, in Latin and identified as his Latin works, going over the same subject matter that he had treated in his German texts, albeit in more detail. Though even more scholastic than the earlier German texts, these books contributed to his fame in a much broader context (Europe rather than Germany). In 1733, Friedrich Wilhelm I invited him to return to Prussia, but Wolff declined this invitation. He became increasingly well established, so much so that a cabinet order of 1739 required candidates for the ministry to study Wolff's books, particularly his logic. In short order, Wolffians and Wolff societies could be found everywhere, even in Prussia. In 1740, Frederick the Great recalled him to Prussia, offering a permanent fellowship in the Berlin Academy. Rather than accept the invitation to Berlin, he returned to Halle to great acclaim and public approbation. To his disappointment, however, the mood in Halle had changed, the residing Wolffians, in particular Baumgarten, had begun to develop his thought, and his lectures were not successful. Complaining about the poor quality of the students, he gave up lecturing but continued writing.

2.2 Philosophy

Wolff was not an original philosopher, but a modernizer and systematiser. Rather than reject scholastic school philosophy outright, as Thomasius had done, he modernized and systematised it (and philosophy as a whole). Systematizing philosophy meant integrating different ideas from the philosophical tradition — Descartes's concept of substance, for instance, and Leibniz's theory of pre-established harmony. But while eclectic in this sense, unlike Thomasius's thought, Wolff's was anything but arbitrary. Rather, he combined those ingredients into a comprehensive system on the model of mathematics. Mathematics was, for Wolff, a systematic science operating by definition and syllogistic proof, and this was the method he strove to make applicable to philosophy. In philosophy, the method was cashed out in a combined analytic/synthetic manner. Definitions were arrived at analytically — the analysis was to be of empirical matters and was to convey simple ideas through a process of clarification, abstraction, and analysis. These were then combined into definitions. The definitions were to function as ingredients in the syllogisms that returned, synthetically, to the empirical starting point, though it is presumably now understood why things are as they are, an understanding that was, for Wolff, the goal of philosophy.

The first philosophy text Wolff produced was his “German Logic” (Vernünfftige Gedancken von den Kräften des menschlichen Verstandes und ihrem richtigen Gebrauche in Erkenntnis der Wahrheit). Logic is of central importance to Wolff because it sets out the rules for thought, which is understanding's ability to forge connections, according to Wolff a uniquely human ability. All human beings have natural understanding, but by itself this is not sufficient. Logic or the “art of demonstration” serves to refine this natural capacity and functions, as well, as the condition of science. From the point of view of the enlightenment, it is instructive here that Wolff insisted, as Thomasius had before him, that book and memory learning is not the same as knowledge. That requires the use of the powers of the understanding, and above all, much practice in the art of thought. While innate, the powers of understanding have to be honed through practice/experience.

Wolff's second philosophical treatise, the “German Metaphysics” (Vernünfftige Gedancken von Gott, der Welt und der Seele des Menschen, auch allen Dingen überhaupt) appeared some seven years after the “German Logic”. Just as that had vindicated the discipline of logic against the early enlightenment attacks, so this vindicated the discipline of metaphysics, understood as the “science of the possible as possible.” After a brief introductory chapter identifying his Cartesian stance by linking existence to consciousness (we must exist because we are conscious of ourselves), the “German Metaphysics” treats ontology, empirical psychology, cosmology, rational psychology and natural theology. In the second chapter Wolff sets out the two (Leibnizian) principles governing his philosophical thought: the principle of contradiction (“something cannot both be and not be at the same time” §10, 6) and the principle of sufficient reason (“everything that is must have a sufficient reason why it is” §30, 17). These are significant not only from the point of view of Wolff's thought but also in light of the role they would play in early Kant-criticism. In the chapter on rational psychology (chapter 5), he defends the Leibnizian conception of pre-established harmony (§765, 478-9) and, in the final chapter on natural theology, he tells his readers that the world mirrors God's perfection (§1045, 648). These are aspects of Wolff's position with which the (pietist) Thomasians would take issue.

