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African Sage Philosophy

First published Tue Feb 14, 2006

“African Sage Philosophy” is the name now commonly given to the body of thought produced by persons considered wise in African communities, and more specifically refers to those who seek a rational foundation for ideas and concepts used to describe and view the world by critically examining the justification of those ideas and concepts. The expression acquired its currency from a project conducted by the late Kenyan philosopher Henry Odera Oruka (1944–1995), whose primary aim was to establish, with evidence, that critical reflection upon themes of fundamental importance has always been the concern of a select few in African societies. These themes involve questions regarding the nature of the supreme being, the concept of the person, the meaning of freedom, equality, death and the belief in the afterlife. The evidence that Oruka collected regarding the rational elaboration of such themes by indigenous sages is contained in dialogues, many of which appear in his classic text, Sage Philosophy: Indigenous Thinkers and Modern Debate on African Philosophy (1990).

1. Oruka's Project

The following two examples from this text illustrate the method and purpose of Oruka's questioning. When asked what he thought of his own (Luo) community's idea of communalism, Paul Mbuya Akoko responded as follows:

Now the sense in which we may justly say that the Luo in the traditional setting practiced communalism is not one in which people generously shared property or wealth. Their idea of communalism is, I think, of a co-operative nature. For example, where one person had cattle, everybody ‘ipso facto’ had cattle. For the owner of the cattle would distribute his cattle among people who did not have cattle [of their own] so that the less well-off people may take care of them…[but] never completely given away…The result is that everybody had cows to look after and so milk to drink. (Oruka, 1990: 141)

Another sage, Okemba Simiyu Chaungo from the Bukusu community, responded to the question, "What is truth?" as follows:

When something is true, it is just as you see it … it is just what it is … just like this bottle … it is true that it is just a bottle… just what it is. Truth is good. Falsehood is bad. It is evil. He who says the truth is accepted by good people. A liar may have many followers … but he is bad. [Obwatieribwatoto. Bwatoto nokhulola sindu ne siene sa tu … nga inchpa yino olola ichupa ni yene sa tu.] (Sage Philosophy, p. 111)

And in response to an Interlocutor, who asks "Why would people tell lies?", he responded:

So that they may eat… so that they may get empty prestige. They want to profit fraudulently. (Sage Philosophy, p. 111)

From these examples some of the distinguishing characteristics of Sage Philosophy can be gleaned. First, they display the deeply personal nature of the ideas, or opinions, that the sages expressed in response to the questions. Akoko's insight derives from his individual reflections on the practice of communalism to consider its justification. Second, they provide evidence of abstract thought about philosophic topics. Chaungo considers what it means for a proposition to be true and expresses what turns out to be a correspondence theory of truth — according to which the proposition “This is a bottle” is true if the object it refers to, this thing, is indeed a bottle. By pointing out that some people choose deliberately to be untruthful for unjust gain he also addresses the moral aspects of truth.

Oruka's survey of sages aimed to counter three negative claims regarding the philosophical status of indigenous African thought:

  1. Unlike Greek sages who used reason, African sages do not engage in philosophic thought.
  2. African sages are part of an oral tradition, whereas philosophic thought requires literacy.
  3. African traditions encourage unanimity regarding beliefs and values and discourage individual critical thought.

His reply to these claims has significantly shaped the discourse on Sage Philosophy. In what follows the criteria he proposed to determine what counts as Sage Philosophy will be considered in the light of his critique of the Eurocentric bias against African philosophic thought and the question of whether literacy is required.

