Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Peter Abelard

First published Tue Aug 3, 2004

Peter Abelard (1079 – 21 April 1142) [‘Abailard’ or ‘Abaelard’ or ‘Habalaarz’ and so on] was the pre-eminent philosopher and theologian of the twelfth century. The teacher of his generation, he was also famous as a poet and a musician. Prior to the recovery of Aristotle, he brought the native Latin tradition in philosophy to its highest pitch. His genius was evident in all he did. He is, arguably, the greatest logician of the Middle Ages and is equally famous as the first great nominalist philosopher. He championed the use of reason in matters of faith (he was the first to use ‘theology’ in its modern sense), and his systematic treatment of religious doctrines are as remarkable for their philosophical penetration and subtlety as they are for their audacity. Abelard seemed larger than life to his contemporaries: his quick wit, sharp tongue, perfect memory, and boundless arrogance made him unbeatable in debate — he was said by supporter and detractor alike never to have lost an argument — and the force of his personality impressed itself vividly on all with whom he came into contact. His luckless affair with Héloïse made him a tragic figure of romance, and his conflict with Bernard of Clairvaux over reason and religion made him the hero of the Enlightenment. For all his colourful life, though, his philosophical achievements are the cornerstone of his fame.

1. Life and Works

1.1 Life

Abelard's life is relatively well-known: in addition to events chronicled in the public record, his inner life is revealed in his autobiographical letter Historia calamitatum [“The Story of My Troubles”] and in his famous correspondence with Héloïse.

Abelard was born into the lesser nobility around 1079 in Le Pallet, a small town in Brittany near Nantes. He received early training in letters, and took to his studies with enthusiasm; his later writings show familiarity with Cicero, Horace, Juvenal, Ovid, Lucan, Seneca, and Vergil. Abelard eventually renounced his inheritance, including its attendant knighthood, to pursue philosophy. He did so by travelling to study with well-known philosophers, most notably Roscelin and William of Champeaux.

During the first years of the twelfth century, Abelard felt confident enough to set himself up as a lecturer, first at Melun and then at Corbeil, competing mainly with William of Champeaux (Paris) for students and reputation. The strain proved too much — Abelard's health failed, and he returned to Brittany for several years.

Abelard returned to Paris sometime between 1108 and 1113 with his health restored and his ambition intact. He attended William of Champeaux's lectures, and entered into debate with William over the problem of universals. According to Abelard's report, he bested his teacher in debate, and gained his reputation as a dialectician of note, teaching at several schools. Around 1113 Abelard decided to study theology; he sought out the most eminent teacher of theology of his day, Anselm of Laon (not to be confused with Anselm of Canterbury), and became his student. It was not a good choice: Anselm's traditional methods did not appeal to Abelard, and, after some back-and-forth, Abelard returned to Paris to continue on his own. It would be the last time he studied with anyone.

Upon returning to Paris, Abelard became scholar-in-residence at Notre Dame, a position he held until his romantic entanglement with Héloïse led to his castration, at which point he entered the Benedictine monastery of Saint Denis and Héloïse entered the convent of Argenteuil. After his recovery, Abelard resumed teaching at a nearby priory, primarily on theology and in particular on the Trinity. His method of philosophical analysis was seen as a direct challenge to more traditional approaches, and a synod, convened in Soissons to examine Abelard's writings, condemned them and required Abelard to make a public avowal of faith, an experience he found humiliating; shortly afterwards he was allowed to settle in a wild and uninhabited section of land, to devote himself to contemplation.

It was not to be. Abelard says that poverty forced him to resume teaching. He and the students who flocked to him in droves constructed an oratory named the Paraclete, where he continued to write, teach, and research. This idyll came to an end around 1126, when Abelard accepted an invitation to become abbot of the monastery of Saint Gildas de Rhuys in Brittany; shortly afterwards he handed over the Paraclete to Héloïse and the other nuns, whose convent had been expropriated. Abelard found the monks of Saint Gildas difficult and obstructive — even dangerous — and he claims that there were several attempts on his life while in residence. During this period he wrote the Historia calamitatum and corresponded with Héloïse.

By the mid-1130s Abelard was given permission to return to Paris (retaining his rank as abbot) and to teach in the schools on the Mont Ste.-Genevieve. It was during this time that his theological treatises were brought to the attention of Bernard of Clairvaux, who objected to some of Abelard's conclusions as well as to his approach to matters of faith. After some inconclusive attempts to resolve their differences, Abelard asked the archbishop of Sens to arrange a public dispute between himself and Bernard on 3 June 1140, to settle their disagreements. Bernard initially refused the invitation on the grounds that one should not debate matters of faith, but then accepted it and, unknown to Abelard, arranged to convene another commission of enquiry to review Abelard's works on suspicion of heresy. When Abelard discovered that there was no debate but instead a kangaroo court, he refused to take part, announcing his intention to appeal to the Pope directly. He walked out of the proceedings and began travelling to Rome. The Council condemned nineteen propositions it claimed to find in his works and adjourned. Bernard launched a successful campaign petitioning the Papal Court before Abelard was out of France; a letter from the Pope upholding the decision of the Council of Soissons reached Abelard while he was at Cluny; Abelard was ordered to silence. By all accounts Abelard complied immediately, even meeting peacefully with Bernard in reconciliation. Peter the Venerable, the abbot of Cluny, wrote to the Pope about these matters, and the Pope lifted Abelard's sentence. Abelard remained under the protection of Peter the Venerable first at Cluny, then at St. Marcel, as his health gradually deteriorated. Abelard died on 21 April 1142. His body was interred at the Paraclete, and today is (with Héloïse) in Père Lachaise cemetery in Paris.

Abelard's students were active as kings, philosophers, poets, politicians, theologians, and monks; they include three popes and several heads of state. Explicit references to Abelard's thinking in the later Middle Ages are few, likely because of the cloud cast by the verdict of the Council of Soissons, but it is clear that he had a seminal influence on twelfth-century philosophy and perhaps on later fourteenth-century speculation as well.

1.2 Works

The dates of composition and even the number of Abelard's writings remain largely obscure and a matter of controversy among scholars. One reason for this is that Abelard constantly revised and rewrote, so that several distinct versions of a given work might be in circulation; another reason is that several of his writings might represent “teaching notes” constantly evolving in courses and seminars. Hence it is not clear that “date of composition” is a well-defined notion. Apart from Abelard's correspondence, which can be dated with relative precision, Abelard's extant work falls into three categories.

