Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Franz Brentano

First published Wed Dec 4, 2002; substantive revision Fri Jan 12, 2007

Franz Clemens Brentano (1838-1917) is mainly known for his work in philosophy of psychology, especially for having introduced the notion of intentionality to contemporary philosophy. He also made important contributions to many fields in philosophy, especially to ethics, ontology, logic, the history of philosophy, and philosophical theology. Brentano was strongly influenced by Aristotle and the Scholastics as well as by the empiricist and positivist movements of the early nineteenth century. Due to his introspectionist approach of describing consciousness from a first person point of view, on one hand, and his rigorous style as well as his contention that philosophy should be done with exact methods like the sciences, on the other, Brentano is often considered a forerunner of both the phenomenological movement and the tradition of analytic philosophy. A charismatic teacher, Brentano exerted a strong influence on the work of Edmund Husserl, Alexius Meinong, Christian von Ehrenfels, Kasimir Twardowski, and Anton Marty, among others, and thereby played a central role in the philosophical development of central Europe in the early twentieth century.

1. Life and Work

Franz Brentano was born on January 16, 1838 in Marienberg am Rhein, Germany, a descendent of a strongly religious German-Italian family of intellectuals (his uncle Clemens Brentano and his aunt Bettina von Arnim were among the most important writers of German Romanticism and his brother Lujo Brentano became a leading expert in social economics). He studied mathematics, poetry, philosophy, and theology in Munich, Würzburg, and Berlin. Already at high school he became acquainted with Scholasticism; at university he studied Aristotle with Trendelenburg in Berlin, and read Comte as well as the British Empiricists (mainly John Stuart Mill), all of whom had a great influence on his work. Brentano received his Ph.D. in 1862, with his thesis On the Several Senses of Being in Aristotle.

After graduation Brentano prepared to take his vows; he was ordained a Catholic priest in 1864. Nevertheless he continued his academic career at the University of Würzburg, where he presented his Habilitationsschrift on The Psychology of Aristotle in 1867. Despite reservations in the faculty about his priesthood he eventually became full professor in 1873. During this period, however, Brentano struggled more and more with the official doctrine of the Catholic Church, especially with the dogma of papal infallibility, promulgated at the first Vatican Council in 1870. Shortly after his promotion at the University of Würzburg, Brentano withdrew from the priesthood and from his position as professor.

After his Habilitation, Brentano had started to work on a large scale work on the foundations of psychology, which he entitled Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint. The first volume was published in 1874, a second volume (The Classification of Mental Phenomena) followed in 1911, and fragments of the third volume (Sensory and Noetic Consciousness) were published posthumously by Oskar Kraus in 1928.

Shortly after the publication of the first volume, Brentano took a job as a full professor at the University of Vienna, where he continued a successful teaching career. During his tenure in Vienna, Brentano, who was very critical towards his own writing, no longer wrote books but turned instead to publishing various lectures. The topics range from The Genius and a series of papers on historiography to The Origin of the Knowledge of Right and Wrong, in which Brentano laid out his views on ethics. The latter was Brentano's first book to be translated into English; the translation was published in 1902.

In 1880, Brentano and Ida von Lieben decided to wed. They had to confront the fact that the laws of the Austro-Hungarian Empire at the time did not allow someone who had been ordained a priest to marry. Brentano, thus, gave up his Austrian citizenship, which meant that he also had to give up his position at the University of Vienna. He moved temporarily to Saxony, where he finally married. When he came back a few months later, the Austrian authorities did not reassign him his position. Brentano became Privatdozent, a status that allowed him to go on teaching—without receiving any salary, though. For several years he tried in vain to get his position back. In 1895, after the death of his first wife, he left Austria. In 1896 he settled down in Florence where he got married to Emilie Ruprecht in 1897.

