Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Simone de Beauvoir

First published Tue Aug 17, 2004

There are some thinkers who are, from the very beginning, unambiguously identified as philosophers (e.g., Plato). There are others whose philosophical place is forever contested (e.g., Nietzsche); and there are those who have gradually won the right to be admitted into the philosophical fold. Simone de Beauvoir is one of these belatedly acknowledged philosophers. Identifying herself as an author rather than as a philosopher and calling herself the midwife of Sartre's existential ethics rather than a thinker in her own right, Beauvoir's place in philosophy has only recently been secured.

1. Recognizing Beauvoir

Some have found Beauvoir's exclusion from the domain of philosophy more than a matter of taking Beauvoir at her word. They attribute it to a narrow view of philosophy which, rejecting the method of the metaphysical novel, ignored the philosophical issues raised, explored and argued in Beauvoir's literary works. Between those who did not challenge Beauvoir's self portrait, those who did not accept her understanding of philosophy and thereby ignored the philosophical implications of her fiction, and those who missed the unique signature of her philosophical essays, Beauvoir the philosopher remained a lady in waiting.

Some have argued that the belated admission of Beauvoir into the ranks of philosophers is a matter of sexism on two counts. The first concerns the fact that Beauvoir was a woman. Her philosophical writings were read as echoes of Sartre rather than explored for their own contributions because it was only "natural" to think of a woman as a disciple of her male companion. The second concerns the fact that she wrote about women. The Second Sex, recognized as one of the hundred most important works of the twentieth century, would not be counted as philosophy because it dealt with sex, hardly a burning philosophical issue (so it was said).

This encyclopedia entry shows how much things have changed. Long overdue, Beauvoir's recognition as a philosopher is both secure and fragile. Secure in the fact that we can no longer discuss French existentialism without attending to the works of Simone de Beauvoir. Fragile in that Beauvoir's philosophical legacy will be entangled with the fate of existentialism and feminism and with emerging judgments regarding the viability of a feminism that invokes existentialist categories, and of an existentialism that attends to the questions of embodied subjectivity through the lens of the question of woman/women. Fragile in that though it has never been possible to understand the trajectory of feminist philosophy without considering the contributions of Simone de Beauvoir, the philosophical credentials of the work of feminist theorists, also only recently acquired, has yet to be adequately secured.

2. Situating Beauvoir

Simone de Beauvoir was born on January 9,1908. She died seventy eight years later, on April 14, 1986. At the time of her death she was honored as a crucial figure in the struggle for women's rights, and as an eminent writer, having won the Prix Goncourt, the prestigious French literary award, for her novel The Mandarins. She was also famous for being the life long companion of Jean Paul Sartre. Active in the French intellectual scene all of her life, and a central player in the philosophical debates of the times both in her role as an author of philosophical essays, novels, plays, memoirs, travel diaries and newspaper articles, and as an editor of Les Temps moderns, Beauvoir was not considered a philosopher in her own right at the time of her death.

Beauvoir would have appreciated the fact that her current philosophical status reflects our changed understanding of the domain of philosophy and the changed situation of women, for one of her crucial contributions to the philosophical lexicon is the idea of situated freedom--that our capacity for agency and meaning- making and whether or not we are identified as agents and meaning- makers is constrained, though never determined, by the conditions of our situation. She would also have appreciated the fact that while her work was instrumental in effecting these changes, their lasting effect is a tribute to the ways in which others have taken up her philosophical and feminist legacies; for one of her crucial contributions to our ethical and political vocabularies is the concept of the appeal--that the success of our projects depends on the extent to which they are adopted by others

Beauvoir's 1946 essay Literature and the Metaphysical Essay, and later 1965 and 1966 essays Que Peut la Littérature? And Mon Expérience d' Ecrivian were part of a phenomenological and existential critique of the philosophical status quo. This critique, influenced by both Husserl and Heidegger, focused on the significance of lived experience and on the ways in which the meanings of the world are revealed in language. Heidegger turned to the language of poetry for this revelation. Beauvoir, Camus and Sartre turned to the language of the novel and drama. They looked to Husserl to theorize their turn to these discourses by insisting on grounding their theoretical analyses on the concrete particulars of lived experience. They looked to Heidegger to challenge the privileged position of abstract discourses. For Beauvoir, however, the turn to literature carried ethical and political as well as philosophical implications. It allowed her to explore the limits of the appeal (the activity of calling on others to take up one's political projects); to portray the temptations of violence; to enact her existential ethic of freedom, responsibility, joy and generosity, and to examine the intimacies and complexities of our relationships with others.

Beauvoir's challenge to the philosophical status quo was part of an evolving movement. Her challenge to the patriarchal status quo was more dramatic. It was an event. Not at first, however, for at its publication The Second Sex was regarded more as an affront to sexual decency than a political indictment of patriarchy or a phenomenological account of the meaning of "woman." That group of women known as second wave feminists understood what the first readers missed. The Second Sex focused their attention, their sense of injustice and their demands for social, political, and personal transformation. The Second Sex remains a contentious book. No longer considered sexually scandalous, its analyses of patriarchy and its proposed antidotes to women's domination are still debated. What is not contested, however, is the fact that feminism as we know it is grounded in that seminal text.