The first category consists of Abelard's works on dialectic — works concerned with logic, philosophy of language, metaphysics, and philosophy of mind. His two masterworks are:

Both of these works follow the pattern of the logica vetus, the “old logic” inherited from antiquity: Porphyry's introduction to Aristotle, the Isagoge; Aristotle's Categories and On Interpretation; Boethius's Introduction to the Categorical Syllogism, Categorical Syllogisms, Hypothetical Syllogisms, On Topical Difference, and On Division. Abelard's works cover the material presented in the old logic, though they do so in different ways. His Logica ‘ingredientibus’ is a close textual commentary on the old logic, though only some of it survives, namely the commentaries on the Isagoge, the Categories, On Interpretation, and On Topical Differences; his Dialectica is an independent treatise on dialectic that treats the same material thematically, though neither the beginning (covering the Isagoge and the start of the Categories) nor the ending (on division and definition) have been preserved. In addition, there are four lesser works on dialectic:

The first of these is a series of elementary commentaries on the old logic (though again not completely preserved); their simple level has led some scholars to think they must come from early in Abelard's career, others to deny that they are Abelard's work at all. Second, the Logica ‘nostrorum petitioni sociorum’ is a commentary on Porphyry's Isagoge; it has textual parallels with some of Abelard's other works and shows some knowledge of theology. The third work deals with concepts, or ‘understandings’, from both the point of view of logic (roughly as providing the meanings of terms) and from the point of view of the philosophy of mind (as vehicles for mental content). The last work may be no more than a report of some of Abelard's lectures, and is concerned with logical and metaphysical puzzles about wholes and parts.

The second category consists of Abelard's works on ethics:

The Ethics offers an analysis of moral worth and the degree of praise or blame that should attach to agents and their actions; it breaks off at the beginning of the second book. The Conversations is a pair of debates (among characters who appear to Abelard in a dream) over the nature of happiness and the supreme good: the Philosopher, who claims to follow only natural reason, first debates with the Jew, who follows the Old Law; the Philosopher then debates the Christian, who defends Christian ethics from a philosophical point of view. Abelard also wrote a slight work of practical advice for his son:

Moral advice and edifying sentiments are found in this series of distichs.

The third category consists of Abelard's works of philosophical theology. His three main works are devoted to a philosophical analysis of the Trinity, the several versions representing successive stages of his thought and his attempts at orthodoxy (each rewritten several times):

The first version of the Theology seems to have been the work condemned at the Council of Sens, the last the work condemned at the Council of Soissons. In addition to these three works, in which problems in philosophical theology are treated thematically, Abelard also wrote several commentaries:

The first three commentaries are brief, but Abelard's discussions of the first verses of Genesis and of Paul's letter are extensive and detailed (the latter also relevant to Abelard's ethical theory). Abelard also took up questions about faith and reason in a short work:

This brief inner dialogue, modelled on Augustine's Soliloquies, has “Peter” talking things over with “Abelard.” Theological questions of a more practical nature were raised by Héloïse in a series of questions she asked on her behalf and on behalf of the nuns of the Paraclete:

Practical issues are also addressed in Abelard's sermons, hymns, and lamentations (planctus). Finally, Abelard composed an extremely influential theological work that contains no theoretical speculation at all:

Abelard assembles a series of 158 questions, each of which is furnished with patristic citations that imply a positive answer (sic) to the question and other patristic citations implying a negative answer (non). Abelard does not attempt to harmonize these apparently inconsistent remarks, but in his preface he lays down rules for proper hermeneutic investigation: look for ambiguity, check the surrounding context, draw relevant distinctions, and the like.

Abelard's students and disciplines also record many of his views, though this material has yet to be explored carefully. There are references in Abelard's extant works to other works we do not have: Grammatica, “Grammar”; Rhetorica, “Rhetoric”; a commentary on Ezekiel written at the beginning of his studies in theology; and others. It is possible some of these works may yet be found.

2. Metaphysics

Abelard's metaphysics is the first great example of nominalism in the Western tradition. While his view that universals are mere words (nomina) justifies the label, nominalism — or, better, irrealism — is the hallmark of Abelard's entire metaphysics. He is an irrealist not only about universals, but also about propositions, events, times other than the present, natural kinds, relations, wholes, absolute space, hylomorphic composites, and the like. Instead, Abelard holds that the concrete individual, in all its richness and variety, is more than enough to populate the world. Abelard preferred reductive, atomist, and material explanations whenever possible; he devoted a great deal of effort to pouring cold water on the metaphysical excesses of his predecessors and contemporaries.

Abelard defends his thesis that universals are nothing but words by arguing that ontological realism about universals is incoherent. More exactly, he holds that there cannot be any real object in the world satisfying Boethius's criteria for the universal, namely something present as a whole in many at once so as to constitute their substance (i.e. to make the individual in which it is present what it is). Hence, Abelard concludes, universality is not an ontological feature of the world but a semantic feature of language.

Suppose universals were things in the world, so that one and the same item is completely present in both Socrates and an ass at the same time, making each to be wholly an animal. Abelard points out that then the same thing, animal, will be simultaneously rational (due to its role in constituting the species human being) and irrational (due to its role in constituting the species ass). But then contraries are simultaneously present in the same thing as a whole, which is impossible.

To the rejoinder that rationality and irrationality are not actually present in the same thing, Abelard offers a twofold reply. First, he rejects the claim that they are present only potentially. Each species is actually informed by a contrary, and the genus is actually present in each as a whole; hence it is actually informed by one contrary in one species and by the other in the other; since it is wholly one and the same in each, it is therefore actually informed by contraries, and the contradiction results. Second, Abelard undertakes to establish that contraries will be present not merely in the genus but even in the selfsame individual. For Socrates is (an) animal, and so is Brunellus the Ass; but by transitivity — since each is wholly and completely animal — Socrates is Brunellus, and hence both rational and irrational. Put a different way, each is essentially an animal, and furthermore essentially rational and essentially irrational.

If we object to this last piece of reasoning, on the grounds that individuals are unique in virtue of their non-essential features, Abelard replies that this view “makes accidents prior to substance.” That is, the objection claims that individual things are individual in virtue of features that contingently characterize them, which confuses things with their features.

Prospects are no better for realism if the universal is identified not with a single thing but with a collection of things. Abelard points out that collections are posterior to their parts, and, furthermore, the collection is not shared among its parts in the way a universal is said to be common to many. Nor does it help to try to identify the universal with the individual in some fashion, for example in claiming that Socrates qua human is taken as the universal human being; Abelard argues that if the universal really is the individual, then we are stuck with the consequence that either individuals such as Socrates are common to many, or there are as many universals as there are individuals, each of which is absurd.

