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Ernst Cassirer

First published Wed Jun 30, 2004; substantive revision Fri Oct 1, 2004

Ernst Cassirer occupies a unique place in twentieth-century philosophy. His work pays equal attention to foundational and epistemological issues in the philosophy of mathematics and natural science and to aesthetics, the philosophy of history, and other issues in the “cultural sciences” broadly conceived. More than any other German philosopher since Kant, Cassirer thus aims to devote equal philosophical attention both to the (mathematical and) natural sciences (Naturwissenschaften) and to the more humanistic disciplines (Geisteswissenschaften). In this way, Cassirer, more than any other twentieth-century philosopher, plays a fundamental mediating role between C. P. Snow's famous “two cultures.” He also plays a similarly mediating role between the two major traditions in twentieth-century academic philosophy — the “analytic” and “continental” traditions — whose radically different (and often mutually uncomprehending) perspectives on the relationship between scientific and humanistic elements in their subject gave rise to a fundamental split or gulf between philosophy as it came to be practiced in the Anglo-American world, on the one side, and as it was practiced in most of the rest of the world, on the other. Cassirer, by contrast, had fruitful philosophical relations with leading members of both traditions — with Moritz Schlick, the founder and guiding spirit of the Vienna Circle of logical empiricists, whose work in logic and the philosophy of science had a decisive influence on the development of philosophy in the United States, and with Martin Heidegger, the creator of a radical “existential-hermeneutical” version of Husserlian phenomenology which quickly became dominant in continental Europe.

1. Biography

Cassirer was born on July 28, 1874, to a wealthy and cosmopolitan Jewish family, in the German city of Breslau (now Wroclaw, Poland). Part of the family lived in Berlin, including Cassirer's cousin Bruno Cassirer, the distinguished publisher, who later published most of Cassirer's writings. Cassirer entered the University of Berlin in 1892. In 1894 he took a course on Kant with Georg Simmel, who recommended Hermann Cohen's writings on Kant in particular. Cohen, the first Jew to hold a professorship in Germany, was the founder of the so-called Marburg School of neo-Kantianism, famous for interpreting Kant's transcendental method as beginning with the “fact of science” and then arguing regressively to the presuppositions or conditions of possibility of this “fact.” Kant was thus read as an “epistemologist [Erkenntniskritiker]” or methodologist of science rather than as a “metaphysician” in the tradition of post-Kantian German idealism. After learning of Cohen's writings from Simmel, Cassirer (then nineteen years old) proceeded to devour them, whereupon he immediately resolved to study with Cohen at Marburg. He studied at Marburg from 1896 to 1899, when he completed his doctoral work with a dissertation on Descartes's analysis of mathematical and natural scientific knowledge. This appeared, in turn, as the Introduction to Cassirer's first published work, a treatment of Leibniz's philosophy and its scientific basis [Cassirer 1902]. Upon returning to Berlin in 1903, Cassirer further developed these themes while working out his monumental interpretation of the development of modern philosophy and science from the Renaissance through Kant [Cassirer 1906, 1907a]. The first volume of this work served as his habilitation at the University of Berlin, where he taught as an instructor or Privatdozent from 1906 to 1919.

In 1919 Cassirer was finally offered professorships at two newly founded universities at Frankfurt and Hamburg under the auspices of the Weimar Republic. He taught at Hamburg from 1919 until emigrating from Germany in 1933. During these years Cassirer completed his three-volume Philosophy of Symbolic Forms [Cassirer 1923, 1925, 1929b], which broke fundamental new ground beyond the neo-Kantianism of the Marburg School and articulated his own original attempt to unite scientific and non-scientific modes of thought (“symbolic forms”) within a single philosophical vision. In 1928 Cassirer offered a defense of Weimar [Cassirer 1929a] at the University's celebration of the tenth anniversary of the Republic, and in 1929-30 he served as the rector of the University, as the first Jew to hold such a position in Germany. In the Spring of 1929 Cassirer took part in a famous disputation with Martin Heidegger in Davos, Switzerland, where Heidegger explicitly took Cohen's neo-Kantianism as a philosophical target and defended his radical new conception of an “existential analytic of Dasein” in the guise of a parallel interpretation of the philosophy of Kant [Heidegger 1929]. Cassirer, for his part, defended his own new understanding of Kant in the philosophy of symbolic forms — against Heidegger's insistence on the ineluctability of human finitude — by appealing to genuinely objectively valid, necessary and eternal truths arising in both moral experience and mathematical natural science. Nevertheless, despite their deep disagreements, Cassirer and Heidegger enjoyed friendly philosophical relations until Cassirer's emigration in 1933 (see [Friedman 2000]).