After the “German Metaphysics” appeared, Wolff published about a book a year dealing with and integrating into his system other central philosophical matters: ethics in 1720, politics in 1721, physics in 1723, teleology in 1724 and biology in 1724.

The ethics (Vernünfftige Gedancken von der Menschen Thun und Lassen, zu Berförderung ihrer Glückseligkeit) is composed of four parts, a theoretical part that treats the foundation of practical philosophy and three practical parts that present a doctrine of duties that human beings have to themselves, to God, and to others. Not surprisingly, given that Wolff believes the world to mirror God's perfection, the issue in the ethics is perfection as well and not, as with Thomasius, happiness (that is left for his politics). Moral perfection is the guideline by which we ought to choose between two (or more) equally possible actions. That is to say, when making a free choice we ought to consider whether the action “promotes the perfection of our inner and outer state” (§2, 5) and that means considering whether the state of the soul and the body accords with the prior state or contradicts it. The outcome has greater perfection to the extent that it contributes to the continued “natural human state and its harmonious preservation over time”(§2, 5). The natural human state Wolff envisions is the state of the soul in its manifold efforts to find truth, and everything has to be done to maximize that state (see “German Metaphysics” §152, 79). It so happens, that this is where happiness lies as well, and as Wolff indicates at the end of the ethics, it is incumbent upon human beings to ensure not only their own perfection/happiness, but to “contribute as much as possible to the happiness of others” (§767, 539).

In the “German Politics” (Vernünfftige Gedancken von dem gesellschaftlichen Leben der Menschen und insonderheit dem gemeinen Wesen), he proceeds to investigate the varieties of human societies and to specify how they ought to be set up so as to “promote the uninhibited progression to the common best” (§3, 3). A society must accord with the laws of nature, otherwise it cannot be considered a society, and accord with the laws of nature surely means perfection/happiness.

Wolff's Latin works appeared with equal regularity in the 1730, with the “Latin Logic” (Philosophia rationalis sive logica) beginning the series in 1728. In spite of their greater thoroughness, or perhaps because of it, they were not as widely read either in Germany or Europe as a whole. Whereas the German texts went through several reprints (14 for the Logic, 10 for the Metaphysics), the “Latin Logic” was only reprinted three times, and some of the other Latin texts perhaps twice. By the 1730s the German texts had established Wolff's influence and the Latin texts did little to change that. They will, accordingly, not be further considered in this context.

3. Context, Influences and Disciples

Both Thomasius and Wolff had followers. In Thomasius's case this was in spite of the fact that he claimed to have no desire to have disciples or found a school. But given the influence he had on his contemporaries, it would have been surprising if there had not been anyone who saw himself as following in his footsteps and, more importantly, taking up his cause (against Wolff). Among Thomasius's contemporaries to do so were Franz Budde (1667–1729), Joachim Lange (1670–1744), Andreas Rüdiger (1673–1731), and Adolf Friedrich Hoffmann (1707–1741). Christian August Crusius (?1715–1775) was a later follower (Hoffmann's student) who came on the philosophical scene when Wolffianism was already starting to decline.

Wolff's followers were perhaps more varied than those following and rejecting Thomasius. Indeed, by the 1740s, Wolffianism had become the leading German philosophy and had spread to the major German universities: to Halle (with Wolff, A. G. Baumgarten, though he moved on to Frankfurt an der Oder), G. F. Meier, and J. A. Eberhard, who is known particularly for the role he played in early Kant-criticism), to Marburg where virtually every academic was a Wolffian, to Giessen (with J. F. Müller, and Böhm), to Tübingen (with Georg Bernhard Bilfinger, Israel Gottlob Ganz and Gottfried Plouquet), to Leipzig (with Gottsched and Ludovici), to Jena (with Johann Peter Reusch and Joachim George Darjes), and to Königsberg (with Knutsen, Kant's teacher).