As The Second Sex changed women's situation, Beauvoir's voice was resituated. With regard to the feminist movement, she herself was responsible for the change. After having rejected feminist affiliations, Beauvoir declared herself a feminist in a 1972 interview in le Novel Observateur and joined other Marxist feminists in founding the journal Questions féministes. With regard to the philosophical field it took the efforts of others for her voice to find its place. These efforts began as a rescue mission mediated by directing attention to the influences on Beauvoir's thinking. The point of those interested in rescuing Beauvoir from being eclipsed by Sartre was not to establish that she was an original thinker without precedent but to show how she, like Sartre and the other existentialists, was influenced by her philosophical heritage and contemporaries, and to examine how she, like her contemporaries, reworked her philosophical legacies and situation in ways that reflected her unique insights. To fully appreciate this we need to be aware of the fact that Beauvoir's graduate thesis was on Leibniz; that her reading of Hegel was influenced by the interpretations of Kojève; that she was introduced to Husserl and Heidegger by her teacher Baruzi; that Marx and Descartes were familiar figures in her philosophical vocabulary; and that Bergson was an early influence on her thinking.

3. She Came to Stay : Freedom and Violence

Though Beauvoir's first philosophical essay was Pyrrhus and Cinéas (1944) many of her interpreters identify She Came to Stay (1943) as her inaugural philosophical foray. It is a clear example of what she calls the metaphysical novel, and, given the letters between Sartre and Beauvoir and Beauvoir's diaries of that period (published in the 1980s), clear evidence for the assertion that the issues of the other, bad faith and desire were of concern to both Beauvoir and Sartre and that each was developing their own assessment of our singular existential condition and collective existential condition. She Came to Stay is packed with philosophical reflections - reflections on our relationship to time, to each other, to ourselves. These reflections are never, however, systematized, argued for or brought to closure. They are lived in the concrete, ambiguously triangulated lives of Pierre, Xavière and Françoise. Opening with a quote from Hegel "Each conscience seeks the death of the other," and ending with Françoise's murder of Xavière, which Beauvoir narrates as an act in which Françoise confronts her solitude and announces her freedom, the novel does not necessarily confirm Hegel's claim; for the point of the murder was not to eliminate the other per se but to destroy a particular other, Xavière, the other who threatened to leave Françoise without the other she loved, Pierre. Existential ambiguity trumps Hegelian clarity. The issues raised in this first novel, however, the ambiguity regarding the responsibilities and limits of freedom, the legitimacy of violence, the tension between our experience of ourselves as solitary and intwined with others, and the question of the bad faith and existentially faithful relationship to time will pervade Beauvoir's subsequent writings.

4. Pyrrhus and Cinéas : Radical Freedom and the Other

Pyrrhus and Cinéas published one year after She Came To Stay is Beauvoir's first philosophical essay. It addresses such fundamental ethical and political issues as: What are the criteria of ethical action? How can I distinguish ethical from unethical political projects? What are the principles of ethical relationships? Can violence ever be justified? It examines these questions from an existential-phenomenological perspective. Beginning from the situation of the concrete existing individual, it provides an analysis of our human condition that takes account of our unique and particular subjectivity, our embeddedness in the world, and our essential relatedness to each other. Though not feminist in any identifiable sense, Pyrrhus and Cinéas raises such compelling feminist questions as: Under what conditions, if any, may I speak for/ in the name of another?

After opening Pyrrhus and Cinéas with a staged conversation, Beauvoir divides its ethical reflections into two parts. Part one moves from the ontological truth: I am a finite freedom whose endings are always and necessarily beginnings; to the existential questions: How can I desire to be what I am? How can live my finitude with passion?; in order to turn to the moral and political issues: What actions express the truth and passion of our condition? How can I act in such a way as to create the conditions that sustain and support the humanity of human beings? Concluding Part I with the observation that: "A man alone in the world would be paralyzed by...the vanity of all of his goals. But man is not alone in the world" (Pyrrhus and Cinéas, 42), Beauvoir opens Part II with the properly ethical question: What is my relation to the other? Here the analysis is dominated by the problem created by her insistence on the radical nature of our freedom. According to Beauvoir, the other, as free, is immune to my power. Whatever I do, if as master I exploit the slave, or as executioner I hang the murderer, I cannot violate the other in the inner depths of their free subjectivity. Substituting the inner-outer difference for the Cartesian mind-body distinction, Beauvoir argues that we can never directly touch the other in the heart of their freedom. Our relationships are either superficial, engaging only the outer surface of each other's being, or mediated through our common commitment to a shared goal or value. As free I am saved from the dangers of intimacy.

This line of argument would seem to lead either to benign Stoic conclusions of mutual indifference, or to finding tyrants and reigns of terror no threat to individual freedom. Beauvoir does not let it drift in these directions. Instead she uses the inner-outer distinction, and the idea that I need others to take up my projects if they are to have a future, to introduce the ideas of the appeal and risk. Developing the concept of freedom as transcendence (that is, as the movement toward an open future and indeterminate possibilities that constitutes us as choosing rather than determined beings), Beauvoir identifies the essence of freedom with the uncertainty and risk of our actions. To be free is to be radically contingent. As free, I bring value and meaning to a world without value and meaning of its own. I cannot, however, support these values alone. They will find a home in the world only if others embrace them; only if I persuade others to make my values theirs.

As radically free I need the other. I need to be able to appeal to others to join me in my projects. The knot of the ethical problem lies here: How can I, a radically free being who is existentially severed from all other human freedoms, transcend the isolations of freedom to create a community of allies? Given the necessity of appealing to the other's freedom, under what conditions is such an appeal possible?

In answering these questions Beauvoir turns the inner-outer distinction to her advantage as she develops the concept of situated freedom. Though I can neither act for another nor directly influence their freedom, I must, Beauvoir argues, accept responsibility for the fact that my actions produce the conditions within which the other acts. However irrelevant my conduct may be for the other's inner freedom, it concerns mine. I am, Beauvoir writes, "the face" of the other's misery. I am the facticity of their situation (Pyrrhus and Cinéas, 58). Pursuing this difference between my power to effect the other's freedom and my responsibility for their situation, and exploring the conditions under which my appeal to the other can/will be heard, Beauvoir determines that there are two conditions of the appeal. First, I must be allowed to call to the other and must struggle against those who would silence me. Second, there must be others who can respond to my call. The first condition may be purely political. The second is political material. Only equals, Beauvoir argues, can hear or respond to my call. Only those who are not consumed by the struggle for survival, only those who exist in the material conditions of freedom, health, leisure and security can become my allies in the struggle against injustice. The first rule of justice, therefore, is to work for a world where the political and material conditions of the appeal are secured.