Abelard concludes that universality is merely linguistic, not a feature of the world. More precisely, Abelard holds that common nouns (such as ‘animal’), verbs, and negative names (such as ‘not-Socrates’) are correctly predicable of many, and so count as universals. These terms are semantically general, in that their sense applies to more than one thing, but they do not thereby name some general thing; instead, they distributively refer to each of the individuals to which the term applies. For example, the term ‘animal’ has the sense “living substance”, which is inherently general, and it refers to each individual animal since each is a living substance — as Abelard puts it, since each has the status of being a living substance. But this is to leave the domain of metaphysics for semantics; see the discussion of Abelard‘s philosophy of language in Section 4.

Abelard maintains that everything in the world apart from God and angels is either form, matter, or a composite of form and matter. The matter of something is that out of which it is made, whether it persists in the finished product (as bricks in a house) or is absorbed into it (as flour in bread). Ultimately, all material objects are composed of the four elements earth, air, fire, and water, but they do not retain their elemental forms in most combinations. In general, the form of a material object just is the configuration of its material parts: “We call the form strictly what comes from the composition of the parts.” The form of a statue, for example, is its shape, which is no more than the arrangement of its matter — the curve of the nose, the size of the eyes, and so on. Forms are therefore supervenient on matter, and have no ontological standing independent of it. This is not to deny that forms exist, but to provide a particular explanation of what it is for a form to inhere in a given subject, namely for that subject to have its matter configured in a certain way. For example, the inherence of shape in the statue just is the way in which its bronze is arranged. Hence material things are identical with what they are made of — with one exception: human beings, whose forms are their immaterial (and immortal) souls. Strictly speaking, since human souls are capable of existence in separation form the body, they are not forms after all, though they act as substantial forms as long as they are joined to the body.

Material composites of form and matter, humans excepted, are integral wholes made up of their discrete material parts as configured in a given way. Abelard countenances many types of integral wholes: collections, no matter how their members are selected; structured composites, whether naturally unified (such as Socrates and his limbs) or artificially unified (such as the walls, floor, and roof of a house); continuous quantities that are homogeneous material ‘substances,’ namely stuffs, such as water or gold; geometrical objects, such as lines, defined by the relative position of their parts; temporal wholes, such as a day and the hours that make it up. Most of these wholes are ontologically nothing beyond their material parts. Whether structured composites have any independent ontological standing depends on the status of their organizing forms.

Abelard's theory of substantial integral wholes is not a pure mereology in the modern sense, since he holds that there are privileged divisions: just as a genus is properly divided into not just any species but its proximate species, so too the division of a whole must be into its principal parts. Intuitively, some wholes have a natural division that takes precedence over others; a sentence, for example, is divided into words, syllables, and letters, in precisely that order. According to Abelard, the principal parts of a whole are those whose conjunction immediately results in the complete whole. His intent seems to be that the nature of the composition (if any) that defines the integral whole also spells out its principal parts. A house consists of floor, walls, and roof put together in the right way. It is an open question whether each principal part (such as the wall) requires the existence of all of its subparts (every brick). The principal parts of a collection, for example, are just each of the members of the collection, whatever may be the case with any given member's subparts; the principal parts of an aggregation are the members located in proximity to one another.

Individuals have natures, and in virtue of their natures they belong to determinate natural kinds. But an individual's nature is not something really shared with or common to other individuals; Abelard's refutation of realism has shown that this is impossible. Instead, Abelard takes a natural kind to be a well-defined collection of things that have the same features, broadly speaking, that make them what they are. Why a given thing has some features rather than others is explained by how it got that way — the natural processes that created it result in its having the features it does, namely being the kind of thing it is; similar processes lead to similar results. On this reading, it is clear that natural kinds have no special status; they are no more than discrete integral wholes whose principle of membership is similarity, merely reflecting the fact that the world is divided into discrete similarity-classes of objects. Furthermore, such real relations of similarity are nothing themselves above and beyond the things that are similar. The division into natural kinds is, presumably, a ‘shallow fact’ about the world: matters could have been otherwise had God ordained them differently; fire might be cold, heavy bodies fall upwards, frogs reason. If these causal powers were different, then natural kinds might be different as well, or might not have been as sharply differentiated as they are now. Given how matters stand, natural kinds carve the world at its joints, but they are the joints chosen by God.

3. Logic

Abelard was the greatest logician since Antiquity: he devised a purely truth-functional propositional logic, recognizing the distinction between force and content we associate with Frege, and worked out a complete theory of entailment as it functions in argument (which we now take as the theory of logical consequence). His logical system is flawed in its handling of topical inference, but that should not prevent our recognition of Abelard's achievements.

Abelard observes that the same propositional content can be expressed with different force in different contexts: the content that Socrates is in the house is expressed in an assertion in “Socrates is in the house”; in a question in “Is Socrates in the house?”; in a wish in “If only Socrates were in the house!” and so on. Hence Abelard can distinguish in particular the assertive force of a sentence from its propositional content, a distinction that allows him to point out that the component sentences in a conditional statement are not asserted, though they have the same content they do when asserted — "If Socrates is in the kitchen, then Socrates is in the house" does not assert that Socrates is in the kitchen or that he is in the house, nor do the antecedent or the consequent, although the same form of words could be used outside the scope of the conditional to make such assertions. Likewise, the distinction allows Abelard to define negation, and other propositional connectives, purely truth-functionally in terms of content, so that negation, for instance, is treated as follows: not-p is false/true if and only if p is true/false.

The key to the theory of argument, for Abelard, is found in inferentia, best rendered as ‘entailment’ since Abelard requires the connection between the propositions involved to be both necessary and relevant. That is, the conclusion — more exactly, the sense of the final statement — is required by the sense of the preceding statement(s), so that it cannot be otherwise. Abelard often speaks of the sense of the final statement being ‘contained’ in the sense of the preceding statement(s), much as we speak of the conclusion being contained in the premisses. An entailment is complete (perfecta) when it holds in virtue of the logical form (complexio) of the propositions involved. By this, Abelard tells us, he means that the entailment holds under any uniform substitution in its terms, the criterion now associated with Bolzano. The traditional four figures and moods of the categorical syllogism derived from Aristotle, and the doctrine of the hypothetical syllogism derived from Boethius, are all instances of complete entailments, or as we should say, valid inference.

There is another way in which conclusions can be necessary and relevant to their premisses, yet not be formally valid (not be a complete entailment). The necessary connection among the propositions, and the link among their senses, might be a function of non-formal metaphysical truths holding in all possible worlds. For instance, human beings are a kind of animal, so the consequence “If Socrates is a human being, Socrates is an animal” holds of necessity and the sense of the antecedent compels that of the consequent, but it is not formally valid under uniform substitution. Abelard takes such incomplete entailments to hold according to the theory of the topics (to be forms of so-called topical inference). The sample inference above is validated by the topic “from the species”, a set of metaphysical relations one of which is expressible in the rule “Whatever the species is predicated of, so too is the genus” which grounds the inferential force of the entailment. Against Boethius, Abelard maintained that topical rules were only needed for incomplete entailment, and in particular are not required to validate the classical moods of the categorical and hypothetical syllogism mentioned in the preceding paragraph.