The reception of Wolff's philosophy is interesting not only in view of its widespread acceptance, but also in light of the disputes it generated and the further developments it gave rise to. Chief among these disputes were (1) the attack by the pietists (Budde and Lange) that led to Wolff's dismissal from Halle and (2) the attack by the Thomasians (Hoffmann and Crusius). Further developments of the Wolffian philosophy can be found particularly in the domain of aesthetics with Gottsched and Baumgarten.

3.1 Pietism

The development of early and even mid-enlightenment thought in 18th century Germany proceeded hand in hand with the then relatively new (protestant) religious trend: pietism. Like the discontent that the representatives of the early enlightenment had with authority and, at least in the early years, intellectual life, those of pietism took issue with the (religious) orthodoxy and its intellectualism. Furthermore, rather than endorse obedience and conformity to the establishment, the pietist movement emphasized the subjective aspect of faith: a person's experience, feeling, and, above all, personal participation in religious matters and performances. The emphasis on the subjective and personal, and on people's actual participation in religion made pietism an ideal companion for early enlightenment thought. At issue here was not academic competence, not the cognitive aspect of religion, but its affective aspect with emphasis on devotion and practical service, just as what was at issue in the early enlightenment was not the intellectual aspect of reason, but its practical performance and service. And both movements were characterized by a commitment to egalitarianism.

This is not to say that the parallel development was always or even necessarily harmonious. In Halle, the chief representative of pietism was August Hermann Francke (1663–1722), who had been brought there by Thomasius. But Thomasius and Francke did not see eye to eye on all matters. While Thomasius had endorsed Francke's practical activism (he was the founder of the Halle orphanage), he broke with Francke by 1699, criticising his educational policies for producing “uneducated, melancholy, fantastic, obstinate, recalcitrant, and spiteful men” (cited in Beck, 253). It is not clear what, if any, philosophical reasons Thomasius had for turning against Francke. However, the details of their disagreement are not important for the development of 18th century philosophy.

3.2 The Thomasians

Budde and Lange, both ultimately Professors of Theology at Jena and Halle respectively, developed Thomasius's thought in a theological (pietist) direction. That is to say, both, and Lange more so than Budde, emphasized the need for revelation to a greater extent that Thomasius had done, as they also claimed that the source of evil was the will and that the root cause of evil was original sin. Though Thomasius could be found to hold these views as well, particularly during the completion of his Application of Moral Theory, their difference from Thomasius lies in the emphasis they placed on these views. Moreover, in his major work, Medicina Mentis, Lange devoted a great deal of attention to demonstrating how the ill or corrupt will and mind might be healed.

It is interesting that there were differences not just from the theological dimension of Thomasius's thought, but also in the philosophical respect. Here it is particularly noteworthy that in his philosophical texts Budde sought a systematic whole and was not content to adopt Thomasius's more eclectic style. Though he claimed to be an eclectic, he thought this did not entail that he could not provide a unified whole. That whole is provided by his three books in philosophy. The theoretical philosophy can be found in the Institutiones Philosophiae Eclecticae that appeared in two parts in Halle in 1703. The two parts are the “Elementa philosophiae theoreticae,” roughly a metaphysics, and the “Elementa philosophiae instrumentalis,” Budde's logic. Along with the earlier work in practical philosophy, theElementae Philosophiae Practicae, originally published in 1697 but significantly revised for the 1703 edition, these texts constitute Budde's philosophical system.

Rüdiger, Hoffmann, and Crusius were related through teacher-student relationships with Rüdiger teaching Hoffmann who then taught Crusius. See below (Disputes) for an account of the role they, and Crusius in particular, played in the disagreement of the Thomasians with Wolff.

