Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Tue Jan 5, 1999; substantive revision Mon Aug 16, 2004

An artifact may be defined as an object that has been intentionally made or produced for a certain purpose.  Often the word ‘artifact’ is used in a more restricted sense to refer to simple, hand-made objects (for example, tools) which represent a particular culture. (This might be termed the “archaeological sense” of the word.) In experimental science, the expression ‘artifact’ is sometimes used to refer to experimental results which are not manifestations of the natural phenomena under investigation, but are due to the particular experimental arrangement.

1. Artifacts, Works, and Authors

Aristotle divided things into those that “exist by nature” and “products of art” or “artificial products” (Physics, Book II, 192b). Artifacts are contrasted to natural objects; they are products of human actions. Consequently an artifact has necessarily a maker or an author. Using the word ‘author’ in a somewhat generalized sense, we may thus adopt the principle:

(A1) If an object is an artifact, it has an author.

It may be suggested that the maker of an artifact need not be a human being. For example, in a recent experiment a New Caledonian crow called Betty bent a piece of straight wire into a hook and used it to lift a bucket containing food from a vertical pipe (Weir at al., 2002). Betty's hook may be regarded as a simple artifact made for the purpose of gaining access to the food bucket.

Can (A1) be strengthened to an equivalence? Experimental artifacts are unintended products of the experimenter's plans and actions, but otherwise the word is usually applied only to intended products: not all new objects whose existence is a result of an agent's productive activity are artifacts. If we restrict the application of the expression ‘author’ and ‘authorship’ in a similar way, we may strengthen (A1) to

(A2) An object is an artifact if and only if it has an author.

According to (A2), artifact and author are correlative concepts (Hilpinen 1993, 156-157). It should be observed that (A2) allows the possibility that an artifact has more than one author; such objects may be termed “collective artifacts”. (A2) makes the concept of artifact equivalent to that of work (as a product as opposed to activity); for example, according to (A2), all works of art, including musical and literary works, should be called “artifacts” insofar as they have authors. In aesthetics, the expression ‘artifact’ has been used in this wide sense when it has been argued, as some philosophers have done, that works of art are necessarily artifacts (Davies 1991, 120-141). Ontologically, an artifact can be a concrete particular object such as the Eiffel Tower, a type (a type object) which has or can have many instances (for example, a paper clip or Nikolai Gogol's Dead Souls), an instance of a type (a particular paper clip), or an abstract object, for example, an artificial language. An artifact kind identified by a common description or concept can include several subtypes or species; for example, there are different paper clip types for which their authors (that is, their inventors) obtained separate patents; these fall under the more general artifact kind ‘paper clip’. Commonly used artifact kinds (pens, paper clips, computers, etc.) evolve over time as different authors and designers try to improve earlier artifact types or adapt them to new conditions and purposes. (See Petroski 1992a, 1992b.)

The instances of a type artifact are artifacts in a narrow sense, that is, concrete physical particulars. If we distinguish the concept of work from that of an artifact and say, for example, that an author can create a work only by making some artifact (for example, to write a novel, an author has to produce a manuscript), the expression ‘artifact’ is used in this narrow (or primary) sense.

An object which is an artifact in a narrow sense is usually made from some pre-existing object or objects by successive intentional modifications. This activity is called work. This feature of artifacts is reflected in the dictionary definition of an artifact as an object “made by human art and workmanship, an artificial product”. The production of an artifact can take different forms. In the simplest cases, for example, in the case of Betty's hook mentioned above, an artifact is made by modifying a natural object or another artifact (e.g., a piece of metal wire), whereas complex artifacts are usually made by constructing them from parts which may be other artifacts or natural objects.

When a person intends to make an object, his productive intention has as its content some description of the intended object: the agent intends to make an object of a certain kind. An author's intention “ties” to an artifact a number of predicates which determine the intended character of the object. The existence and some of the properties of the artifact are dependent on its intended character. This is expressed by the following Dependence Condition (Hilpinen 1992, 65):

(DEP) The existence and some of the properties of an artifact depend on an author's intention to make an object of certain kind.