Brentano has often been described as an extraordinarily charismatic teacher. Throughout his life he influenced a great number of students, many of who became important philosophers and psychologists in their own rights, such as Edmund Husserl, Alexius Meinong, Christian von Ehrenfels, Anton Marty, Carl Stumpf, Kasimir Twardowski, as well as Sigmund Freud. Many of his students became professors all over the Austro-Hungarian Empire, Marty in Prague, Meinong in Graz, and Twardowski in Lvov, and so spread Brentanianism over the whole Austro-Hungarian Empire. Another of Brentano's students, Tomas Masaryk, was to become founder and first President (from 1918 to 1935) of the Republic of Czechoslovakia, where he created ideal conditions for the study of Brentano's philosophy. These factors explain the central role of Brentano in the philosophical development in central Europe, especially in what was later called the Austrian Tradition in philosophy.

Brentano always emphasized that he meant to teach his students to think critically and in a scientific manner, without holding prejudices and paying undue respect to philosophical schools or traditions. When former students of his took a critical approach to his own work, however, when they criticized some of his doctrines and modified others to adapt them for their own goals, Brentano reacted bitterly. He often refused to discuss criticism, ignored improvements, and thus became more and more isolated, a development that was reinforced by his increasing blindness.

Due to these eye-problems Brentano could not read or write any longer, but had his wife read to him and dictated his work to her. Nonetheless, he produced a number of books in his years in Florence. In 1907 he published Untersuchungen zur Sinnespsychologie, a collection of shorter texts on psychology. In 1911 he presented not only the second volume of his Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint, but also two books on Aristotle: in Aristotle and his World View he provides an outline and interpretation of Aristotle's philosophy. In Aristoteles Lehre vom Ursprung des menschlichen Geistes Brentano continues a debate with Zeller. This debate had started already in the 1860s, when Brentano criticized Zeller's interpretation of Aristotle in his Psychology of Aristotle and became quite intense and aggressive in the seventies and eighties of the nineteenth century.

When Italy entered war against Germany and Austria during World War I, Brentano, who felt himself a citizen of all three countries, moved from Florence to neutral Switzerland. He passed away in Zurich on March 17, 1917.

Brentano left a huge number of unpublished manuscripts on a wide range of philosophical topics. After his death, Alfred Kastil and Oskar Kraus, who were students of Brentano's former student Anton Marty in Prague, began to publish posthumously lecture notes, letters, and drafts he had left. They tried to present Brentano's work as best as they could, putting together various texts to what they thought were rounded, convincing works, sometimes following questionable editorial criteria. Their work was continued by other, more careful editors, but has not been completed yet. Moreover, a much needed critical edition of his complete œuvre is still to be waited for.

2. Philosophy as a Rigorous Science and the Rise of Scientific Psychology

One of Brentano's main principles was that philosophy should be done with methods that are as rigorous and exact as the methods of the natural sciences. This standpoint is clearly mirrored in his empirical approach to psychology. It is noteworthy here that Brentano's use of the word “empirical” deviates substantially from what has become its standard meaning today. He emphasized that all our knowledge should be based on direct experience. He did not hold, however, that this experience needs to be made from a third-person point of view, and thus opposes what has become a standard of empirical science nowadays. Brentano rather argued a form of introspectionism: doing psychology from an empirical standpoint means for him to describe what one directly experiences in inner perception, from a first-person point of view.

Brentano's approach, like that of other introspectionist psychologists of the late nineteenth century, was harshly criticized with the rise of scientific psychology in the tradition of logical positivism, especially by the behaviorists. This should not obscure the fact that Brentano did play a crucial role in the process of psychology becoming an independent science. He distinguished between genetic and empirical or, as he later called it, descriptive psychology, a distinction that is most explicitly drawn in his Descriptive Psychology. Genetic psychology studies psychological phenomena from a third-person point of view. It involves the use of empirical experiments and thus satisfies the scientific standards we nowadays expect of an empirical science. Even though Brentano never practiced experimental psychology himself, he very actively supported the installation of the first laboratories for experimental psychology in the Austro-Hungarian Empire, a development that was continued by his student Alexius Meinong in Graz. Descriptive psychology (to which Brentano sometimes also referred as “phenomenology”) aims at describing consciousness from a first-person point of view. Its goal is to list “fully the basic components out of which everything internally perceived by humans is composed, and … [to enumerate] the ways in which these components can be connected” (Descriptive Psychology , 4). Brentano's distinction between genetic and descriptive psychology strongly influenced Husserl's development of the phenomenological method, especially in its early phases, a development of which Brentano could not approve for it involved the intuition of abstract essences, the existence of which Brentano denied.