2. The African Sage Tradition and Eurocentric Bias

First, Oruka was concerned about the picture created under colonialism that, while the sayings of numerous Greek sages such as Thales, Anaximander, Heraclitus, and other pre-Socratics, were regarded as “philosophical,” those of traditional African sages were not. This bias arises out of the implicit belief that philosophy is the privileged activity of certain races. He believed that this unjustified belief had further led to the image of philosophy as the restricted property of Greeks, or Europeans, and, even more exclusively, the property of white males. Partly concerned with exposing the falsehood of this Eurocentric attitude, he recognized that what had raised the apparently simple sayings of the pre-Socratics to the status of philosophy was the subsequent sustained commentaries by later philosophers. He maintained that the ideas expressed by indigenous African sages were no different from those by the earlier Greeks. When recorded later in books, the sayings of Greek sages came to be widely regarded as “philosophical,” and the people who produced them as “philosophers.” Given such a scenario, Oruka was led to wonder, why would the sayings of Akoko, or those of Chaungo, not be similarly regarded after they are committed to writing by a professional philosopher?

Oruka supports his comparison of indigenous African sages with the pre-Socratics by citing two methods that have contributed to the growth of philosophy in the West, beginning with its Greek roots. One direct method of using dialogues is exemplified in the early Platonic works. Socrates asks primary questions upon which the exposition of ideas by his interlocutor is based. Oruka viewed his own dialogues with the sages as an example of this practice in the African context. Socrates regarded himself as a “mid-wife” of sorts, because he merely helped those with the knowledge to bring it out. He brought out what was in each case really the property of his interlocutors, not his own. Oruka meant his dialogues, in similar fashion, to capture both this method and its outcome. He maintained that the sages he and his disciples interviewed were the owners of their own ideas. The Western-trained philosopher, he says, “plays the role of philosophical provocation” (Sage Philosophy, p. 47). The other method, exemplified in the later Platonic works, involves indirect engagement with the sayings of the sages through a commentary on their ideas — derived from these dialogues, or from general acquaintance with the sages' views. Oruka believed that, by these two methods, the growth of African philosophy can take place in a manner similar to the growth of Western philosophy.

3. Literacy and The Oral Tradition in Sage Philosophy

The influence of colonial bias against unwritten thought was also challenged by Oruka's project. By publishing his interviews with the sages he aimed to counter the second negative claim regarding the denigration of African thought, namely that “philosophy is and can only be a ‘written’ enterprise; and so a tradition without writing is incapabale of philosophy [and that any claim to the contrary] …is a non-scientific, mythological claim” (Sage Philosophy, p.xv). He insisted that there are African thinkers, not yet absorbed into the tradition of the written word, whose memories are, in terms of consistency and organization, as good as the information recorded in books (Sage Philosophy, pp. 49–50). Responding to adversaries, he cautioned that:

to argue like the critics, not just of Sage philosophy but of African philosophy generally have done that Africa is having a late start in philosophy just because we have no written records of her past philosophical activities is, wrongfully, to limit the sources from which we could detect traces of such activities (Sage Philosophy, p. 50).

Peter Bodunrin was particularly critical of Oruka's method of extracting Sage Philosophy. He argued that to show that there were people, like the indigenous sages, who were capable of philosophical thinking was one thing, but it was a completely different thing to show that there were African philosophers who have engaged in organized systematic reflections on the traditions of their people. Regarding Bodunrin's first objection, Oruka's response, as already indicated above, was that philosophers often work in response to other ideas, whether they are the ideas of other philosophers, or popular ideas in the philosopher's own setting. Oruka had a relatively longer response to Bodunrin's second objection. In another essay popularly associated with his name, Oruka identified four main trends to be constitutive of African philosophy, namely (i) African ethnophilosophy, (ii) African nationalist-ideological philosophy, (iii) professional African philosophy, and of course, (iv) the African Sage philosophy under consideration here. Not only do these trends show different approaches that African philosophers have adopted to unravel and systematically to expose the underlying principles on which different departments of African life are based, they also demonstrate that African philosophy is not limited or confined to the academic institutions.

