Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Aristotle's Psychology

A Question about the Metaphysics of Souls

In Section 10 of his exceptionally clear entry on Aristotle's Metaphysics in this encyclopedia, S. Marc Cohen briefly recapitulates the lively debate among Aristotelian commentators regarding the status of particular forms in Aristotle. As Cohen notes, some things Aristotle says in his Metaphysics suggest that forms, as substances, must be particulars; other things he says suggest that forms, as objects of knowledge, must be universals. If nothing can be both a universal and a particular, then something must give: if Aristotle is to avoid contradicting himself on a topic of such central importance to his entire metaphysical system, then one set of textual data will need to be subordinated to the other. Cohen argues with considerable force that it is particularity which must give way: forms are universals and, though they are substances, nothing said by Aristotle entails that they are therefore particulars.

As Cohen rightly reports, most of the data for this debate is drawn from Aristotle's Metaphysics. Consequently, any fully defensible argument on behalf of particular forms will need to engage that data. Moreover, any such argument will also now need to address Cohen's lucid deployment of that data. Naturally, a discussion of Aristotle's psychology is not the place to conduct such a discussion.

Still, a discussion of Aristotle's psychology is just the place to reflect briefly on the metaphysics of souls, because hylomorphism finds its most nuanced and engaging expression in the metaphysics of living beings. To the extent that this sort of discussion also has repercussions regarding the problem of particular forms, it is also worth conducting any such inquiry with an eye to the metaphysics of forms as such. This is especially so since some things Aristotle says in the Metaphysics suggest that he restricts substantiality to living beings, or, more weakly, that he regards living beings as paradigmatic substances (Metaphysics viii 2, 1043a4-5; vii 17, 1041b21-3). More to the point, there is a simple argument drawn from the hylomorphic account of souls and bodies in De Anima which tells in favor of particular forms. Although this argument does nothing to refute the arguments and interpretations provided by Cohen and other detractors of particular forms, it does provide some reason to wonder whether their arguments should be revisited. The argument is this: (i) the soul is a form; (ii) the soul is something particular; therefore, (iii) there are particular forms, namely souls.

As an interpretation of Aristotle, the first premise of this argument cannot be in doubt. Here is what he says: ‘It is necessary, then, that the soul must be a substance as the form of a natural body having life in potentiality’ (De Anima ii 1, 412a19-21). So Aristotle regards the soul as a substance and as a form. It therefore follows that he endorses the first premise (i) of our simple argument.

That leaves only the second premise (ii), that souls are particulars, which detractors of particular forms are consequently constrained to reject. There seem to be but two ways of doing so: by treating souls as universals or by denying that a distinction between universals and particulars is mutually exclusive and exhaustive. Neither alternative looks especially attractive either in fact or as an interpretation of Aristotle. (It should be said, however, that the second alternative has found some surprisingly capable defenders among Aristotle's exegetes, at least as applied to forms generally, if not to souls more narrowly.)

Of course, some of the direct linguistic evidence regarding the soul's particularity is subject to the same limitations as those appropriately noted by Cohen. If, for example, it is implied that the soul is a tode ti (De Anima ii 1, 412a7-8), then this may require its being some this, i.e. some particular thing, or perhaps merely this something or other, i.e. something falling under a sortal. Since universals too fall under sortals, perhaps as far as this linguistic data is concerned, souls are conceivably universals. Parallel cases may be made about other comparable locutions.

It seems somehow unlikely, however, that when Aristotle claims that Socrates can be identified with either a compound or a soul that he means to imply that ‘Socrates’ can be used to name a universal (Metaphysics vii 11, 1037a7; cf. Generation of Animals iv 2-3, 767a20-768b1). Moreover, given the roles ascribed to it by Aristotle, there is some additional philosophical reason for supposing that the soul is particular. If the soul is, for instance, the efficient cause of motion (De Anima i 1, 403a24-b9; ii 4, 415b8, Partibus Animalium i 1, 641a17-b10), then it seems responsible for the motion of an individual body in a specific place and time. Much the same can be said for perception and thinking, where the perceptual and intellectual activities of Socrates seem to be the activities of an individual, situated in a peculiar place and time, and explained not by the presence of a uniform universal, but by dint of there being individual psychological faculties deployed on particular occasions. In these ways, it seems natural to understand Socrates' soul to be numerically and qualitatively distinct from Callias' soul. So it also seems natural to think of their souls as particulars, rather than as a single universal twice betokened.

These brief considerations are, of course, in no way intended to prove that Aristotle commits himself to the existence of particular forms. They are, however, intended to provide some prima facie evidence for that claim by showing what must be denied if we are to understand him as resisting such a conclusion. In short, those who find no commitment to particular forms in Aristotle must also find in him no commitment to particular souls.