3. Brentano's Theory of Mind

Brentano's main goal was to lay the basis for a scientific psychology, which he defines as “the science of mental phenomena” (Psychology, p. 18). In order to give flesh to this definition of the discipline, he provides a more detailed characterization of mental phenomena. He proposes six criteria to distinguish mental from physical phenomena, the most important of which are: (i) mental phenomena are the exclusive object of inner perception, (ii) they always appear as a unity, and (iii) they are always intentionally directed towards an object. I will discuss the first two criteria in this section, and the third in a separate section below.

All mental phenomena have in common, Brentano argues, “that they are only perceived in inner consciousness, while in the case of physical phenomena only external perception is possible” (Psychology, 91). According to Brentano, the former of these two forms of perception provides an unmistakable evidence for what is true. Since the German word for perception (Wahrnehmung), literally translated, means “taking-true”, Brentano says that it is the only kind of perception in a strict sense. He points out that inner perception must not be mixed up with inner observation, i.e., it must not be conceived as a full-fledged act that accompanies another mental act towards which it is directed. It is rather interwoven with the latter: in addition to being primarily directed towards an object, each act is incidentally directed towards itself as a secondary object. As a consequence, Brentano denies the idea that there could be unconscious mental acts: since every mental act is incidentally directed towards itself as a secondary object, we are automatically aware of every occurring mental act. He admits, however, that we can have mental acts of various degrees of intensity. In addition, he holds that the degree of intensity with which the object is presented is equal to the degree of intensity in which the secondary object, i.e., the act itself, is presented. Consequently, if we have a mental act of a very low intensity, our secondary consciousness of this act also will have a very low intensity. From this Brentano concludes that sometimes we are inclined to say that we had an unconscious mental phenomenon when actually we only had a conscious mental phenomenon of very low intensity.

Consciousness, Brentano argues, always forms a unity. While we can perceive a number of physical phenomena at one and the same time, we can only perceive one mental phenomenon at a specific point in time. When we seem to have more than one mental act at a time, like when we hear a melody while tasting a sip of red wine and enjoying the beautiful view from the window, all these mental phenomena melt into one, they become divisions of a collective. If one of the divisives ends in the course of time, e.g., when I swallow the wine and close my eyes, but continue to listen to the music, the collective goes on to exist. Brentano's views on the unity of consciousness entail that inner observation, as explained above, is strictly impossible, i.e., that we cannot have a second act which is directed towards another mental act which it accompanies. One can remember another mental act one had earlier, or expect future mental acts, but due to the unity of consciousness one cannot have two mental acts, one of which being directed towards the other, at the same time.

Brentano points out that we can be directed towards one and the same object in different ways and he accordingly distinguishes three kinds of mental phenomena: presentations, judgments, and phenomena of love and hate. These are not three distinct classes, though. Presentations are the most basic kind of acts; we have a presentation each time when we are directed towards an object, be it that we are imagining, seeing, remembering, or expecting it, etc. In his Psychology Brentano held that two presentations can differ only in the object, towards which they are directed. Later he modified his position, though, and argued that they can also differ in various modes, such as temporal modes. The two other categories, judgments and phenomena of love and hate, are based on presentations. In a judgment we accept or deny the existence of the presented object. A judgment, thus, is a presentation plus a qualitative mode of acceptance or denial. The third category, which Brentano names “phenomena of love and hate,” comprises emotions, feelings, desires and acts of will. In these acts we have positive or negative feelings towards an object.