Violence is not ruled out. Given that Beauvoir has argued that we can never reach the other in the depths of their freedom, she cannot call it evil. She does not, however, endorse it. Neither does she envision a future without conflict. The fact that we are differently situated and engage in the work of transcendence from different historical, economic, sexed, and race positions, ensures that some of us will always be an obstacle to another's freedom. We are, Beauvoir writes, "condemned to violence" (Pyrrhus and Cinéas, 77). As neither evil nor avoidable, violence, she argues, is "the mark of a failure which nothing can offset" (Pyrrhus and Cinéas, 77). It is the tragedy of the human condition.

Thus the argument of Pyrrhus and Cinéas ends on an uneasy note. As ethical, we are obliged to work for the conditions of material and political equality. In calling on others to take up our projects and give them (our projects) a future, we are precluded from forcing them (others) to become our allies. We are enjoined to appeal to their freedom. Where persuasion fails, however, we are permitted the recourse to violence. The ambiguity of our being as subjects of and objects in the world is lived in this dilemma of violence and justice. Becoming lucid about the meaning of freedom, we learn to live our freedom by accepting its finitude and contingency, its risks and its failures.

5. The Ethics of Ambiguity : Bad Faith, The Appeal, The Artist

The Ethics of Ambiguity, published in 1947, reconsiders Pyrrhus and Cinéas's idea of invulnerable freedom. Dropping the distinction between the inner and outer domains of freedom and deploying a unique understanding of consciousness as an intentional activity, Beauvoir now finds that I can be alienated from my freedom. Like She Came To Stay which bears the imprint of Hegel's account of the fight to the death that sets the stage for the master-slave dialectic, and Pyrrhus and Cinéas which works through the Cartesian implications of our existential situation, The Ethics of Ambiguity redeploys concepts of canonical philosophical figures. Here Beauvoir takes up the phenomenologies of Husserl and Hegel to provide an analysis of intersubjectivity that accepts the singularity of the existing individual without allowing that singularity to justify an epistemological solipsism, an existential isolationism, or an ethical egoism. The Hegel drawn on here is the Hegel who resolves the inequalities of the master slave relationship through the justice of mutual recognition. The Husserl appealed to is the Husserl who introduced Beauvoir to the thesis of intentionality.

The Ethics of Ambiguity opens with an account of intentionality which designates the meaning-disclosing, meaning-making and meaning-desiring activities of consciousness as both insistent and ambiguous--insistent in that they are spontaneous and unstoppable; ambiguous in that they preclude any possibility of self unification or closure. Beauvoir describes the intentionality of consciousness as operating in two ways. First there is the activity of wanting to disclose the meaning of being, of discovering the meanings of the world. Second there is the activity of bringing meaning to the world, of wanting to be the author of the world's meaning. In the first mode of activity consciousness expresses its freedom to discover meaning. In the second, it exists as the freedom of bringing meaning into the world. Beauvoir identifies each of these intentionalities of freedom with a mood: the first with the mood of joy, the second with the dual moods of hope and domination. Whether the second intentionality becomes the ground of projects of liberation or exploitation depends on which mood prevails.

Describing consciousness as ambiguous, Beauvoir identifies our ambiguity with the idea of failure. We can never fulfill our passion for meaning in either of its intentional expressions; that is, we will never succeed in fully revealing the meaning of the world, and never fulfill our desire to impress our meaning on the world. These truths of intentionality set the criteria of Beauvoir's ethics. Finding that ethical systems and absolutes, insofar as they claim to give final answers to our ethical dilemmas and authoritarian justifications for our actions, offer dangerous consolations for our failure to be the source of the world's meaning or being, Beauvoir rejects them in favor of ethical projects that acknowledge our limits and recognize the future as open. From this perspective her ethics of ambiguity might be characterized as an ethic of existential hope.

Beauvoir's Ethics of Ambiguity is a secular humanism which rejects both the ideas of God and Humanity. However different they may be in content, both ideas provide an already given ground of and justification for our actions. They allow us to abdicate our responsibility for creating the conditions of our existence and to evade our ambiguity. Whether it is called the age of the Messiah or the classless society, these appeals to a utopian destiny encourage us to think in terms of ends which justify means. They invite us to sacrifice the present for the future. They are the stuff of inquisitions, imperialisms, gulags, and concentration camps. They pervert our relationship to time. Insisting that the ethical concerns our existence as temporal intersubjective beings, Beauvoir argues that as ethical we are obliged work for a just future in ways that affirm the value of those who exist today.

Beauvoir rejects the familiar charge against humanism made famous by Dostoevsky's Grand Inquisitor: "If God is dead everything is permitted." As she sees it, without God to pardon us for our "sins" we are totally and inexcusably responsible for our actions. Dostoevsky was mistaken. The problem of the secular humanist is not that of license, it is the problem of the "we." Can separate existing individuals be bound to each other? Can each one forge laws for all? The Ethics of Ambiguity insists that we can. It does this by arguing that evil resides in the denial of freedom (mine and others); that we are responsible for ensuring the existence of the conditions of freedom (the material conditions of a minimal standard of living and the political conditions of freedom); and that I can neither affirm nor live my freedom without also affirming the freedom of others.