Abelard spends a great deal of effort to explore the complexities of the theory of topical inference, especially charting the precise relations among conditional sentences, arguments, and what he calls ‘argumentation’ (roughly what follows from conceded premisses). One of the surprising results of his investigation is that he denies that a correlate of the Deduction Theorem holds, maintaining that a valid argument need not correspond to an acceptable conditional sentence, nor conversely, since the requirements on arguments and conditionals differ.

In the end, it seems that Abelard's principles of topical inference do not work, a fact that became evident with regard to the topic “from opposites”: Abelard's principles lead to inconsistent results, a result noted by Alberic of Paris. This led to a crisis in the theory of inference in the twelfth century, since Abelard unsuccessfully tried to evade the difficulty. These debates seem to have taken place in the later part of the 1130s, as Abelard was about to become embroiled with Bernard of Clairvaux, and his attention was elsewhere.

4. Philosophy of Language

Much of Abelard's philosophy of language is devoted to analyzing how a given expression or class of expressions function logically: what words are quantifiers, which imply negation, and the like, so that the logic described above may be applied. To do so, he relies on the traditional division, derived from Aristotle, that sees the main linguistic categories as name, verb, and their combination into the sentence.

Abelard takes names to be conventionally significant simple words, usually without tense. So understood there are a wide variety of names: proper and common names; adjectives and adverbs; pronouns, whether personal, possessive, reflexive, or relative; conventional interjections such as “Goodness!”; and, arguably, conjunctions and prepositions (despite lacking definite signification), along with participles and gerundives (which have tense). Abelard usually, though not always, treats compound names such as ‘street-sweeper’ reductively. Even so his list is not general enough to catalogue all referring expressions. In point of fact, much of Abelard's discussion of the semantics of names turns on a particular case that stands for the rest: common names. These are at the heart of the problem of universals, and they pose particular difficulties for semantics.

When Abelard puts forward his claim that universality is only a linguistic phenomenon, so that universals are “nothing more than words,” he raises the objection that unless common names are the names of common items, they will be meaningless, and so his view is no better than that of his teacher Roscelin (who held that universals were mere mouth noises). In reply Abelard clearly draws a distinction between two semantic properties names possess: reference (nominatio), a matter of what the term applies to; and sense (significatio), a matter of what hearing the term brings to mind, or more exactly the informational content (doctrina) of the concept the word is meant to give rise to, a causal notion. A few remarks about each are in order.

Names, both proper and common, refer to things individually or severally. A name is linked with that of which it is the name as though there were someone who devised the name to label a given thing or kind of thing, a process known as ‘imposition’ (modelled on Adam's naming the animals in Genesis 2:19), rather like baptism. This rational reconstruction of reference does not require the person imposing the name, the ‘impositor’, to have anything more than an indefinite intention to pick out the thing or kind of thing, whatever its nature may be:

The inventor [of names] intended to impose them according to some natures or distinctive properties of things, even if he himself did not know how to think correctly upon the nature or distinctive property of a thing..

A name “has a definition in the nature of its imposition, even if we do not know what it is.” Put in modern terms, Abelard holds a theory of direct reference, in which the extension of a term is not a function of its sense. We are often “completely ignorant” of the proper conceptual content that should be associated with a term that has been successfully imposed.

A proper name — the name of a primary substance — signifies a concrete individual (hoc aliquid), picking out its bearer as personally distinct from all else. Therefore, proper names are semantically singular referring expressions, closely allied to indexicals, demonstratives, and singular descriptions (or descriptive terms). Common names, by contrast, are semantically allied with expressions that have what Abelard calls “plural signification”. On the one hand, common names are like plural nouns; the common name ‘man’ is grammatically singular but operates like the plural term ‘men’ — each refers to every man, although the plural term signifies individuals as part of a collection, whereas the common name distributively refers to each individual. On the other hand, common names are like terms such as ‘trio’ or ‘pair’ in that they pick out a determinate plurality of individuals, but only on an occasion of use, since their extension is variable.

Thus a common name distributively refers to concrete individuals, though not to them qua individuals. Instead, it severally picks out those individuals having a given nature: ‘human being’ refers to Socrates and to Plato, in virtue of each of them being human. This is not a shared feature of any sort; Socrates just is what he is, namely human, and likewise Plato is what he is, namely human too. Abelard states his deflationary position clearly in his Logica ‘ingredientibus’:

Now it seems we should stay away from accepting the agreement among things according to what is not any thing — it's as though we were to unite in nothing things that now exist! — namely, when we say that this [human] and that one agree in the human status, that is to say: in that they are human. But we mean precisely that they are human and don't differ in this regard — let me repeat: [they don't differ] in that they are human, although we're not appealing to any thing [in this explanation].

Socrates and Plato are real; their agreement is real, too, but it isn't to be explained by appealing to any thing — their agreement just is their each being human. From a metaphysical point of view they have the same standing as human beings; this does not involve any metaphysically common shared ingredient, or indeed appeal to any ingredient at all. That is the sense in which there is a “common reason” for the imposition of a common name.

For all that signification is posterior to reference, names do have signification as well. Abelard holds that the signification of a term is the informational content of the concept that is associated with the term upon hearing it, in the normal course of events. Since names are only conventionally significant, which concept is associated with a given name depends in part on the psychological conditioning of language-users, in virtue of which Abelard can treat signification as both a causal and a normative notion: the word ‘rabbit’ ought to cause native speakers of English to have the concept of a rabbit upon hearing it. Abelard is careful to insist that the signification is a matter of the informational content carried in the concept — mere psychological associations, even the mental images characteristic of a given concept, are not part of what the word means. Ideally, the concept will correspond to a real definition that latches onto the nature of the thing, the way ‘rational mortal animal’ is thought to be the real definition of ‘human being’, regardless of other associated features (even necessary features such as risibility) or fortuitous images (as any mental image of a human will be of someone with determinate features). Achieving such clarity in our concepts is, of course, an arduous business, and requires an understanding of how understanding itself works (see the discussion of Abelard's philosophy of mind in Section 5). Yet one point should be clear from the example. The significations of some names, such as those corresponding to natural-kind terms, are ‘abstractions’ in the sense that they include only certain features of the things to which the term refers. They do not positively exclude all other features, though, and are capable of further determinate specification: ‘rational mortal animal’ as the content of the concept of ‘human being’ signifies all humans, whatever their further features may be — tall or short, fat or thin, male or female, and so on.