The causal tie between an artifact and its intended character -- or, strictly speaking, between an artifact and its author's productive intention -- is constituted by an author's actions, that is, by his work on the object. The actual properties of an artifact constitute its actual character. The success of an author's productive activity depends on the degree of fit or agreement between the intended and the actual character of the object. The actual character of an artifact is of course always much richer than the intended character: the artifact fits an author's intentions if and only if the former includes the latter. At least one of the descriptions included in the intended character should presumably be a sortal or “substantival” description which determines the identity of the object and the criteria by which it can be distinguished from other objects (cf. Hilpinen 1992, 61). For example, ‘painting’ and ‘chair’ are sortal descriptions, but ‘red’ (or ‘red thing’) is not. It is possible to give a definite answer to the question of how many chairs there are in a given room, but not to the question of how many red things there are in the room: as Gottlob Frege (1884/1953, 66) pointed out, the description ‘red thing’ does not identify objects in a determinate manner. Artifact kinds can be identified by count nouns (such as ‘chair’) or by mass terms (e.g., ‘paper’ or ‘whisky’). Moreover, artifact sortals can be essentially or nonessentially (accidentally) artifactual. For example, ‘motor controller’ and ‘paper clip’ are essentially artifactual terms, but a path through a forest can be intentionally made (an artificial path) or it can be an unintended product of people's habit of following the same route when they walk through the forest. Languages and words can be natural entities (without identifiable creators) or artifacts which have been intentionally designed for a certain purpose. In fact, many “natural” languages, especially their written forms, can be regarded as artifacts. For example, the creation of New Norwegian (Landsmål or Nynorsk) in the mid-19th century was mainly due to the efforts of the Norwegian poet Ivar Aasen, who presented it as an alternative to the official Norwegian language of the time (Riksmål, Dano-Norwegian). Aasen's proposals were later modified and supplemented by many other authors who contributed to the development of New Norwegian. (See Haugen 1966, 33-45.)

According to condition (DEP), a person is an author of an artifact only if the existence and the character of the artifact depend on that person's productive intentions. Such dependence admits of degrees; thus it is possible to distinguish degrees of authorship. The 13th century philosopher St. Bonaventure distinguished four ways in which a person can make a book: A scribe (scriptor) simply copies the works of others, without making any changes or additions. A compiler (compilator) combines the texts of other authors without adding any new material to the text, whereas a commentator “writes both others' work and his own, but with others' work in the principal place, adding his own for purposes of explanation.” Finally, an author (auctor), in the strict sense, “writes both his own work and others' but his own work in a principal place adding others' for the purposes of confirmation.” (Eisenstein 1979, 121-22; Woodmansee 1992, 281.) A scribe who intentionally copies a text produces a new artifact, a new copy of the text, and is without doubt an author of that copy: the existence and the character of the copy depends on the scribe's intentions. The scribe intends the copy to have a certain textual character, but that intention is determined by and dependent on the productive intentions of the original author of the text. As regards the textual character of the copy, the scribe represents a minimal (or zero) degree of authorship. The textual intentions of a compiler are also dependent on the intentions of the authors whose texts the compiler is joining together, but the way in which the original works are combined is up to the compiler. A compiler and a commentator represent intermediate degrees of authorship between a scribe and an author in the proper or strict sense of the word.

