Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Jean Baudrillard

1. For my earlier takes on Baudrillard, see Kellner 1989a; Best and Kellner 1991; Kellner 1994 and 1995, Chapter 8; and Best and Kellner 1997, Chapter 3. Other books on Baudrillard include Frankovits 1984; Gane 1991, 1992, and 1993; Stearns and Chaloupka 1992; Rojek and Turner 1993; Genosko 1994; and Butler 1999.

2. The year in parentheses here refers to the English translation of his work. By now, most of Baudrillard has been translated into English; see the bibliographies in Kellner 1989a and Butler 1999 for more detailed listing of his works than the bibliography above that cites his major works. A detailed online bibliography can be found in the Jean Baudrillard Bibliography in the Other Internet Resources section.

3. Semiology refers to studies of language and culture as a system of signs inaugurated by Swiss linguist Ferdinand de Saussure; on Baudrillard and semiology, see Gary Genosko, Baudrillard and Signs. Signification Ablaze. London: Routledge, 1994.

4. Guy Debord and a group of associates who formed a “Situationist International” called for the construction of situations, through which they meant alternative and oppositional modes of culture, behavior, and politics. They were extremely influential in the 1960s, influencing the May 1968 rebellions in France and diverse forms of cultural revolution throughout the world. They are experiencing an aftermath in many Internet sites devoted to their work and various cultural projects that replicate it; see, for example, the link to Situationist International in the Other Internet Resources section. For more on Debord and the Situationist International, see Best and Kellner 1997, and also Steven Best and Douglas Kellner, ‘Debord and the Postmodern Turn: New Stages of the Spectacle,’ Substance #90 (1999): 129-156.

5. In Simulacra and Simulation, Baudrillard writes: “To dissimulate is to feign not to have what one has. To simulate is to feign to have what one hasn't. One implies a presence, the other an absence. But the matter is more complicated, since to simulate is not simply to feign: ”Someone who feigns an illness can simply go to bed and pretend he is ill. Someone who simulates an illness produces in himself some of the symptoms“ (Littre). Thus, feigning or dissimulating leaves the reality principle intact: the difference is always clear, it is only masked; whereas simulation threatens the difference between ”true“ and ”false“, between ”real“ and ”imaginary“. Since the simulator produces ”true“ symptoms, is he or she ill or not? The simulator cannot be treated objectively either as ill, or as not ill.” (1994a, 3).

6. On Baudrillard and feminism, see Keith Goshorn, “Valorizing ‘the Feminine’ while Rejecting feminism? – Baudrillard's Feminist Provocations” in Kellner 1994: 257-291 and Victoria Grace, Baudrillard's Challenge: A Feminist Reading. London: Routledge, 2000).

7. To those who would deny that Baudrillard is a postmodern theorist and has nothing to do with the discourse of the postmodern (e.g. Gane 1991 and 1993), one might note that Baudrillard uses the concept of the postmodern in his books of the 1990s (Baudrillard 1994b: 23, 27, 31, 34, 36, 107, passim; and Baudrillard 1996a: 36, 70 passim). The Perfect Crime (Baudrillard 1996b) does not use the discourse of the postmodern per se, but makes ample use of his classic categories of simulation, hyperreality, and implosion to elucidate a new virtual order opposed to the previous order of reality, the murder of which is “the perfect crime” (see 16, 83, 125, 128, passim). And in the conference “Jean Baudrillard und die Kunste: Eine Hommage zu seinem 75. Geburtstag,” Baudrillard mentioned several times that radical transformations in art and culture were linked to fundamental “anthropological changes in the human being,” ruptures that which the term “postmodern” has been generally used to signify.

8. While many commentators have remarked on Baudrillard's obvious Manicheanism and nihilism, Dr. Jonathan Smith argues that skepticism is also a key aspect of Baudrillard's thought; see Smith 2004 (Other Internet Resources). Baudrillard's thought does contain a curious mixture of Manicheanism and Gnosticism that identifies with the principle of evil mixed with an ironic skepticism. The result of this mixture is a unique form of cynicism and nihilism which plays with philosophical and other categories, debunks standard philosophical theorizing and offers provocative alternatives. Yet Dr. Smith seems to miss the dimension of play and irony in Baudrillard's work, as well as his valorization of writing and the symbolic, in which writing and not forms of thought or philosophy are privileged as (see, for example, the section on “Poetic Transference” in Impossible Exchange (2001, pp. 111ff). Smith also goes astray by claiming that “pure appearance” is the key affirmative concept of Baudrillard's thought, whereas in fact he valorizes a whole set of categories delineating the accursed and despised poles of fundamental dichotomies such as appearance, illusion, meaninglessness, and evil).

9. See Jacques Derrida, On Grammatology (Baltimore and London: John Hopkins University Press, 1976) and T.W. Adorno, Negative Dialectics (London, Routledge, 1973).

10. See also on the collapse of Communism, see D. Kellner, “The End of Orthodox Marxism,” in Marxism in the Postmodern Age, edited by Jack Amarglio, et al. New York, Guilford Press: 1995: 33-41 and “The Obsolescence of Marxism?,” in Whither Marxism?, edited by Bernd Magnus and Stephen Cullenberg. London and New York: Routledge, 1995: 3-30.

11. For systematic studies of recent media spectacle, see Kellner 2003a and on the September 11 terror spectacle, see Kellner 2003b.

12. Baudrillard begrudgingly acknowledges in a later writing that the fall of the Berlin wall “signified something closer to an enormous repentance on the part of history” (Baudrillard 2000: 39). Political writings of the period are collected in Screened Out (Baudrillard 2002).

13. Initially, Bush spoke of a “war against terrorism” and then began expanding the concept to a “war on terror,” an obviously infinite project with no conceivable end or terminus.

14. Jean Baudrillard, cited in Goldblatt 2001 (Other Internet Resources). Goldblatt reproduces the anti-French discourse of the right that was prevalent at the time.

15. Baudrillard, ‘This is the Fourth World War’, Der Spiegel, Number 3, 2002; see Baudrillard 2004 (Other Internet Resources) for a translation into English.

16. Jean Baudrillard, “La violence du Mondial,” in Power Inferno (Paris: Galilee, 2002), pp. 63-83; see Baudrillard 2002 (Other Internet Resources) for a translation into English.

17. Baudrillard, The Spirit of Terrorism, p. 32.

18. In other words, democratization, rights, and justice may be part of a highly contradictory and contested globalization. See D. Kellner, “Theorizing Globalization,” Sociological Theory, Vol. 20, Nr. 3 (November 2002): 285-305.

19. The inauguration in 2003 of a International Journal of Baudrillard Studies, however, indicates that there is a global coterie of Baudrillard scholars producing continued publications and reflections on his work; see the link to this journal in the Other Internet Resources.

20. Baudrillard distanced himself from the film and its vision of virtual reality in an interview by Aude Lancelin in Le Nouvel Observateur, June 2003; for a translation into English, see Baudrillard 2003 in the Other Internet Resources.