What holds for the semantics of names applies for the most part to verbs. The feature that sets verbs apart from names, more so than tense or grammatical person, is that verbs have connective force (vis copulativa). This is a primitive and irreducible feature of verbs that can only be discharged when they are joined with names in the syntactically appropriate way, reminiscent of the ‘unsaturatedness’ of concepts in Frege. Sentences are made up of names and verbs in such a way that the meaning of the whole sentence is a function of the meaning of its parts. That is, Abelardian semantics is fundamentally compositional in nature. The details of how the composition works are complex. Abelard works directly with a natural language (Latin) that, for all its artificiality, is still a native second tongue. Hence there are many linguistic phenomena Abelard is compelled to analyze that would be simply disallowed in a more formal framework.

For example, Abelard notes that most verbs can occur as predicates in two ways, namely as a finite verbal form or as a nominal form combined with an auxiliary copula, so that we may say either “Socrates runs” or “Socrates is running”; the same holds for transitive predication, for instance “Socrates hits Plato” and “Socrates is hitting Plato.” Abelard argues that in general the pure verbal version of predication is the fundamental form, which explains and clarifies the extended version; the latter is only strictly necessary where simple verbal forms are lacking. (The substantive verb ‘is’ requires special treatment.) Hence for Abelard the basic analysis of a predicative statement recognizes that two fundamentally different linguistic categories are joined together: the name n and the simple verbal function V( ), combined in the well-formed sentence V(n).

Abelard argues that sentences (propositiones) must signify more than just the understandings of the constituent name and verb. First, a sentence such as “Socrates runs” deals with Socrates and with running, not with anyone's understandings. We talk about the world, not merely someone's understanding of the world. Second, sentences like “If something is human, it is an animal” are false if taken to be about understandings, for someone could entertain the concept human without entertaining the concept animal, and so the antecedent would obtain without the consequent. Third, understandings are evanescent particulars, mere mental tokenings of concepts. But at least some consequential sentences are necessary, and necessity can't be grounded on things that are transitory, and so not on understandings. Sentences must therefore signify something else in addition to understandings, something that can do what mere understandings cannot. Abelard describes this as signifying what the sentence says, calling what is said by the sentence its dictum (plural dicta).

To the modern philosophical ear, Abelard's dicta might sound like propositions, abstract entities that are the timeless bearers of truth and falsity. But Abelard will have nothing to do with any such entities. He declares repeatedly and emphatically that despite being more than and different from the sentences that express them, dicta have no ontological standing whatsoever. In the short space of a single paragraph he says that they are “no real things at all” and twice calls them “absolutely nothing.” They underwrite sentences, but they aren't real things. For although a sentence says something, there is not some thing that it says. The semantic job of sentences is to say something, which is not to be confused with naming or denoting some thing. It is instead a matter of proposing how things are, provided this is not given a realist reading. Likewise, the truth of true sentences is not a property inhering in some timeless entity, but no more than the assertion of what the sentence says — that is, Abelard adopts a deflationary account of truth. A sentence is true if things stand in the way it says, and things make sentences true or false in virtue of the way they are (as well as in virtue of what the sentences say), and nothing further is required. The sentence “Socrates runs” is true because Socrates runs, which is all that can be said or needs to be said.

5. Philosophy of Mind

Aristotelian philosophy of mind offers two analyses of intentionality: the conformality theory holds that we think of an object by having its very form in the mind, the resemblance theory that we do so by having a mental image in the mind that naturally resembles the object. Abelard rejects each of these theories and proposes instead an adverbial theory of thought, showing that neither mental images nor mental contents need be countenanced as ontologically independent of the mind. He gives a contextual explication of intentionality that relies on a linguistic account of mental representation, adopting a principle of compositionality for understandings.

The first Aristotelian analysis takes understanding to be the mind's acquisition of the form of the object that is understood, without its matter. For an understanding to be about some thing — say, a cat — is for the form of the cat to be in the mind or intellective soul. The inherence of the form in matter makes the matter to be a thing of a certain kind, so that the inherence of the form cat in matter produces an actual cat, whereas the (immaterial) inherence of the form cat in the mind transforms the mind into an understanding of a cat: the mind becomes (formally) identical with its object. Since the ‘aboutness’ of understanding is analyzed as the commonness or identity of form in the understanding and the thing understood, we may call this approach the conformality theory of understanding. This theory captures the intuition that understanding somehow inherits or includes properties of what is understood, by reducing the intentionality of understanding to the objective identity of the form in the mind and the form in the world.

The second Aristotelian analysis takes understanding to be the mind's possession of a concept that is a natural likeness of, or naturally similar to, that of which it is a concept. For an understanding to be about some thing, such as a cat, is for there to be an occurrent concept in the mind that is a natural likeness of a cat. The motivation for calling the likeness “natural” is to guarantee that the resemblance between the understanding and what is understood is objective, and that all persons have access to the same stock of concepts. (The conformality theory does this by postulating the objective existence of forms in things and by an identical process in all persons of assimilating or acquiring forms.) We may call this approach the resemblance theory of understanding: mental acts are classified according to the distinct degree and kind of resemblance they have to the things that are understood.

The resemblance theory faces well-known problems in spelling out the content of resemblance or likeness. For example, a concept is clearly immaterial, and as such radically differs from any material object. Furthermore, there seems to be no formal characteristic of a mental act in virtue of which it can non-trivially be said to resemble anything else. To get around these difficulties, mediaeval philosophers, like the British Empiricists centuries later, appealed to a particular kind of resemblance, namely pictorial resemblance. A portrait of Socrates is about Socrates in virtue of visually resembling Socrates in the right ways. And just as there are pictorial images that are about their subjects, so too are there mental images that are about things. These mental images, whether they are concepts or are contained in concepts, explain the way in which a concept is ‘about’ an object. For an understanding to be about a cat is for it to be or contain a mental image of a cat. The phenomenon of mental ‘aboutness’ is explicated by the more familiar case of pictorial aboutness, itself reduced to a real relation of resemblance.

Despite their common Aristotelian heritage, the conformality theory and the resemblance theory are not equivalent. The transformation of the mind through the inherence of a form is not necessarily the same as the mind's possession of a concept. Equally, natural likeness or resemblance need not be understood as identity of form; formal identity need not entail genuine resemblance, due to the different subjects in which the form is embodied.

The standard way to reconcile the conformality theory and the resemblance theory is to take the mind's possession of a concept to be its ability to transform itself through the inherence of a form, construing formal identity as natural likeness, where having a form in the mind that is identical to the form of the object understood just is to have a mental image of that very object.