2. On the Characterization of Artifacts

Artificial things can be characterized in terms of functions and goals (Simon 1996, 5), and artifacts are often identified by sortal descriptions which refer to their intended function (e.g., ‘hammer’). This need not always be the case: for example, ‘painting’ is an artifact sortal which is not derived from the purpose or function of the object, but from the way in which it has been produced. An object that has been made for a purpose F may be termed ‘an F-object’. The properties of an F-object can be divided into two classes: (i) those relevant to the functioning of the object as an F-object, and (ii) the properties irrelevant to the purpose F. The former properties may be termed the significant properties of the object (or its F-significant properties); they may also be called the “good-making properties” of the object. For example, the weight of a hammer is one of its significant features, but its color is usually not. In addition to an identifying (sortal) description F, the content of an author's productive intention includes the properties that he regards as significant for the purpose F. The latter properties depend on this purpose (or purposes); thus the intended character of an artifact is not simply a collection of predicates, but has a hierarchical structure. In many cases an object is expected to serve many different purposes; thus the description F may be quite complex. If an artifact is evaluated on the basis of its suitability for a certain purpose, its goodness is a form of what G. H. von Wright (1963, 19-22) has called instrumental goodness.

Many artifacts are characterized by means of their intended function and use, and some parts of complex artifacts are artifacts (we might call them “sub-artifacts”) which have been designed to serve a certain function in a given principal artifact. Simons and Dement (1996, 264) have called such parts the functional components of an artifact. The functional components of an artifact need not coincide with what Simons and Dement have called its assembly components, that is, the parts from which the artifact has been assembled. For example, the braking system can be regarded as a functional component of a car, but it is not an assembly component; it consists of several assembly components located in different parts of the car (op. cit., 263).

An author's productive intention is often expressed by cognitive artifacts which show the character of the intended artifact and the way it should be constructed, for example, a drawing, a diagram, or a model of the artifact, together with a list of parts and materials and a set of instructions (a precept) for the production process. Such representations are especially important in the case of collectively produced complex artifacts. They are necessary for successful communication among the authors of the artifact and for the coordination of their productive actions. (For different representations of complex artifacts, see Simons and Dement 1996, 266-75.)

3. The Evaluation of Artifacts

An author's productive activity may be evaluated on the basis of the relationships among the intended character of an artifact, its actual character, and a purpose F (Hilpinen 1995, 140):

(E1) The degree of fit or agreement between the intended character and the actual character of an object,

(E2) The degree of fit between the intended character of an object and the purpose F, in other words, the suitability of an object of the intended kind for the purpose F,


(E3) The degree of fit between the actual character of an object and the purpose F, that is, the suitability of an artifact for F.

(E1) determines whether an artifact is a successful embodiment of the author's intentions, (E2) determines whether the character that the author intends to give to an artifact is suitable for the purpose F, and (E3) tells whether the author has succeeded in making an object that is in fact suitable for the purpose F. The study of artifacts (qua artifacts) is intrinsically evaluative, since viewing an object as an artifact means viewing it in the light of intentions and purposes.

The purpose F on which the evaluation of an artifact and its design are based need not be the purpose that the author had in mind; it can be any purpose for which the artifact might be used. The direction of evaluation may be reversed so that the maker or owner of an artifact tries to find new uses for it.

In addition, we should distinguish the actual character of an artifact from the author's conception of it. If the author's conception of an object agrees with its intended character, the artifact is subjectively satisfactory for the author, but it may fail to fit the author's productive intentions if he has a mistaken conception of it.

If the author's productive activity is successful, the character of a completed artifact both depends on and agrees with his productive intentions so that it can be regarded as an embodiment of these intentions. If the actual character of an object does not agree with its intended character, it is unsatisfactory from the author's point of view, and if the author's conception of an object does not agree with its intended character, the artifact is subjectively unsatisfactory from the author's point of view. In the latter case the author has a reason to try to improve the object until it satisfies his productive intentions. A change in an object which improves the fit between its actual and intended character is, from the standpoint of the author's intentions, a progressive change.

It seems plausible to regard an object as a proper artifact only if its maker's productive activity has some degree of success, for example, satisfies some sortal predicate included in his productive intention. This condition may be termed the Success Condition:

(SUC) An object is an artifact made by an author only if it satisfies some sortal description included in the author's productive intention.