3.3 The Wolffians

Wolff's enlightenment rationalism had made a decisive impact on the philosophical scene in Germany in the 1720s. Over the middle years of the 18thcentury, and against objections from both Thomasians and pietism, Wolffianism took hold, at least for a time. Certainly, the events that led to his expulsion from Halle contributed to his notoriety and fame. Philosophers took up his cause in virtually all the universities in Eastern and Northern Germany, occasionally developing his philosophical system in different directions. Among the chief representatives of Wolffianism were, in Leipzig, J. C. Gottsched (1700–1766), in Frankfurt am Main, Alexander Gottlieb Baumgarten (1714–62) and H. F. Meier, who were instrumental in founding Aesthetics, in Königsberg, Kant's teacher Martin Knutsen (1713–51). Wolffianism also played a central role in the early criticisms of Kant's critical philosophy. There it was represented primarily by Eberhard, Maaß, and Schwab and in the major review journal at the time, Nicolai's Allgemeine deutsche Bibliothek. (See Allison, The Kant-Eberhard Controversy). There can be no question that Wolffianism dominated German universities during the 1720s to the 1740s, though it disintegrated to some extent soon after his death in 1754 with, among other things, the development of aesthetics.

3.4 Disputes

Given the two radically different approaches to issuing the enlightenment call to the independent use of reason that we find in the 18th century, it is not surprising that the age should have its share of disputes. This was particularly evident in the disagreements surrounding Wolff and Wolffianism. It has already been indicated above that two attacks in particular stand out (1) the attack that led to his expulsion from Halle and (2) the attack that was mounted by Hoffmann and Crusius.

The first attack was mounted by Thomasius's pietist followers. They, in particular Budde and Lange, centered their opposition to Wolffianism around the fatalism and Spinozism they thought implied by his system. Also, Wolff's dependence on the mathematical method and the subordination of the divine will to necessity were questioned. Similarly, the Leibnizian doctrine of pre-established harmony of soul and body that the critics attributed to Wolff was thought to be at odds with the possibility of free will, and with that, responsibility for our actions. If the interaction of soul and body has to be pre-ordained or pre-established, then it is not possible that we could act otherwise than we have been determined to act, and the notions of responsibility and sin are only a chimera. It must be added here that the critique of the belief in a free will is justified. Wolff struggled with this possibility as much as Leibniz had done, and it is simply not clear that given their adherence to pre-established harmony, either one managed to resolve the conundrum on the ontological level.

It is an interesting footnote to these disputes that while Thomasius himself did not participate in these disputes, Wolff did. In 1724 he published a detailed reply to Budde and Lange's critique of the German Metaphysics (Kleine Kontroversschriften mit Joachim Lange und Johann Franz Budde) and he also took their concerns up in the Anmerkungen to the German Metaphysics.

The second attack was mounted by those Thomasians who did not foreground their pietism, Andreas Rüdiger (1673–1731), Adolf Friedrich Hoffmann (1707–1741), and Christian August Crusius (?1715–1775). Rüdiger and Hoffmann attacked Wolff on a number of issues (the relation of mind and body, for instance, which they took to constitute a unity, not two distinct substances, the difference between the mathematical and the philosophical methods, and the question of the will's role in ethics). At least some of these issues were taken up by Crusius, who was the last Thomasian to take issue with Wolff.

Crusius did his philosophical work in Leipzig in the 1740s before taking on the professorship of Theology in 1751. Like earlier Thomasians, he questioned Wolff's subordination of the will to reason, arguing for the freedom of the former against what he takes to be Wolff's fatalism, though he was willing to concede that the will requires understanding. Perhaps the most significant aspect of Crusius' thought was his differentiation between the philosophical and mathematical methods. Whereas mathematics is said to be grounded on the principle of contradiction, this is not the case for philosophy. That has to do with real objects, with nature, its structures and forces, not with the abstract and artificial concepts of mathematics. At the same time, he also thought there was a role for mathematics in the analysis of nature — it could provide concepts of bodies and their relations. Of course, as his contemporaries pointed out, one wonders why mathematics should have a role in the investigation of the “real” world if the nature of its abstraction made it distinct from the (concrete) real world. Crusius did not have an answer to these questions, but it was a topic that Kant would take on in his pre-critical project.