Indeed, many African philosophers look far beyond the traditional philosophical texts for sources and subject matter of philosophical reflection. For example, while engaging in subtle analytic philosophical reflections, African philosophers incorporate with great ease narratives from everyday lives and from literature into their reflections of the philosophical implications of their cultural events. Oruka was especially wary of the sub-group among professional African philosophers whose position regarding African traditional modes of thought was analogous to European bias in denying reason to Africans in their traditional settings. It was this attitude, according to Oruka, that amounted to a claim that Africans lacked a tradition of organized systematic philosophical reflections on the thoughts, beliefs, and practices of their own people. He thought that this view was exemplified in its most eloquent and strongest form by Peter Bodunrin. In his (Oruka's) own estimation, Bodunrin had seriously underestimated the central point in the long tradition of Western scholarship, popularized by the works of Lévy-Bruhl, that denied Africans not only the existence of organized systematic philosophical reflection, but reason itself. Oruka thought that this view was rather absurd, for no society of humans can live for any reasonable amount of time, let alone making any advances in their own ways of seeing and doing things, if they do not have reason, or if the ideas and concepts upon which their cultures are built do not make sense. If, on the other hand, critics of African Sage philosophy based their refutation of the possibility of sage philosophy on the lack of written philosophical treatises, Oruka countered such a position by arguing that to exist as a philosopher it is not necessary that one's thoughts must be written, or that they must progress — meaning that they must be commented on or even be available to future generations. While systematicity is important to the structure and consistency of good thinking, neither it nor preservation of thought necessarily requires literacy. Preservation in particular, he thought, was done selectively by generations for divers emerging reasons and circumstances, and so was not, in and of itself, the measure of the philosophical quality of someone's thoughts. For just as thoughts can be expressed either in writing, or as unwritten oral reflections, e.g., sayings and argumentations of sages, so they may be preserved for a long time by sages, or quickly forgotten and cast into historically insignificant bits of a community's past, only to be remembered by the few whom they touched in some special way.

4. Ethnophilosophy, Unanimity and African Critical Thought

Although it had been used previously by other writers, the term “ethnophilosophy” acquired its notoriety in the work of the Beninois philosopher Paulin Hountondji (1970, 1983). Perhaps unaware that the term had been used earlier, Hountondji criticized the Belgian missionary, Placide Tempels' book, Bantu Philosophy (first French ed. 1945, and Eng. tr. 1959), as well as his disciples, among them the French philosopher and ethnographer Marcel Griaule, the Rwandais philosopher Alexis Kagame, and the Kenyan theologian John Mbiti, for casting African philosophy as an anonymous system of thought, without individual thinkers to claim or account for it. By the end of the 1960s, the positive reception in Anglophone Africa, not only of Tempels' Bantu Philosophy, but also John Mbiti's African Religions and Philosophy (1969) and Marcel Griaule's Conversations with Ogotemmêli that had recently been translated into English (1965), coincided with the rising tides of political and cultural nationalism throughout the continent.

The third negative claim Oruka aimed to challenge pertains to the philosophical status of indigenous African thought. Ethnophilosophy had falsely popularized the view that traditional Africa was a place of philosophical unanimity and that African traditions encouraged unanimity regarding beliefs and values. If this were true it would allow no room for individual thinkers like, say, Socrates or Descartes, with their own independent views on such matters. Oruka was concerned that African intellectuals were drawn into this false assumption regarding the intellectual inclination of African people, maintaining the belief that critique is absent from indigenous African thought. This situation was worsened by the new political movements of postindependence African nations where one-party political systems sprang up. By outlawing opposition politics as being both unAfrican and antinationalist, political leaders often appealed to this view of unanimity. The Sage Philosophy project objected to this claim regarding unanimity in Africa, which Oruka regarded as absurd, by presenting empirical evidence of the diversity of thought among indigenous thinkers. Oruka insisted that, while rulers everywhere will always crave unanimity, thinkers thrive in dialogue and diversity of opinion. He pointed out that Sage philosophy was about thinkers, not rulers.