Beauvoir's argument for ethical freedom proceeds concretely by analyzing the ways in which the adult's existence as a moral agent is conditioned by the fact that we all begin as children who find themselves embedded in a world already endowed with meaning. We are born into the condition which Beauvoir calls the "serious world." This is a world of ready made values and established authorities. This is a world where obedience is demanded. This child's world, however, is neither alienating nor stifling, for as children we are not yet ready for the responsibilities of freedom and are being prepared for these responsibilities by the benign indifference of adults to our imaginary worlds of play. Free to play, the child develops its creative capacities, its meaning-making abilities without being held responsible for the worlds it brings into being. Considering these two dimensions of the child's life, its imaginative freedom and freedom from responsibility, Beauvoir determines that the child lives a metaphysically privileged existence; for children, she says, experience the joys but not the anxieties of freedom. Beauvoir describes children as mystified. By this she means that they believe that the foundations of the world are secure and that their place in the world is naturally given and unchangeable. Beauvoir marks adolescence as the end of this idyllic era. It is the time of moral decision. Emerging into the world of adults, we are now called upon to renounce the serious world, to reject the mystifications of childhood, and to take responsibility for our choices.

All of us pass through the age of adolescence, not all of us take up its ethical demands. The fact of our initial dependency has moral implications; for it predisposes us to the temptations of bad faith, strategies by which we deny our existential freedom and our moral responsibility, and sets our desire in the direction of a nostalgia for those lost Halcyon days. Looking to return to the security of that metaphysically privileged time, some of us evade the responsibilities of freedom by choosing to remain children, that is, to live under the authority of others.

Beauvoir does not object to the mystifications of childhood. She acknowledges that they may be necessary for the child's survival. To treat adults as children, however, is immoral, and evil. To choose to remain a child is an act of bad faith. Whether or not we live a moral life depends on the material conditions of our situation and on our response to the ambiguities and failures of intentionality. If we are exploited, we cannot be accused of bad faith. If we are not, we are accountable for our response to the experience of freedom. Attending to the joys of freedom, we take up projects of justice. Vulnerable to the anxieties of failure and fearful of the responsibilities of freedom, we succumb to unjustifiable mystifications which justify my passivity and the exploitation of others.

Beauvoir embodies the complexity of these ethical choices in the figures of the sub-man, the serious man, the nihilist, the adventurer, the passionate man, the critical thinker and the artist-writer. The point of delineating these human types is several fold. It is a way of distinguishing between two types of unethical positions. One type, portrayed in the portraits of the sub-man and the serious man, refuses to recognize the experience of freedom. The other type, depicted in the pictures of the nihilist, the adventurer, and the maniacal passionate man, misreads the meanings of freedom. There is however, the passion of the generous man. Here, Beauvoir tells us, passion is linked with generosity, specifically the generosity of recognizing the other's difference and protecting it from becoming an object of another's will. This passion is the ground of the ethical life. It is the source of the distinct ethical position of the artist-writer.

Having described the different ways in which freedom is evaded or misused, Beauvoir establishes the difference between ontological and ethical freedom. She shows us that acknowledging our freedom is a necessary but not a sufficient condition for ethical action. To meet the conditions of the ethical, freedom must be used properly. It must, according to Beauvoir, embrace the ties that bind me to others and take up the appeal - an act whereby I call on others, in their freedom, to join me in bringing certain values, projects conditions into being. The artist-writer embodies the ethical ideal in several respects. Her writing expresses the subjective passion that grounds the ethical life. It provides a view of the world in its material complexities-- complexities which may alienate me from my freedom or open me to my freedom. It provides visions of the future which as open and contingent avoid the mystifications that validate sacrificing the present for the future. It establishes the freedom of the other as the condition of mine, for the life of the artist-writer, like the ethical life requires the participation of others.

The Ethics of Ambiguity does not avoid the question of violence. Unlike Pyrrhus and Cinéas, however, it does not save freedom from its ravages. Arguing that violence is sometimes necessary, she uses the example of the Nazi soldier, and arguing that to liberate the oppressed we may have to destroy the tyrants. Beauvoir recognizes that though it may be justified by the circumstances, violence is an assault on the other's freedom (however misused) and as such marks our failure to respect the "we" of our humanity. The Ethics of Ambiguity provides an analysis of our existential-ethical situation that joins a hard headed realism (violence is a fact of our condition) with demanding requirements. It is unique, however, in aligning this realism and these requirements, with the passion of generosity and a mood of joy. However counter intuitive it sounds, Beauvoir aligns seriousness with an evasion of freedom. Recalling her account of the spontaneous freedoms of intentionality we see how the thread of the argument leads to this conclusion.

6. The Second Sex : Woman As Other

Looking back at The Ethics of Ambiguity, from the vantage point of her memoir The Force of Circumstance, Beauvoir criticizes it for being too abstract. She does not repudiate the arguments of her text, but finds that it erred in trying to define morality independent of a social context. The Second Sex made be read as correcting this error -- as reworking and extending the analyses of The Ethics of Ambiguity. It marks the beginning of Beauvoir's commitment to the concrete. It also marks the point at which Beauvoir's thinking enters the arena of feminist philosophy.

Where Beauvoir's earlier works blurred the boundaries set up to separate the genres of philosophy and literature, her later writings blur the distinctions said to exist between the personal, the political and the philosophical. Now, Beauvoir takes herself, her situation, her embodiment and the situations and embodiments of those close to her, as the subjects of her philosophical reflections. Where The Ethics of Ambiguity conjured up images of ethical and unethical figures to make its arguments tangible, The Second Sex grounds its analyses in Beauvoir's experiences as a woman and in the concrete situations of other real women. Where The Ethics of Ambiguity speaks of mystification in a general sense, The Second Sex speaks of the specific ways in which the natural and social sciences and the European literary, social, political and religious traditions have created a mystified world where impossible and conflicting ideals of femininity produce an ideology of women's "natural" inferiority to justify patriarchal dominations.