4. Intentionality

Brentano is probably best known for having introduced the notion of intentionality to contemporary philosophy. He first characterizes this notion with the following words, which have become the classical, albeit not completely unambiguous formulation of the intentionality thesis:

Every mental phenomenon is characterized by what the Scholastics of the Middle Ages called the intentional (or mental) inexistence of an object, and what we might call, though not wholly unambiguously, reference to a content, direction toward an object (which is not to be understood here as meaning a thing), or immanent objectivity. Every mental phenomenon includes something as object within itself... (Brentano, Psychology, 88)

This quotation must be understood in context: Brentano's goal, as we have seen above, was to deliver a further criterion to distinguish mental from physical phenomena, and not to develop a systematic account of intentionality. The passage clearly suggests, however, that the intentional object towards which we are directed is part of the psychological act. It is something mental rather than physical. Brentano, thus, seems to advocate a form of immanentism, according to which the intentional object is “in the head,” as it were. Some Brentano scholars have recently argued that this immanent reading of the intentionality thesis is too strong. In the light of other texts by Brentano from the same period they argue that he distinguishes between intentional correlate and object, and that the existence of the latter does not depend on our being directed towards it.

When Brentano's students took up his notion of intentionality to develop more systematic accounts, they often criticized it for its unclarity regarding the ontological status of the intentional object: if the intentional object is part of the act, it was argued, we are faced with a duplication of the object. Next to the real, physical object, which is perceived, remembered, thought of, etc., we have a mental, intentional object, towards which the act is actually directed. Thus, when I think about the city of Paris, I am actually thinking of a mental object that is part of my act of thinking, and not about the actual city. This view leads to obvious difficulties, the most disastrous of which is that two persons can never be directed towards one and the same object.

If we try to resolve the problem by taking the intentional object to be identical with the real object, on the other hand, we face the difficulty of explaining how we can have mental phenomena that are directed towards non-existing objects such as Hamlet, the golden mountain, or a round square. Like my thinking about the city of Paris, all these acts are intentionally directed towards an object, with the difference, however, that their objects do not really exist.

Brentano's initial formulation of the intentionality-thesis does not address these problems concerning the ontological status of the intentional object. The first attempt of Brentano's students to overcome these difficulties was made by Twardowski, who distinguished between content and object of the act, the former of which is immanent to the act, the latter not. This distinction strongly influenced other members of the Brentano School, mainly the two students for who the notion of intentionality had the most central place, Meinong and Husserl.

Meinong's theory of objects can best be understood as a reaction to the ontological difficulties in Brentano's account. Rather than accepting the notion of an immanent content, Meinong argues that the intentional relation is always a relation between the mental act and an object. In some cases the intentional object does not exist, but even in these cases there is an object external to the mental act towards which we are directed. According to Meinong, even non-existent objects are in some sense real. Since we can be intentionally directed towards them, they must subsist (bestehen ). Not all subsisting objects exist; some of them cannot even exist for they are logically impossible, such as round squares. The notion of intentionality played a central role also in Husserlian phenomenology. Applying his method of the phenomenological reduction, however, Husserl addresses the problem of directedness by introducing the notion of ‘noema,’ which plays a role similar to Frege's notion of ‘sense.’

Brentano was not very fond of his students' attempts to resolve these difficulties, mainly because he rejected their underlying ontological assumptions. He was quick to point out that he never intended the intentional object to be immanent to the act. Brentano thought that this interpretation of his position was obviously absurd, for it would be “paradoxical to the extreme to say that a man promises to marry an ens rationis and fulfills his promise by marrying a real person” (Psychology, 385). He therefore suggested to see intentionality as an exceptional form of relation. A mental act does not stand in an ordinary relation to an object, but in a quasi-relation (Relativliches). For a relation to exist, both relata have to exist. A person a is taller than another person b, for example, only if both a and b exist (and a is, in fact, taller than b). This does not hold for the intentional quasi-relation, Brentano suggests. A mental phenomenon can stand in a quasi-relation to an object independent of whether it exists or not. Mental acts, thus, can stand in a quasi-relation to existing objects like the city of Paris as well as non-existing objects like the Golden Mountain. Brentano's later account can hardly be considered a solution of the problem of the ontological status of the intentional object. He rather introduces a new term to reformulate the difficulties.