Abelard argues against conformality as follows. Consider a tower, which is a material object with a certain length, depth, and height; assume that these features compose its form, much as the shape of a statue is its form. According to Aristotelian metaphysics, the inherence of a form in a subject makes the subject into something characterized by that form, as for instance whiteness inhering in Socrates makes him something white. The forms of the tower likewise make that in which they inhere to be tall, wide, massive — all physical properties. If these forms inhere in the mind, then, they should make the mind tall, wide, and massive, an absurd conclusion: the mind “cannot extend itself in length or width.” Yet it is a cardinal thesis of the conformality theory that the mind has the identical form that is possessed by the external object, the tower, although the form of (say) length is by its very nature physical. Thus, Abelard concludes, conformality is incoherent.

Abelard's main objection to the resemblance theory is that mental images qua images, like any sign, are inert: they require interpretation. A sign is just an object. It may be taken in a significative role, though it need not be. Abelard notes that this distinction holds equally for non-mental signs: we can treat a statue as a lump of bronze or as a likeness. Mental images are likewise inert. For a sign to function significatively, then, something more is required beyond its mere presence or existence. But the resemblance theory doesn't recognize the need to interpret the mental image as an image, and thereby mistakenly identifies understanding with the mere presence of a mental image in the mind. Abelard concludes that mental images have only an instrumental role in thought, describing them as “intermediary signs of things” (intersigna rerum). Intentionality derives instead from the act of attention (attentio) directed upon the mental image. Proof is found in the fact that that we can “vary the understanding” simply by attending to different features of the mental image: the selfsame image — say, a fig tree — can be used to think about this very fig tree, or trees in general, or plant life, or my lost love with whom I sat under it, or anything whatsoever. There is no intrinsic feature of the mental image in virtue of which it is about any given thing; if there were, Abelard notes, we could determine by inspection what a sign is about — but we can't. Mental images, therefore, can't explain the intentionality of understanding, because their role is merely instrumental. We think with them, and cannot avoid them; but they do not explain intentionality.

Abelard draws the conclusion that intentionality is a primitive and irreducible feature of the mind, our acts of attending to things. Different acts of attention are intrinsically different from one another; they are about what they are about in virtue of being the kind of attention they are. Hence Abelard adopts what is nowadays called an adverbial theory of thought.

Given that intentionality is primitive, Abelard adopts a contextual approach to mental content: he embeds these irreducible acts of attention in a structure whose articulation helps define the character of its constituent elements. The structure Abelard offers is linguistic, a logic of mental acts: just as words can be said to express thoughts, so too we can use the articulated logic of language to give a theory of understanding. In short, Abelard gives something very like a linguistic account of mental representation or intentionality. To this end he embraces a principle of compositionality, holding that what an understanding is about is a function of what its constituent understandings are about. The unity of the understanding of a complex is a function of its logical simplicity, which is characterized by the presence of what Abelard calls “a single dominant conjunction” (the logical operator of greatest scope). Hence the understanding of a complex may be treated as a complex of distinct understandings, aggregated in the same thought, with its (logical) structure flowing from the ‘dominant conjunction’ over the other logical operations governing its constituent understandings. Abelard's acts of attention thus display the logical structure of the understanding they express, and thereby give the semantics of written or spoken language. Much of Abelard's writings on logic and dialectic are given over to working out the details as a scheme for explicating mental content.

6. Ethics

Abelard takes the rational core of traditional Christian morality to be radically intentionalist, based on the following principle: the agent's intention alone determines the moral worth of an action. His main argument against the moral relevance of consequences turns on what has been called “moral luck.” Suppose two men each have the money and the intention to establish shelters for the poor, but one is robbed before he can act whereas the second is able to carry out his intention. According to Abelard, to think that there is a moral difference between them is to hold that “the richer men were the better they could become … this is the height of insanity!” Deed-centred morality loses any kind of purchase on what might have been the case. Likewise, it cannot offer any ground for taking the epistemic status of the agent into account, although most people would admit that ignorance can morally exculpate an agent. Abelard makes the point with the following example: imagine the case of fraternal twins, brother and sister, who are separated at birth and each kept in complete ignorance of even the existence of the other; as adults they meet, fall in love, are legally married and have sexual intercourse. Technically this is incest, but Abelard finds no fault in either to lay blame.

Abelard concludes that in themselves deeds are morally indifferent. The proper subject of moral evaluation is the agent, via his or her intentions. It might be objected that the performance or nonperformance of the deed could affect the agent's feelings, which in turn may affect his or her intentions, so that deeds thereby have moral relevance (at least indirectly). Abelard denies it:

For example, if someone forces a monk to lie bound in chains between two women, and by the softness of the bed and the touch of the women beside him he is brought to pleasure (but not to consent), who may presume to call this pleasure, which nature makes necessary, a fault?

We are so constructed that the feeling of pleasure is inevitable in certain situations: sexual intercourse, eating delicious food, and the like. If sexual pleasure in marriage is not sinful, then the pleasure itself, inside or outside of marriage, is not sinful; if it is sinful, then marriage cannot sanctify it — and if the conclusion were drawn that such acts should be performed wholly without pleasure, then Abelard declares they cannot be done at all, and it was unreasonable (of God) to permit them only in a way in which they cannot be performed.

On the positive side, Abelard argues that unless intentions are the key ingredient in assessing moral value it is hard to see why coercion, in which one is forced to do something against his or her will, should exculpate the agent; likewise for ignorance — though Abelard points out that the important moral notion is not simply ignorance but strictly speaking negligence. Abelard takes an extreme case to make his point. He argues that the crucifiers of Christ were not evil in crucifying Jesus. (This example, and others like it, got Abelard into trouble with the authorities, and it isn't hard to see why.) Their ignorance of Christ's divine nature didn't by itself make them evil; neither did their acting on their (false and mistaken) beliefs, in crucifying Christ. Their non-negligent ignorance removes blame from their actions. Indeed, Abelard argues that they would have sinned had they thought crucifying Christ was required and did not crucify Christ: regardless of the facts of the case, failing to abide by one's conscience in moral action renders the agent blameworthy.

There are two obvious objections to Abelard's intentionalism. First, how is it possible to commit evil voluntarily? Second, since intentions are not accessible to anyone other than the agent, doesn't Abelard's view entail that it is impossible to make ethical judgements?

With regard to the first objection, Abelard has a twofold answer. First, it is clear that we often want to perform the deed and at the same time do not want to suffer the punishment. A man wants to have sexual intercourse with a woman, but not to commit adultery; he would prefer it if she were unmarried. Second, it is clear that we sometimes “want what we by no means want to want”: our bodies react with pleasure and desire independently of our wills. If we act on such desires, then our action is done “of” will, as Abelard calls it, though not voluntarily. There is nothing evil in desire: there is only evil in acting on desire, and this is compatible with having contrary desires.