Beauvoir's self criticism suggests that her later works mark a break with her earlier writings. We should, however, resist the temptation to take this notion of discontinuity too far. Rather than thinking in terms of breaks it is more fruitful to see The Second Sex as a more radical commitment to the phenomenological insight that it is as embodied beings that we engage the world. Our access to, awareness of, and possibilities for world engagement cannot be considered absent consideration of the body.

Before The Second Sex, the sexed body was not an object of phenomenological investigation. Beauvoir changed that. Her argument for sexual equality works in two directions. First, it exposes the ways in which patriarchy exploits the sexual difference to create systems of inequality. Second, it exposes as a patriarchal ploy Plato's seemingly liberatory argument in The Republic, that takes the premise that sex is an accidental quality to the conclusion that women and men are equally qualified to become members of the guardian class. So long as the standard of equality is the male body, the discriminatory sexual difference remains in play.

The Second Sex argues against the either/or frame of the woman question(either women and men are equal or they are different). It argues for women's equality, while insisting on the reality of the sexual difference. Beauvoir finds it unjust and immoral to use the sexual difference to exploit women. She finds it un-phenomenological to ignore it. As a phenomenologist she is obliged to examine the ways in which women experience their bodies and to determine how these experiences are co-determined by what phenomenology calls the everyday attitude (the common sense assumptions we unreflectively bring to our experience). As a feminist phenomenologist assessing the meanings of the lived female body and exploring the ways these meanings affect our place in the world, she brackets these assumptions to investigate the ways in which they corrupt our experiences. For example, it is assumed that women are the weaker sex. What, we must ask, is the ground of this assumption? What criteria of strength are used? Upper body power? Average body size? Is there a reason to not consider longevity a sign of strength? Using this criterion, would women still be considered the weaker sex? A bit of reflection exposes the biases of the criteria used to support this supposedly obvious fact and transforms it from a fact to a questionable assumption. Once we begin, it only takes a moment to for other so called facts to fall to the side of "common sense" in the phenomenological sense.

From a feminist perspective what is perhaps the most famous line of The Second Sex, "One is not born but becomes a woman" (The Second Sex, 267) introduces what has come to be called the sex-gender distinction. Whether or not Beauvoir understood herself to be inaugurating this distinction, whether or not she followed this distinction to its logical/radical conclusions, or whether or not radical conclusions are justified are currently matters of feminist debate. What is not a matter of dispute is that Beauvoir's The Second Sex gave us the vocabulary for analyzing the social constructions of femininity and the structure for critiquing these constructions. From a phenomenological perspective this most famous line of The Second Sex pursues the first rule of phenomenology: suspend judgments, identify your assumptions, treat them as prejudices and put them aside; do not bring them back into play until they have been validated by experience.

Taken within the context of its contemporary philosophical scene, The Second Sex was a phenomenological analysis waiting to happen. Whether or not it required a woman phenomenologist to discover the effects of sex on the lived body's experience cannot be said. That it was a woman who taught us to bracket the assumption that the lived body's sex was accidental to its lived relations, positions, engagements, etc. is a matter of history. What was a phenomenological break through was used in The Second Sex as a liberatory tool; for by attending to the ways in which patriarchal structures used the sexual difference to deprive women of their "can do" bodies, Beauvoir's phenomenology provided the criteria for declaring them oppressive. Taken within the context of the feminist movement, The Second Sex was an event. It opened the way for the consciousness-raising that characterized second wave feminism, it validated women's experiences of injustice, it provided a program for liberation. What from the existential-phenomenological perspective was a detailed analysis of the lived body and an ethical and political indictment of the ways in which patriarchy alienated women from their embodied capacities, was, from the feminist perspective, also an appeal--an analysis (both concrete and theoretical) that called on women to take up the cause of their liberation.

Several concepts are crucial to the argument of The Second Sex. The concept of the Other is introduced early in the text and drives the entire analysis. It has also become a critical concept in many theories that analyze the situation of marginalized people. Beauvoir will use it again in her last major work, The Coming of Age, to structure her critique of the ways in which the elderly are "othered" by society.

Beauvoir bases her idea of the Other on Hegel's account of the master-slave dialectic. Instead of the terms "master" and "slave," however, she uses the terms "Subject" and "Other." The Subject is the absolute. The Other is the inessential. Unlike Hegel who universalized this dialectic, Beauvoir distinguishes the dialectic of exploitation between historically constituted Subjects and Others from the exploitation that ensues when the Subject is Man and the Other is Woman. In the first case the Other experiences his oppression as a communal reality. He is part of an oppressed group. Here, the oppressed Other may call on the resources of a common history and a shared abusive situation to assert his subjectivity and demand recognition and reciprocity.

The situation of women is like the condition of the Hegelian Other in that men, like the Hegelian Master, identify themselves as the Subject, the absolute human type, and, measuring women by this standard of the human, identify them as inferior. Women's so called inadequacies are established as justification for positioning them as the Other and for treating them accordingly. Unlike the Hegelian Other, however, women are unable to identify the origin of their otherness. They cannot call on the bond of a shared history to reestablish their lost status as Subjects. Further, dispersed among the world of men, they identify themselves with the status of their oppressors (e.g., as white or black women, as working class or middle class women, as Muslim, Christian, Jewish, Buddhist or Hindu women ) rather than with each other. They lack the solidarity and resources of the Hegelian Other for organizing themselves into a "we" that demands equality. Finally, their conflict with men is ambiguous. According to Beauvoir, women and men exist in a "primordial Mitsein" There is a unique bond between this Subject and Other. In contesting their status as inessential, women must discover their "we" and take account of the Mitsein. The category of the Inessential Other designates the unique situation of women as the ambiguous Other of men. Unlike the Other of the master-slave dialectic, women are not positioned to rebel. As Inessential Others, women's routes to subjectivity and recognition cannot follow the Hegelian script. (Second Sex, xix-xxii)