5. Time-Consciousness

According to Brentano's theory, mental acts cannot have duration. This brings up the question of how we can perceive temporally extended objects like melodies. Brentano accounts for these cases by arguing that an object towards which we are directed does not immediately vanish from consciousness once the mental act is over. It rather remains present in altered form, modified from ‘present’ to ‘past.’ Every mental phenomenon triggers an ‘original association’ or ‘proteraesthesis,’ as he calls it later, a kind of memory which is not a full-fledged act of remembering, but rather a part of the act that keeps lively what was experienced a moment ago. When I listen to a melody, for example, I first hear the first tone. In the next moment I hear the second tone, but am still directed towards the first one, which is modified as past, though. Then I hear the third tone, now the second tone is modified as past, the first is pushed back even further into the past. In this way Brentano can explain how we can perceive temporally extended objects and events. The details of Brentano's account of time-consciousness changed over the time, owing to changes in his overall position. At one point he thought that the temporal modification was part of the object, later he thought that they belonged to judgments, and even later he argued that they were modes of presentations.

Brentano's account of time consciousness greatly influenced his students, especially Edmund Husserl, whose notion of ‘retention’ bears close resemblances to Brentano's notion of ‘original association.’

6. Further Contributions to Philosophy

Brentano proposes a theory of truth that is closely connected to his theory of ‘evidence.’ For Brentano, it is judgments, i.e., mental phenomena, which are true or false. Sentences can be said to be true or false only insofar as they express a judgment. According to Brentano's theory, a judgment is true if one can judge with absolute certainty or, to use Brentano's term, with absolute evidence that it is true.

Brentano's interest in the history of philosophy is not only reflected by his extensive work on Aristotle, but also by his historiographical considerations. He argued the metaphilosophical thesis that progress in philosophy can be explained according to principles of cultural psychology. In philosophy progress takes place in circles: each philosophical period, Brentano holds, can be subdivided in four phases. The first is a creative phase of renewal and ascending development; the other three are phases of decline, dominated by a turn towards practical interests, by scepticism, and finally by mysticism. After the fourth phase, a new period begins with a creative phase of renewal. With this scheme Brentano succeeds in giving his philosophical preferences an intellectual justification; it allows him to explain his fascination for Aristotle, the Scholastics, and Descartes as well as his dislike of Kant and the German idealists.

Brentano's views on ethics and aesthetics rest on his point that there are three classes of mental phenomena. He argues that there is an analogy between judgments and phenomena of love and hate, i.e., between phenomena of the second and the third class: we can say of phenomena of both classes that they are correct or incorrect. What seems to be quite unproblematic for judgments seems to lead to a quite controversial position in the case of phenomena of love and hate. Brentano, who admits that he has not found an adequate name for phenomena of the third class, understands love and hate in a very broad sense, as positive or negative feeling or emotion towards an object. We might (with Chisholm (1966, 395)) call it “pro-emotions” and “anti-emotions”. This theory of correct emotions goes hand in hand with a theory of intrinsic value. According to Brentano, a thing is intrinsically good if it is correct to have pro-emotions and intrinsically bad if one correctly has anti-emotions about it. Also in aesthetics there is a correlation between the aesthetical value of an object and our correctly loving or hating it.

In addition to the topics discussed, Brentano made important contributions to metaphysics, especially on the relation of substance and accidents, and concerning mereology. He also developed a theory of space, time, and other continua and discussed arguments concerning the existence of God. For Brentano's contributions to logic, cf. the entry Brentano's Theory of Judgement.


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Brentano, Franz: theory of judgement | consciousness: and intentionality | Husserl, Edmund | intentionality | Lvov-Warsaw School | Meinong, Alexius | phenomenology