Oruka's desire to distinguish Sage philosophy from ethnophilosophy was also in response to another false view, partly created by ethnophilosophy, that indigenous African thought is anonymous. An important charge against ethnophilosophy has been that, by simply presenting the teachings of African beliefs in the allegorical modes, the impression is created that indigenous African modes of thought are deeply grounded in their mythical representations of reality, thus leaving the philosophic ideas largely unexplained. With this in mind, Oruka's project aimed to counter two types of false perception of indigenous African thought. First, he separated the myths from the clearly thought out and logically valid philosophical ideas of indigenous individual thinkers to make clear what he frequently referred to as the “anthropological fogs” (Sage Philosophy, pp. xxi-xxix). Secondly, he contested the idea that a qualitative mental leap from myth is required for Africans to embrace philosophical thought. Such a view had been expressed by the Belgian philosopher Franz Crahay in a widely read article, “Le décollage conceptuel: conditions d'une philosophie bantoue” (1965). Although he was critical of ethnophilosophy, Hountondji was the first philosopher to distance himself from Crahay's position, arguing that local knowledge systems were already separate from myths, as no humans can live on myths. Moral principles, for example, would have to be abstract in character to be applicable in general terms beyond one person (Hountondji 1970). According to Wiredu (1996: 182ff), such independent and critical thinking was available in varying forms in Akan communities and was the basis of frequently protracted disputations among elders in search of a consensus regarding matters that required negotiations. Thus, contrary to the view that knowledge at the communal level was anonymous, Wiredu argues that it is precisely in regard to the importance of consensus on matters of common good that disputation and careful navigation through different opinions was not just considered to be crucial, but was put on transparent display until some form of consensus was attained. In other words, consensus was not imposed, but relentlessly pursued. Such important matters like just claims to different kinds of rights were not adjudicated without the input of those members of community who were well regarded for their independent opinions.

5. What counts as Sage Philosophy?

According to Oruka, Sage Philosophy is “the expressed thoughts of wise men and women in any given community and is a way of thinking and explaining the world that fluctuates between popular wisdom (well known communal maxims, aphorisms and general common sense truths) and didactic wisdom, an expounded wisdom and a rational thought of some given individuals within a community” (Sage Philosophy, p. 28). Oruka, however, had very definite ideas about who qualifies as a philosophic sage and how such persons are to be distinguished from other sages. When asked whether or not philosophy advances knowledge, Barasa is quoted as saying: “Yes. Being a rational method of inquiry into the real nature of things, philosophy is a means to re-examine knowledge and belief” (Sage Philosophy, p. 150). The tendency to express dissatisfaction with the status quo belief system of their communities is an important critical component and a criterion Oruka used to identify sages as philosophical. Dissatisfaction sometimes motivates the philosophic sage to advance the knowledge that everyone has by subjecting it to scrutiny in order to determine its validity and worth. While philosophic sages may still share with others some customary practices and beliefs, or aspects of them, unlike other members of their community, they emphasize rational explanations and justifications of courses of action. They owe greater loyalty to reason than to custom for its own sake. As a result, not only are sages often a source of new knowledge, but they are also a catalyst to change within their communities.

In the example cited above, Mbuya defines communalism in terms of a morality that appeals to the welfare of others as a guide to action. He indicates its goals, and limitations as a principle that aims at minimizing socio-economic disparity between the haves and the have-nots. On Oruka's view, not every member of society carries out these kind of elaborations and conceptual clarifications of the principles that underlie what the majority live at the pragmatic level only as custom. While he recognizes that there are other indigenous sages in African communities, he distinguishes these from philosophic sages such as Mbuya and Chaungo, who are committed to critical inquiry and to the rational grounding of values and beliefs. Other indigenous sages, who may be wise in some sense, but not critically oriented, act as repositories of the statements of the beliefs of their communities, which they have learned and can repeat, or teach, to others exactly as they are supposed to be remembered.