4. Beyond Wolff

With the decline of Wolffianism after 1754, German philosophy was for a time at loose ends. The decline was prompted not only by the criticisms offered by the Thomasians, but also by the internal developments of Wolffianism proposed by various of Wolff's disciples. Hermann Samuel Reimarus (1694–1768), for instance, developed a rationalist critique of revelation, arguing that for the rational person religion had to be based on reason (Apologie oder Schützschrift für die vernünftigen Verehrer Gottes, published posthumously). Others began to extend Wolffianism into areas Wolff himself had not considered, thereby contributing to significant development. Here the area of aesthetics is paramount. Moreover, by the middle of the 18th century, French and English (particularly) Scottish philosophy (Hume's Inquiry, Locke's Essay along with other texts by Hume, Reid, Hutcheson, Beattie, Condillac) began to be available in translation, thus offering a clear (empiricist) alternative to Wolffian rationalism. These texts were immensely influential. Recall Kant's claim that his recollection of David Hume had awoken him from his dogmatic slumber (Prolegomena, Ak. IV, 260). The empiricists, for instance Feder and Garve also played a significant role in early Kant-criticism (see Sassen, Kant's Early Critics). By and large, the period of 18th century German philosophy after 1750 and before 1781 was a period not of any one dominant school, but of individuals loosely associated with a number of different trends. Among individuals who cannot be clearly assigned anywhere were Johann Heinrich Lambert, Moses Mendelssohn and Johann Nikolaus Tetens. Not either Thomasians or Wolffians, they must be considered in relation to Kant's pre-critical and critical philosophy, not from the point of view of German philosophy prior to Kant.

4.1 Aesthetics

Even though Wolff sought to integrate virtually all aspects of philosophy into his system, he had nothing to say about the philosophy of art. In some way this is not surprising if we consider that in the Germany of the early Enlightenment, the arts, particularly poetry and literature, were as good as nonexistent. The German literary greats had not even been born when Wolff wrote his German texts (Lessing was born in 1729, Herder in 1744, Goethe in 1749). First to develop a theory of the arts, particularly poetry, was Johann Christoph Gottsched (1700–1766), who published his ‘Critical Poetry’ (Versuch einer critischen Dichtkunst vor die Deutschen) in 1730. Treating poetry scientifically, he set out a set of rules that were to guide the composition. Given his conception of what a poem was (a moral fable) and given as well his idea of what was involved in its composition (a set of rules), there was little room here for beauty and even less for sentiment and inspiration. But sentiment and inspiration was precisely the direction in which poetry was going by the middle of the century. Gottsched's Wolffian philosophy of poetry, accordingly, was quickly supplanted by Johann Jakob Breitinger's Critische Abhandlung (1740), a book that emphasized the a posteriori experience of poetry, not its rule-bound composition.

A quasi-Wolffian synthesis of these two approaches was brought about by Alexander Gottlieb Baumgarten (1714–1762), probably Wolff's most famous disciple. Baumgarten produced two major texts, his metaphysics in 1739 (Metaphysica), which Kant would use as a textbook, and, in 1750 and 1758, his aesthetics (Aesthetica). That he designated the term ‘aesthetics’ to identify the philosophy of art, particularly poetry, would hardly be thought important had he done nothing else. However, in developing the ‘field’ of aesthetics, he also contributed significantly to the study of the senses. Whereas Wolff had conceived of the senses merely as providing the raw material for processing, a task performed by understanding and governed by the rules of logic, Baumgarten thought that the senses had their own rules and their own perfection, rules and perfection that differ from logical rules and the knowledge generated by logical processing. The rules of sensation are studied by the science of perception, which Baumgarten called aesthetics. But aesthetics is also the study of poetry. In Reflections on Poetry he set out the notion of aesthetic clarity. Although poetic representations are confused representations (§14, 42), they have sensuous clarity. Baumgarten identified this clarity as extensive clarity to differentiate it from the intensive clarity of logic (§17, 43). Appealing to the senses, poetic representation can be more illuminating than representations produced by logical processing and reasoning. Moreover, appealing to the affects, such representations are connected to pleasure. One cannot but see the influence that Baumgarten likely had on Kant's critical philosophy — his vindication of the senses reappears in an inherently Kantian way both in the Transcendental Aesthetic of the Critique of Pure Reason and in the Critique of Judgment.


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Hobbes, Thomas | Kant, Immanuel | legal philosophy | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm | Locke, John