With regard to the second objection, Abelard grants that other humans cannot know the agent's intentions — God, of course, does have access to internal mental states, and so there can be a Final Judgement. However, Abelard does not take ethical judgement to pose a problem. God is the only one with a right to pass judgement. Yet this fact doesn't prevent us from enforcing canons of human justice, because, Abelard holds, human justice has primarily an exemplary and deterrent function. In fact, Abelard argues, it can even be just to punish an agent we strongly believe had no evil intention. He cites two cases. First, a woman accidentally smothers her baby while trying to keep it warm at night, and is overcome with grief. Abelard maintains that we should punish her for the beneficial example her punishment may have on others: it may make other poor mothers more careful not to accidentally smother their babies while trying to keep them warm. Second, a judge may have excellent (but legally impermissible) evidence that a witness is perjuring himself; since he cannot show that the witness is lying, the judge is forced to rule on the basis of the witness's testimony that the accused, whom he believes to be innocent, is guilty. Human justice may with propriety ignore questions of intention. Since there is divine justice, ethical notions are not an idle wheel — nor should they be, even on Abelard's understanding of human justice, since they are the means by which we determine which intentions to promote or discourage when we punish people as examples or in order to deter others.

There is a sense, then, in which the only certifiable sin is acting against one's conscience, unless one is morally negligent. Yet if we cannot look to the intrinsic value of the deeds or their consequences, how do we determine which acts are permissible or obligatory? Unless conscience has a reliable guide, Abelard's position seems to open the floodgates to well-meaning subjectivism.

Abelard solves the problem by taking obedience to God's will — the hallmark of morally correct behaviour, and itself an instance of natural law — to be a matter of the agent's intention conforming to a purely formal criterion, namely the Golden Rule (“Do to others as you would be done to”). This criterion can be discovered by reason alone, without any special revelation or religious belief, and is sufficient to ensure the rightness of the agent's intention. But the resolution of this problem immediately leads to another problem. Even if we grant Abelard his naturalistic ethics, why should an agent care if his or her intentions conform to the Golden Rule? In short, even if Abelard were right about morality, why be moral?

Abelard's answer is that our happiness — to which no one is indifferent — is linked to virtue, that is, to habitual morally correct behaviour. Indeed, Abelard's project in the Collationes is to argue that reason can prove that a merely naturalistic ethics is insufficient, and that an agent's happiness is necessarily bound up with accepting the principles of traditional Christian belief, including the belief in God and an Afterlife. In particular, he argues that the Afterlife is a condition to which we ought to aspire, that it is a moral improvement even on the life of virtue in this world, and that recognizing this is constitutive of wanting to do what God wants, that is, to live according to the Golden Rule, which guarantees as much as anything can (pending divine grace) our long-term postmortem happiness.

The Philosopher first argues with the Jew, who espouses a ‘strict observance’ moral theory, namely obedience to the Mosaic Law. One of the arguments the Jew offers is the Slave's Wager (apparently the earliest-known version of Pascal's Wager). Imagine that a Slave is told one morning by someone he doesn't know whether to trust that his powerful and irritable Master, who is away for the day, has left instructions about what to do in his absence. The Slave can follow the instructions or not. He reasons that if the Master indeed left the instructions, then by following them he will be rewarded and by not following them he will be severely punished, whereas if the Master did not leave the instructions he would not be punished for following them, though he might be lightly punished for not following them. (This conforms to the standard payoff matrix for Pascal's Wager.) That is the position the Jew finds himself in: God has apparently demanded unconditional obedience to the Mosaic Law, the instructions left behind. The Philosopher argues that the Jew may have other choices of action and, in any event, that there are rational grounds for thinking that ethics is not a matter of action in conformity to law but a matter of the agent's intentions, as we have seen above.

The Philosopher then argues with the Christian. He initially maintains that virtue entails happiness, and hence there is no need of an Afterlife since a virtuous person remains in the same condition whether dead or alive. The Christian, however, reasons that the Afterlife is better, since in addition to the benefits conferred by living virtuously, the agent's will is no longer impeded by circumstances. In the Afterlife we are no longer subject to the body, for instance, and hence are not bound by physical necessities such as food, shelter, clothing, and the like. The agent can therefore be as purely happy as life in accordance with virtue could permit, when no external circumstances could affect the agent's actions. The Philosopher grants that the Afterlife so understood is a clear improvement even on the virtuous life in this world, and joins with the Christian in a cooperative endeavour to define the nature of the virtues and the Supreme Good. Virtue is its own reward, and in the Afterlife nothing prevents us from rewarding ourselves with virtue to the fullest extent possible.

7. Theology

Abelard held that reasoning has a limited role to play in matters of faith. That he gave reasoning a role at all brought him into conflict with those we now call ‘anti-dialecticians,’ including his fellow abbot Bernard of Clairvaux. That the role he gave it is limited brought him into conflict with those he called ‘pseudo-dialecticians,’ including his former teacher Roscelin.

Bernard of Clairvaux and other anti-dialecticians seem to have thought that the meaning of a proposition of the faith, to the extent that it can be grasped, is plain; beyond that plain meaning, there is nothing we can grasp at all, in which case reason is clearly no help. That is, the anti-dialecticians were semantic realists about the (plain) meaning of (religious) sentences. Hence their impatience with Abelard, who seemed not only bent on obfuscating the plain meaning of propositions of the faith, which is bad enough, but to do so by reasoning, which has no place either in grasping the plain meaning (since the very plainness of plain meaning consists in its being grasped immediately without reasoning) or in reaching some more profound understanding (since only the plain meaning is open to us at all).

Abelard has no patience for the semantic realism that underlies the sophisticated anti-dialectical position. Rather than argue against it explicitly, he tries to undermine it. From his commentaries on scripture and dogma to his works of speculative theology, Abelard is first and foremost concerned to show how religious claims can be understood, and in particular how the application of dialectical methods can clarify and illuminate propositions of the faith. Furthermore, he rejects the claim that there is a plain meaning to be grasped. Outlining his method in the Prologue to his Sic et non, Abelard describes how he initially raises a question, e.g. whether priests are required to be celibate, and then arranges citations from scriptural and patristic authorities that at least seem to answer the question directly into positive and negative responses. (Abelard offers advice in the Prologue for resolving the apparent contradictions among the authorities using a variety of techniques: see whether the words are used in the same sense on both sides; draw relevant distinctions to resolve the issue; look at the context of the citation; make sure that an author is speaking in his own voice rather than merely reporting or paraphrasing someone else's position; and so on.) Now each authority Abelard cites seems to speak clearly and unambiguously either for a positive answer to a given question or for a negative one. If ever there were cases of plain meaning, Abelard seems to have found them in authorities, on opposing sides of controversial issues. His advice in the Prologue amounts to saying that sentences that seem to be perfect exemplars of plain meaning in fact have to be carefully scrutinized to see just what their meaning is. Yet that is just to say that they do not have plain meaning at all; we have to use reason to uncover their meaning. Hence the anti-dialecticians don't have a case.