If an agent's activity fails in every respect, the agent does not accomplish anything, but produces only “scrap”. (Cf. Hilpinen 1993, 160; Bloom 1996, 10; Thomasson 2003, 598-99.) Even if the object does not fit the author's productive intention, but he accepts it as a satisfactory realization of his intention, it may be regarded as a proper artifact. This is expressed by the following Acceptance Condition:

(ACC) An object is an artifact made by an author only if the author accepts it as satisfying some sortal description included in his productive intention.

If an artifact has several authors, the Acceptance Condition should hold for at least one of them. According to the Acceptance Condition, an object is an artifact only if its maker regards it as such, that is, accepts it as a product of his intentional activity. The Success Condition concerns the fit between the actual and the intended character of an object; the Acceptance Condition the fit between the author's conception of an object and its intended character. In this context it should be observed that the author's intention may change during his productive activity. In the above conditions, ‘productive intention’ should be regarded as referring to the content of the author's final intentions concerning the artifact.

In some cases the satisfaction of the Acceptance Condition is sufficient for the satisfaction of the Success Condition in the sense that if an author has produced an object with an intention to make an object of kind K and has accepted it as a K-object, it cannot fail to be a K-object. When a person signs a document, his acceptance of an illegible scrawl as his signature is sufficient to make it his signature. (However, on a later occasion he can of course make a mistake and fail to recognize the signature as his own, or believe that a signature written earlier by a forger is genuine.)

Randall Dipert's theory of artifacts includes the condition that an artifact (in the strict sense) should be intended by its author to be recognized as having been intentionally modified for a certain purpose (Dipert 1993, 29-31). This is a plausible condition, since an F-object can presumably be a good F-object only if its potential users recognize it as such. However, this recognizability should not be taken to mean general recognizability: a mechanical shark used in making an adventure film is an artifact, but its authors do not wish the audience to recognize it as such, on the contrary; the condition of recognizability presumably applies only the persons who are using it in the making of the film.

The conditions listed above provide a partial characterization of the concept of artifact. We might say that different intentionally modified or constructed objects exhibit different degrees of artifactuality, depending on how well they satisfy these conditions.

4. Works of Art

As was mentioned above, artifactuality is often regarded as a defining characteristic of works of art (Stephen Davies 1991, 120-141); for example, this is an essential condition in George Dickie's (1984, 63) analysis, according to which a work of art is an “artifact of a kind created to be presented to an artworld public”. The condition of artifactuality is plausible only if the concept of artifact is understood in a wide sense in which intentionally created events and processes (e.g., performances) and works which have instances (for example, musical and literary works) are regarded as artifacts. According to condition (A2), the condition of artifactuality in this sense is equivalent to the requirement that a work of art should have an author. Some philosophers of art have rejected the condition of artifactuality, using instances of “driftwood art” and analogous examples as counterexamples. According to condition (A2), this view has the seemingly paradoxical consequence that a work of art need not be a product of anyone's work and need not have an author. Other philosophers have responded to such examples by extending the concept of artifactuality in such a way that the presentation of a natural object as an object of aesthetic appreciation counts as an “intentional modification” required for artifactuality (cf. Dickie 1984/1997, 45-46). If the expression ‘artifact’ is used in a sufficiently wide sense, the condition of artifactuality clearly holds for artworks, but it is equally obvious that not all works of art (or works in general) are artifacts in the narrow sense of the word. In aesthetic evaluation and criticism, however, they are treated as if they were artifacts. Artifacts in the wide sense form an ontologically heterogeneous collection: some of them have instances (literary works and musical compositions), others are singular objects (e.g., paintings), and there are also abstract artifacts, for example, fictional characters, which have authors but are neither concrete particulars nor have such particulars as instances. As Amie Thomasson (1999, xii, 117-120) has pointed out, abstract artifacts do not fit the traditional division of entities into concrete physical particulars and ideal abstracta.


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