This lattter group is exemplified by Ogotemmêli, a sage from the Dogon community in present-day Mali. His teachings were transcribed and commented on by the French philosopher and ethnographer Marcel Griaule in the now classic text, Conversations with Ogotemmêli: Introduction to Dogon Religious Ideas (Eng. tr. 1965), one of the outstanding texts of indigenous African thought. Ogotemmêli presents the commonly shared knowledge of the Dogon community, including not only their very complex theories about the origin of the universe and the subsequent development of material and non-material entities in it, but also a startling astronomical system that points to the Dogon's pre-telescopic knowledge of the Sirius (A and B) and their paths across the skies. Yet, despite this pioneer scientific and mathematical genius, at no time throughout the entire presentation does one encounter Ogotemmêli as a thinker, only as the representative and narrator of the collective memory of his community. His own voice is submerged into a communal mode of expression. According to Oruka, the absence of any personal direct reflections on the issues at hand qualifies Ogotemmêli only as a folk sage. A folk sage is a highly intelligent and good narrator of traditionally imposed beliefs and myths. He, or she, may explain such beliefs and values with great detail and may even expound on the relation between the mythical representations and the lessons in and for society that they are intended to illustrate. But while the folk sage hardly veers off the narrative, by contrast, a philosophic sage is a person “of traditional African culture, capable of the critical, second-order type of thinking about the various problems of human life and nature; persons, that is, who subject beliefs that are traditionally taken for granted to independent rational reexamination and who are inclined to accept or reject such beliefs on the authority of reason rather than on the basis of a communal or religious consensus” (Sage Philosophy, pp. 5–6).

The onisegun, deliberately kept anonymous by Hallen and Sodipo for reasons of privacy, and who expound and elucidate the traditional thought of the Yoruba, are certainly wise and very knowledgeable people. On Oruka's criteria for philosophic sagacity, however, they too are only folk sages. They are like Ogotemmêli, whose presentation, however complex and amazing in details, is exactly what every wise Dogon person is expected to know (Sage Philosophy, pp. 9–10). Oruka distinguishes between folk and philosophic sages, in terms of those who pursue the rational grounding of beliefs and values, as opposed to those who merely narrate them as they appear in their commuity's belief systems.

W. V. O. Quine's indeterminacy thesis of radical translation presents a major difficulty for the explanations of the conceptual content and meaning of terms in Yoruba language provided by the onisegun to Hallen and Sodipo. Quine attacked the concept of universal propositions and meanings that are frequently assumed by translators to exist across all languages. This draws in question the practice of anthropologists studying African belief systems. Following Quine, Hallen argues that “Given the cumulative effects of the indeterminacy of translation between radically different languagaes, an alternative explanation for such inconsistencies could be that translators have recourse to contradiction because they, perhaps unwittingly, have not been able to arrive at a determinate or precise translation” (A Short History of African Philosophy, pp. 37–8). Failing to find in non-Western modes of thought precise translations of comparable rational expressions in their own languages, anthropologists hastened to conclude that the problem must lie with the non-Western modes of thought which appear to lack ways of accommodating rational expressions. Yet, Hallen and Sodipo's own conversations with the Yoruba sages illustrate what happens when one tries to translate, among others, the English term “know” into Yoruba. The outcome of their comparative analyses shows that our conceptual assumptions about reality are often tied to the natural languages we speak. To be fair, Hallen's and Sodipo's work is not a simple description of what the onisegun said. Rather, they attempt to tease out what was intended conceptually in a language translated as faithfully as possible into propositions which they contrast with comparable ones in English. Nonetheless, Oruka maintained that any such use of Western philosophical language to analyze indigenous African thought leads to the separation “between an insider in traditional African philosophy and the outsider analyzing or describing this philosophy in a language of Western thought. Given this, the two cannot really meaningfully express their thought to each other and it would be absurd to find that one can be an expert in the thought of the other” (Sage Philosophy, p. 15).