There is a far more serious threat to the proper use of reason in religion, Abelard thinks (Theologia christiana 3.20):

Those who claim to be dialecticians are usually led more easily to [heresy] the more they hold themselves to be well-equipped with reasons, and, to that extent more secure, they presume to attack or defend any position the more freely. Their arrogance is so great that they think there isn't anything that can't be understood and explained by their petty little lines of reasoning. Holding all authorities in contempt, they glory in believing only themselves — for those who accept only what their reason persuades them of, surely answer to themselves alone, as if they had eyes that were unacquainted with darkness.

Such pseudo-dialecticians take reason to be the final arbiter of all claims, including claims about matters of faith. More exactly, Abelard charges them with holding that (a) everything can be explained by human reason; (b) we should only accept what reason persuades us of; (c) appeals to authority have no rational persuasive force. Real dialecticians, he maintains, reject (a)–(c), recognizing that human reason has limits, and that some important truths may lie outside those limits but not beyond belief; which claims about matters of faith we should accept depends on both the epistemic reliability of their sources (the authorities) and their consonance with reason to the extent they can be investigated.

Abelard's arguments for rejecting (a)–(c) are sophisticated and subtle. For the claim that reason may be fruitfully applied to a particular article of faith, Abelard offers a particular case study in his own writings. The bulk of Abelard's work on theology is devoted to his dialectical investigation of the Trinity. He elaborates an original theory of identity to address issues surrounding the Trinity, one that has wider applicability in metaphysics. The upshot of his enquiries is that belief in the Trinity is rationally justifiable since as far as reason can take us we find that the doctrine makes sense — at least, once the tools of dialectic have been properly employed.

The traditional account of identity, derived from Boethius, holds that things may be either generically, specifically, or numerically the same or different. Abelard accepts this account but finds it not sufficiently fine-grained to deal with the Trinity. The core of his theory of identity, as presented in his Theologia christiana, consists in four additional modes of identity: (1) essential sameness and difference; (2) numerical sameness and difference, which Abelard ties closely to essential sameness and difference, allowing a more fine-grained distinction than Boethius could allow; (3) sameness and difference in definition; (4) sameness and difference in property (in proprietate). Roughly, Abelard's account of essential and numerical sameness is intended to improve upon the identity-conditions for things in the world given by the traditional account; his account of sameness in definition is meant to supply identity-conditions for the features of things; and his account of sameness in property opens up the possibility of there being different identity-conditions for a single thing having several distinct features.

Abelard holds that two things are the same in essence when they are numerically the same concrete thing (essentia), and essentially different otherwise. The Morning Star is essentially the same as the Evening Star, for instance, since each is the selfsame planet Venus. Again, the formal elements that constitute a concrete thing are essentially the same as one another and essentially the same as the concrete thing of which they are the formal constituents: Socrates is his essence (Socrates is what it is to be Socrates). The corresponding general thesis does not hold for parts, however. Abelard maintains that the part is essentially different from the integral whole of which it is a part, reasoning that a given part is completely contained, along with other parts, in the whole, and so is less than the quantity of the whole.

Numerical difference does not map precisely onto essential difference. The failure of numerical sameness may be due to one of two causes. First, objects are not numerically the same when one has a part that the other does not have, in which case the objects are essentially different as well. Second, objects are numerically different when neither has a part belonging to the other. Numerical difference thus entails the failure of numerical sameness, but not conversely: a part is not numerically the same as its whole, but it is not numerically different from its whole. Thus one thing is essentially different from another when either they have only a part in common, in which case they are not numerically the same; or they have no parts in common, in which case they are numerically different as well as not numerically the same. Since things may be neither numerically the same nor numerically different, the question “How many things are there?” is ill-formed as it stands and must be made more precise, a fact Abelard exploits in his discussion of the Trinity.

Essential and numerical sameness and difference apply directly to things in the world; they are extensional forms of identity. By contrast, sameness and difference in definition is roughly analogous to modern theories of the identity of properties. Abelard holds that things are the same in definition when what it is to be one requires that it be the other, and conversely; otherwise they differ in definition.

Finally, things are the same in property when they specify features that characterize one another. Abelard offers an example to clarify this notion. A cube of marble exemplifies both whiteness and hardness; what is white is essentially the same as what is hard, since they are numerically the same concrete thing, namely the marble cube; yet the whiteness and the hardness in the marble cube clearly differ in definition — but even so, what is white is characterized by hardness (the white thing is hard), and conversely what is hard is characterized by whiteness (the hard thing is white). The properties of whiteness and hardness are ‘mixed’ since, despite their being different in definition, each applies to the selfsame concrete thing (namely the marble cube) as such and also as it is characterized by the other.

The interesting case is where something has properties that “remain so completely unmixed” that the items they characterize are different in property. Consider a form-matter composite in relation to its matter. The matter out of which a form-matter composite is made is essentially the same as the composite, since each is the entire material composite itself. Yet despite their essential sameness, they are not identical; the matter is not the composite, nor conversely. The matter is not the composite, for the composite comes to be out of the matter, but the matter does not come to be out of itself. The composite is not the matter, since “nothing is in any way a constitutive part of or naturally prior to itself.” Instead, the matter is prior to the composite since it has the property priority with respect to the composite, whereas the composite is posterior to its matter since it has the property posteriority with respect to its matter. Now despite being essentially the same, the matter is not characterized by posteriority, unlike the composite, and the composite is not characterized by priority, unlike the matter. Hence the matter and composite are different in property; the properties priority and posteriority are unmixed — they differ in property.

Now for the payoff. Abelard deploys his theory of identity to shed light on the Trinity as follows. The three Persons are essentially the same as one another, since they are all the same concrete thing (namely God). They differ from one another in definition, since what it is to be the Father is not the same as what it is to be the Son or what it is to be the Holy Spirit. The three Persons are numerically different from one another, for otherwise they would not be three, but they are not numerically different from God: if they were there would be three gods, not one. Moreover, each Person has properties that uniquely apply to it — unbegotten to the Father, begotten to the Son, and proceeding to the Holy Spirit — as well as properties that are distinctive of it, such as power for the Father, wisdom for the Son, and goodness for the Holy Spirit. The unique properties are unmixed in Abelard's technical sense, for the Persons differ from one another in their unique properties, and such properties do not apply to God; the distinctive properties are mixed, though, in that God is characterized by each (the powerful God is the wise God is the good God). Further than that, Abelard holds, human reason cannot go; but reason validates the analysis (strictly speaking only a “likeness” or analogy) as far as it can go.


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