This attention to what Beauvoir, borrowing from Heidegger, calls a "primordial Mitsein" may be why an appeal to violence as sometimes necessary for the pursuit of justice similar to the one voiced in The Ethics of Ambiguity is absent from The Second Sex. Often criticized as a mark of Beauvoir's heterosexism, this remark (among others) is not made in ignorance of lesbian sexuality and is not a rejection of non-heterosexual sexualities. It is a recognition of the present state of affairs where heterosexuality dominates. If patriarchy is to be dismantled, according to Beauvoir, we will have to understand how heterosexuality works and learn how to undermine its alienations. To Beauvoir's way of thinking, however, the institutional alienations of heterosexuality ought not be confused with the erotics of heterosexual desire. Thus "primordial Mitsein" must be taken into account: not only is it responsible for women's isolation and inability to identify a common history, it is also responsible for the value and relationship that Beauvoir calls the "bond," a situation specific articulation of the relationship of the appeal developed in The Ethics of Ambiguity.

The ways in which Beauvoir's Second Sex deploys existential and Marxist categories to alert us to the unique complexities of women's situation is best captured in a brief but packed sentence early in the text. It reads, "Thus woman may fail to lay claim to the status of subject because she lacks definite resources, because she feels the necessary bond that ties her to man regardless of reciprocity, and because she is often very well pleased with her role as the Other" (Second Sex, xxiv-xxv). This phenomenological-existential statement needs to be read in the context of Beauvoir's ethical-political question, "How can a human being in a woman's situation attain fulfillment?" (Second Sex, xxxiv).

Between the statement and the question we discover that the ethical-political issue of fulfillment does not concern a woman's happiness. Happiness may be chosen or accepted in exchange for the deprivations of freedom. Coming from The Ethics of Ambiguity we know why. As others, women are returned to the metaphysically privileged world of the child. They experience the bad faith happiness of not being responsible for themselves, of not having to make consequential choices. From this existential perspective women may be said to be complicitious in their subjugation. But this is not the whole story. If women are happy as the other, it may be because this is the only avenue of happiness open to them given their situation. Such a situation in which she lacks definite resources for establishing herself as a subject is not of her making. It is both material and ideological. Materially it concerns her economic dependence on men. Ideologically it concerns the myth of woman which naturalizes her institutionalized inferior status. Beauvoir's existential charge of bad faith must be situated within her Marxist analyses of social, economic and cultural structures. The assertion that woman feels her necessary bond with man regardless of reciprocity, however, escapes existential and Marxist categories. It is crucial to Beauvoir's analysis of women's condition and draws on the notion of the appeal developed in The Ethics of Ambiguity. In making an appeal to others to join me in my pursuit of justice I validate myself and my values. Given that my appeal must be an appeal to the other in their freedom, I must allow for the fact that the other may reject it. When this happens, I must ( assuming that the rejection is not a threat to the ground value of freedom) recognize the other's freedom and affirm the bond of humanity that ties us to each other. In the case of women, Beauvoir notes, this aspect of the appeal (the affirmation of the bond between us) dominates. She does not approve of the way in which women allow it to eclipse the requirement that they be recognized as free subjects, but she does alert us to the fact that recognition in itself is not the full story of the ethical relationship. To demand recognition without regard for the bond of humanity is unethical. It is the position of the Subject as master.

Between the statement and the question the issue of women's exploitation and liberation is determined to be historical, and therefore amenable to change, and existential, and therefore our responsibility to change. "Our" here refers to women. It is not a matter of appealing to men to give women their freedom, but a matter of women discovering their solidarity, rejecting the bad faith temptations of happiness, and discovering the pleasures of freedom. Further, though Beauvoir alerts us to the tensions and conflicts that this will create between men and women, she does not envision a permanent war of the sexes. Here her Hegelian-Marxist optimism prevails. Men will (ultimately) respond to the feminist appeal.

The last chapters of The Second Sex, "The Independent Woman" and the Conclusion speak of the current (1947) status of women's situation--what has changed and what remains to be done. Without ignoring the importance of women's gaining the right to vote and without dismissing the necessity of women attaining economic independence, Beauvoir finds these liberal and Marxist solutions to women's situation inadequate. They ignore the effects of women's socialization (the subject of volume two of The Second Sex), and of the ways in which the norm of masculinity remains the standard of the human. The liberated woman must free herself from two shackles: one is the idea that to be independent she must be like men and the other is her socialization in passivity which makes her adverse to risking herself for her ideas/ideals. Attentive to this current state of affairs, and to the phenomenology of the body, Beauvoir sets two prerequisites for liberation. First, women must be socialized to engage the world. Second, they must be allowed to discover the unique ways in which their embodiment engages the world. In short, the myth of woman must be destroyed. So long as it prevails, economic and political advances will fall short of the goal of liberation. Speaking for the sexual difference Beauvoir notes that dismantling the myth of woman is not a recipe for an androgynous future. Given the realities of embodiment, that there will be sexual differences. Unlike today, however, these differences will not ground the difference between a Subject and his inessential Other.

The goal of liberation, according to Beauvoir, is our mutual recognition of each other as free and as other. She finds one situation in which this mutual recognition (sometimes) exists today, the intimate heterosexual erotic encounter. Speaking of this intimacy she writes, "The dimension of the relation of the other still exists; but the fact is that alterity has no longer a hostile implication" (The Second Sex, 448). Why? Because lovers experience themselves and each other ambiguously, that is as both subjects and objects of erotic desire rather than as delineated according to institutionalized positions of man and woman. In Beauvoir's words, "The erotic experience is one that most poignantly discloses to human beings the ambiguity of the condition; in it they are aware of themselves as flesh and as spirit, as the other and as the subject" (The Second Sex, 449). The concept of ambiguity, developed abstractly in The Ethics of Ambiguity, is embodied in The Second Sex where it is identified as a crucial piece of the prescription for transcending the oppressions of patriarchy.