It is not entirely clear what Oruka believed ought to be the relationship between the indigenous philosophic sage and his or her Western-trained counterpart. What is clear from his remarks is that the use of Western philosophers, like Quine or Wittgenstein, for example, as tools for analyzing the conceptual content of African modes of thought has allowed some scholars to champion “what they term ‘African philosophy’ by using terminology given in ‘Western philosophy’. None, so far, has given an account of what is to be treated as the language of African philosophy” (Sage Philosophy, p. 15). On this point at least, Oruka seems to position himself away from philosophers such as Appiah, Wiredu, and Gyekye. He understood the work of professional philosophers to be distinct from that of the philosophic sages and expressed the wish that they could remain so, as a way of preserving traditions. This idea appears to be implied by his regret that “The tragedy for man is that the Western intellectual elite has, over the years, successfully imposed its own culture and philosophy over the masses. So, British philosophy, for example, is taken to be the texts of Lockes, Humes, Bacons, Russels, etc.” (Sage Philosophy, p. 16). Oruka's concern with the preservation of indigenous thought suggests that he desired to keep the professional school of philosophers separate from that of the philosophic sages to ensure the preservation of the intellectual integrity, not only of the sages, but of the African heritage as a whole. He was concerned that the language of African professional philosophers was too dependent on the Western conceptual lexicon and that its unchecked imposition on indigenous conceptual schemes might finally contribute to the demise of the latter.

Among African philosophers, Kwasi Wiredu is particularly sympathetic to Oruka's concerns. Writing on the need for conceptual decolonization in African philosophy, Wiredu claims that such a need would mean both “avoiding or reversing through a critical conceptual self-awareness the unexamined assimilation in our thought (that is, in the thought of contemporary African philosophers) of the conceptual frameworks embedded in the foreign philosophical traditions that have had impact on African life and thought…[and] exploiting as much as is judicious the resources of our own indigenous conceptual schemes in our philosophical meditations on even the most technical problems of contemporary philosophy” (Cultural Universals and Particulars, p. 136). At the same time, Wiredu agrees with other philosophers like Appiah and Gyekye in insisting that while the beliefs, proverbs, and customs of African cultures should be included in the philosophical reflections of the professional, such cultural elements of folk knowledge also must be subjected to critical analysis and evaluation because, “There is no pretense…that recourse to the African vernacular must result in instantaneous philosophic revelation” (Cultural Universals and Particulars, p. 138).

Oruka believed that professional African philosophers could interact with their sagacious counterparts, provided there was sufficient room for each to flourish separately. This idea suggests that he desired to expand the location of legitimate philosophical activity beyond the institutional confines of the academy, which he considered to be intricately connected to the colonial legacy. It is in this regard that the idea of African Sage philosophy has provided an important intervention in the development of contemporary African philosophy, addressing many crucial issues African philosophers continue to face in the wider context of postcolonial cultural inquiry, of which philosophy is only a part. Gayatri Chakravorty Spivak in A Critique of Postcolonial Reason: Toward a History of a Vanishing Present (1999) has suggested that the self-awareness stage in postcolonial theory is largely over and that the formerly colonized cultures are settling down to utilizing their respective cultural reservoirs without significant attention to the need to reclaim their indigenous voices, and without minimizing the need for a continued and sustained awareness of the ever-present Eurocentric impositions. This orientation is displayed, for example, in Wiredu's independent, but comparative, analyses of Western and African concepts, whose widely-debated epistemological position that “truth is nothing but opinion,” hinges on the contrast between the objectivist implications of the claim “I know that” in English and the non-objectivist implications in the Akan language.

Along with Wiredu, Hallen and Sodipo also hold that very complex philosophical views are already signaled by many sayings in African languages, and wait to be teased out through careful analysis and interpretation. Although Oruka's idea of the sages as philosophically savvy in their own languages raises methodical questions as to whether sage philosophy is the property of the professional philosopher, or of the indigenous wise person, and only teased out through the prompting of a professional philosopher, Hallen, Sodipo and Wiredu agree with his insistence that the distinguishing marks of African philosophy emerge precisely out of analytical involvement by Western-trained philosophers, who raise questions regarding the conceptual underpinnings of indigenous beliefs, values, and languages, and critically examine their meaning and implications. They propose, on this basis, to accommodate both indigenous sages, and Western-trained professionals, as philosophers.


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