Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Aristotle's Psychology


Aristotle sometimes recognizes as a distinct capacity, on par with perception and mind, imagination (phantasia) (De Anima iii 3, 414b33-415a3). Although he does not discuss it at length, or even characterize it intrinsically in any detailed way, Aristotle does take pains to distinguish it from both perception and mind. In a brief discussion dedicated to imagination (De Anima iii 3), Aristotle identifies it as “that in virtue of which an image occurs in us” (De Anima iii 3, 428aa1-2), where this is evidently given a broad range of application to the activities involved in thoughts, dreams, and memories. Aristotle is, however, mainly concerned to distinguish imagination from perception and mind. He distinguishes it from perception on a host of grounds, including: (i) imagination produces images when there is no perception, as in dreams; (ii) imagination is lacking in some lower animals, even though they have perception, which shows that imagination and perception are not even co-extensive; and (iii) perception is, Aristotle claims, always true, whereas imagination can be false, false even in fantastic ways (De Anima iii 3, 428a5-16). He also denies that imagination can be identified with mind or belief, or any combination of belief and perception (De Anima iii 3, 428a16-b10), even though it comes about through sense perception (De Anima iii 3, 429a1-2; De Insomniis 1, 459a17). The suggestion, then, is that imagination is a faculty in humans and most other animals which produces, stores, and recalls the images used in a variety of cognitive activities, including those which motivate and guide action (De Anima iii 3, 429a4-7, De Memoria 1, 450a22-25).

Because he tends to treat imagination pictographically (De Anima iii 3, 429a2-4; cf. De Sensu 1, 437a3-17; 3, 439b6), Aristotle seems to regard the images used in cognitive processes as representations best thought of on the model of copies or likenesses of external objects. This much he holds in common with many other empirically oriented cognitive psychologists. Typically he will suggest, in this vein, that thought requires images, both genetically and concurrently, so that “whenever one contemplates, one necessarily at the same time contemplates in images” (De Anima iii 8, 432a8-9, 431a16-17; De Memoria 1, 449b31-450a1). His suggestions in this direction may seem unfortunate, since for a broad range of thoughts, images, construed naturally and narrowly as pictorial representations, seem unnecessary or even plainly irrelevant. (It is hard to fathom, e.g., what image corresponds to the thought that gerunds make for ungainly syntax -- still less is it clear what grounds could compel one to agree that some image or other must accompany it). Perhaps, though, his remarks should be tempered by the recognition that Aristotle accepts the existence of a god whose activity is exhausted by thinking, but whose thinking is not plausibly regarded as imagistic (Metaphysics xii 7,1072b26-30). If that is so, Aristotle could not accept the thesis that for any episode of thought t, necessarily t is or is directed upon a pictorial image. Still, Aristotle clearly expects images, so construed, to play a central or even indispensable role in human cognition.