7. Must We Burn Sade? : Freedom and the Flesh

We are a long way away from Pyrrhus and Cinéas where Beauvoir declared our freedom immune from assault. In that early work, our freedom insulated us from the risks of intimacy. In The Second Sex, avoiding the risks of intimacy remains possible, but now this avoidance is identified as a mark of our moral failure to live the ambiguity of our condition. Beauvoir's essay "Must We Burn Sade?" (1951, 1952) written in response to a request to write an introduction to Sade's Justine, details the effects Beauvoir's changed position on the relationship between freedom and intimacy has on her ethical reflections. The central ethical question: "the problem of the true relation between man and man" remains unchanged. Indeed what interests Beauvoir about Sade is that, "[he] posed the problem of the Other in its extremist terms; in his excesses, man-as-transcendence and man-as-object achieve a dramatic confrontation." What has changed is Beauvoir's understanding of the drama of intersubjectivity. Marking this change, this essay also marks a return to the question of the responsibility of the artist raised in The Ethics of Ambiguity.

Must we Burn Sade? identifies the Marquis's decision to write as an existential project, an authentic ethics, and a politics of rebellion. Crediting Sade with uncovering the despotic secrets of the political machine and recognizing his utopian appeal to freedom, Beauvoir accuses Sade of perverting the meaning of our individuated and situated freedom. He was, according to her, a great moralist who endorsed an unsatisfactory ethics.

Sade is Beauvoir's Janus-faced ally. She does not refute his claim that cruelty establishes a relationship between the self and the other. Sade is correct. Cruelty reveals us to each other in the particularities and ambiguities of our conscious and fleshed existence. The tyrant and victim, Beauvoir tells us, are a genuine couple. They are united by the bonds of the flesh and freedom.

Beauvoir does not dispute Sade's validations of the flesh and freedom. She admires his phenomenological point of departure. This is the source of his ethics of authenticity. His descriptions of the powers of cruelty and the meaning of torture, however, are incomplete and therefore inadequate. Insofar as his descriptions account for the powers of cruelty, they allow him to mount an effective critique of our social, political and personal hypocrisies. Insofar as they do not attend to the perversions of freedom and the flesh that cruelty exploits, they fail to offer a legitimate understanding of our intersubjective lives.

In the end, Sade was mislead (which does not mean that he was innocent). He mistook power for freedom and misunderstood the meanings of the erotic. In his fascination with the conflict between consciousness and the flesh, Sade exposed the contradiction of the sadistic enterprise. The contradiction, according to Beauvoir is this: attempting to lose himself in the pleasures of the flesh and in this way to experience both the ambiguity of his being as consciousness made flesh (or flesh made consciousness) and the reality of his being for and with others, Sade substitutes the spectacle for the lived experience and accepts counterfeit transactions of domination and assimilation/incorporation for genuine relationships of reciprocity and gratuitous generosity.

Centering his life in the erotic, Sade missed the truth of the erotic event. This truth, Beauvoir tells us, can only be found by those who abandon themselves to the risks of emotional intoxication. Living this intoxication we discover the ways in which the body turned flesh dissolves all arguments against the immediacy of our bonds with each other and grounds an ethic of the appeal, risk and mutual vulnerability.

Between the early Pyrrhus and Cinéas and the later "Must We burn Sade?" we discern the impact of what might be called Beauvoir's phenomenological turn to the body. Once she abandons the idea that our freedom, as absolutely internal, is immune from an assault by the other, and accepts the radical vulnerability of our lived embodiment, questions of violence and desire cannot be severed from the question of our fundamental humanity or questions of ethics and justice. In condemning Sade for his perversion of the erotic, Beauvoir also faults him as an artist. Though she criticizes him for being a technically poor writer, the heart of her criticism is ethical not aesthetic. Sade, according to Beauvoir, violated his obligations as an author. Instead of revealing the world to us in its promise and possibilities; instead of appealing to us to work for justice, he took refuge in the imaginary and developed metaphysical justifications for suffering and cruelty. In the end Beauvoir accuses Sade of being the serious man described in her Ethics of Ambiguity.

8. Djamila Boupacha : The Concrete Appeal

In 1962, Beauvoir and Gisile Halimi co-authored the story of Djamila Boupacha, an Algerian girl accused of being a terrorist and tortured by the French during the French Algerian War. This book may be read as an extension of Beauvoir's critique of the Marquis de Sade. Instead of fleeing from the horrors of the real into the safety of the imaginary, Beauvoir takes up her responsibility as an author to expose and confront realities that the state would rather hide. Her purpose in writing is concrete and political. The book is both a protest and an appeal. Countering Sade, Beauvoir and Halimi show that the truth of torture lies in the unjustifiable politics of abusive power. In this case the appeal succeeds. The book secures a French trial for Boupacha where she is acquitted and the actions of French government are condemned.

9. All Men are Mortal, A Very Easy Death, Adieux: A Farewell to Sartre : Finitude, Passion, and the Body

The ways in which the phenomenological turn to the body becomes increasingly important in Beauvoir's work, and the ways in which this turn to the body remains sensitive to the materialities of our situated freedom and the power of the category of the other, may be traced in Beauvoir's attention to the question of our finite existential condition. This question is raised early in her 1946 novel, All Men Are Mortal, the story of Fosca, a man who escapes the human condition of finitude. His desire for immortality, however, is, by Beauvoir's later phenomenological standards, abstract. Fosca does not choose immortality to escape the ambiguities of the flesh and embodiment. His decision is motivated by his desire to save the world. He believes that time is his enemy so long as his time is limited. He believes that with sufficient time he can take up a project, bring it to closure and secure it from failure.

Fosca learns that time becomes his enemy when it stretches endlessly before him. It is not time that he needs to secure his vision but the commitment of others. No amount of time can secure that. As immortal, Fosca confronts the inevitability of failure that haunts humanity. Unlike mortals, however, who, confronted with the constraints of time, take up their failure with passion, Fosca becomes immobilized. Indifference to life replaces the passion for life. In the end, he learns the crucial truth of ethical action from his many generations removed grandson Armand. Understanding that the future belongs to others who may or may not take up his projects, Armand commits himself to the possibilities of the particularity of the concrete and the now. His passion is embodied in the appeal to others, not in a goal that would secure justice by closing off the future and the freedom of coming generations.

In All Men Are Mortal the givenness of finitude and death concerns our relationship to time. Eighteen years later,(1964) writing about the dying and death of her mother in A Very Easy Death; six years after that (1970) analyzing the situation of the aged in Coming of Age and eleven years following (1981), chronicling Sartre's last days in Adieux: A Farewell to Sartre, it is not so much our relationship to time but more a matter of our embodiment that concerns Beauvoir. In A Very Easy Death and Adieux, Beauvoir assumes the position of the phenomenological witness. The bodies of her mother and Sartre are given to us in all their disturbing breakdowns and deteriorations. Some have found these works cold, insensitive and even cruel. They miss Beauvoir's point. She is showing us who we are. The "I can" body revealed by other phenomenologists is the condition of the mature healthy body. This, however, is but one phase of the life of the body. It is, in its early days, still learning its "I can's". It is, as we age, losing them. It is one thing, as with the myth of woman, to alienate an "I can" from its capacities. It is quite another to refuse to attend to the full range of embodied life.

10. Coming of Age : The Other Again

We need to read A Very Easy Death and Adieux within the context of the analyses of Coming of Age to fully appreciate Beauvoir's role as witness. The project of The Coming of Age is similar to that of The Second Sex. Like The Second Sex, it focuses on a group of people designated as Other; like The Second Sex it exposes the mythical status of the "facts" about aging and the aged; and like The Second Sex it indicts society for its dehumanization of those it designates as Other. The Coming of Age also emulates The Second Sex in its method and scope. It trains a phenomenological lens on biological, psychological and sociological factors in order to understand the phenomenon of marginalized otherness. In many ways, however, The Coming of Age corrects what Beauvoir sees as the flaw of The Second Sex.

In reflecting on The Second Sex, Beauvoir says that were she to write it again she would pay less attention to the abstract issue of consciousness and more attention to the material conditions of scarcity. Though it is impossible to say what a revised version of The Second Sex would look like, The Coming of Age gives us some idea of how it might read. There is no talk here of THE AGED. Reminding us that old age is our universal destiny, Beauvoir tells us that its lived meaning is specific to our historical, class and cultural situations. Where The Second Sex identifies the ways in which the myth of woman hides the diversity of women and does not seem to see that the single category of the inessential Other may not capture the diverse meanings of women's situations, The Coming of Age keeps making the point that if we speak of old age as a universal category we will miss the crucial differences among the aged that the myths and images of aging hide. Further, unlike The Second Sex which speaks of a single myth of femininity, The Coming of Age tells us that the image of the aged differs from time to time and place to place.

Comparing the status of the aged to that of women as woman, Beauvoir notes that both occupy the position of the Other and that as Other both are subject to the powers of mythical, exploitive biologies. Though The Coming of Age pays closer attention to the diversity behind the unifying myths and works with a somewhat different conception of otherness, it sounds remarkably similar to The Second Sex as it traces the sources of the marginal status of the aged. While The Second Sex accused patriarchy of depriving women of their subject status by barring them from the project and devaluating the fleshed experience of the erotic, The Coming of Age argues that the non-subject status of the aged can be traced to the fact that they are barred from their projects and their erotic possibilities. "The old man", Beauvoir writes,"looks like a different species to others because unlike active members of the community he is not engaged in a project..."

Like The Second Sex which attended to the givens of biology without allowing them to determine the meaning of the subject, The Coming of Age also gives biology its due. The lack of engagement of the aged, Beauvoir notes, is in part imposed from without and in part comes from within; for as we age, the body is transformed from an instrument that engages the world into a hindrance that makes our access to the world difficult. The point of The Coming of Age, however, is that it is unjust to use these difficulties to justify reducing the aged to the status of the Other. Adieux's witnessing makes this point clearly. However diminished Sartre's body became, it never severed him from his projects. He could not have sustained his work by himself, but he was in a situation where others refused to marginalize him. They did not equate his diminished bodily capacities with a diminished humanity. The Coming of Age argues that the situation of a privileged Sartre ought to be our common destiny.

In a world which recognized the phenomenological truth of the body, the existential truth of freedom, the Marxist truth of exploitation, and the humanist truth of the bond, the category of the Other would be eradicated. Neither the aged nor women, nor anyone by virtue of their race, class, ethnicity or religion would find themselves rendered inessential. Beauvoir knows that it is too much to hope for such a world. She understands the lures of domination and violence. Throughout her career, however, she used philosophical and literary tools to reveal the possibilities of such a world and appealed to us to work for it.


Works by Beauvoir in French

Works by Beauvoir in English

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Secondary Literature: Selected Articles

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Related Entries

ambiguity | existentialism | feminism, approaches to | Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich | Heidegger, Martin | liberty | Marx, Karl | Merleau-Ponty, Maurice | phenomenology | Sartre, Jean-Paul