After his emigration Cassirer spent two years lecturing at Oxford and then six years at the University of Göteborg in Sweden. During this time he developed his most sustained discussion of morality and the philosophy of law as a study of the Swedish legal philosopher Axel Hägerström [Cassirer 1939] (see [Krois 1987, chap. 4]). He also articulated his major statement on the relationship between the natural sciences and the “cultural sciences” [Cassirer 1942], which contained, among other things, an explicit rejection of Rudolf Carnap's “physicalism” (see [Friedman 2000, chap. 7]). Cassirer, like so many German émigrés during this period (including Carnap) then finally settled in the United States. He taught at Yale from 1941 to 1944 and at Columbia in 1944-45. During these years he produced two books in English [Cassirer 1944, 1946], where the first, An Essay on Man, serves as a concise introduction to the philosophy of symbolic forms (and thus Cassirer's distinctive philosophical perspective) as a whole and the second, The Myth of the State, offers an explanation of the rise of fascism on the basis of Cassirer's conception of mythical thought. Two important American philosophers were substantially influenced by Cassirer during these years: Arthur Pap, whose work on the “functional a priori” in physical theory [Pap 1946] took shape under Cassirer's guidance at Yale, and Susanne Langer, who promulgated Cassirer's philosophy of symbolic forms in aesthetic and literary circles (see, e.g., [Langer 1942]). Cassirer's American influence thus embraced both sides of his philosophical personality. One can only speculate on what this influence might have been if his life had not been cut short suddenly by a heart attack while walking on the streets of New York City on April 13, 1945.

2. Early Historical Writings

As indicated above, Cassirer's first writings were largely historical in character — including a discussion of Leibniz's philosophy in its scientific context [Cassirer 1902] and a large-scale work on the history of modern thought from the Renaissance through Kant, Das Erkenntnisproblem in der Philosophie und Wissenschaft der neueren Zeit [Cassirer 1906, 1907a]. The latter, in particular, is a magisterial and deeply original contribution to both the history of philosophy and the history of science. It is the first work, in fact, to develop a detailed reading of the scientific revolution as a whole in terms of the “Platonic” idea that the thoroughgoing application of mathematics to nature (the so-called mathematization of nature) is the central and overarching achievement of this revolution. And Cassirer's insight was explicitly acknowledged by such seminal intellectual historians as E. A. Burtt, E. J. Dijksterhuis, and Alexandre Koyré, who developed this theme later in the century in the course of establishing the discipline of history of science as we know it today (see, e.g., [Burtt 1925], [Koyré 1939], [Dijksterhuis 1959]). Cassirer, for his part, simultaneously articulates an interpretation of the history of modern philosophy as the development and eventual triumph of what he calls “modern philosophical idealism.” This tradition takes its inspiration, according to Cassirer, from idealism in the Platonic sense, from an appreciation for the “ideal” formal structures paradigmatically studied in mathematics, and it is distinctively modern in recognizing the fundamental importance of the systematic application of such structures to empirically given nature in modern mathematical physics — a progressive and synthetic process wherein mathematical models of nature are successively refined and corrected without limit. For Cassirer, it is Galileo, above all, in opposition to both sterile Aristotelian-Scholastic formal logic and sterile Aristotelian-Scholastic empirical induction, who first grasped the essential structure of this synthetic process; and the development of “modern philosophical idealism” by such thinkers as Descartes, Spinoza, Gassendi, Hobbes, Leibniz, and Kant then consists in its increasingly self-conscious philosophical articulation and elaboration.

In both the Leibniz book and Das Erkenntnisproblem, then, Cassirer interprets the development of modern thought as a whole from the perspective of the basic philosophical principles of Marburg neo-Kantianism: the idea that philosophy as epistemology (Erkenntniskritik) has the articulation and elaboration of the structure of modern mathematical natural science as its primary task; the conviction that, accordingly, philosophy must take the “fact of science” as its starting point and ultimately given datum; and, most especially, the so-called “genetic” conception of scientific knowledge as an ongoing, never completed synthetic process (see below). From a contemporary point of view, Cassirer's history may therefore appear as both “Whiggish” and “triumphalist,” but it cannot be denied that his work is, nevertheless, extraordinarily rich, extraordinarily clear, and extraordinarily illuminating. Cassirer examines an astonishing variety of textual sources (including both major and minor figures) carefully and in detail, and, without at all neglecting contrary tendencies within the skeptical and empiricist traditions, he develops a compelling portrayal of the evolution of “modern philosophical idealism” through Kant which, even today, reads as extremely compelling and acute.

Cassirer must thus be ranked as one of the very greatest intellectual historians of the twentieth-century — and, indeed, as one of the founders of this discipline as it came to be practiced after 1900. He continued to contribute to intellectual history broadly conceived throughout his career (most notably, perhaps, in his fundamental studies of the Renaissance and the Enlightenment [Cassirer 1927a, 1932]), and he had a major influence on intellectual history throughout the century. Aside from the history of science (see above), Cassirer also decisively influenced intellectual historians more generally, including, notably, the eminent intellectual and cultural historian Peter Gay and the distinguished art historian Erwin Panofsky (see, e.g., [Gay 1977], [Panofsky 1939]). As we shall see below, intellectual (and later cultural) history is an integral part of Cassirer's distinctive philosophical methodology, so that, in his case, the standard distinction between “historical” and “systematic” work in philosophy ends up looking quite artificial.

3. Philosophy of Mathematics and Natural Science

It was noted above that Cassirer's early historical works interpret the development of modern thought as a whole (embracing both philosophy and the sciences) from the perspective of the philosophical principles of Marburg neo-Kantianism, as initially articulated in [Cohen 1871]. On the “genetic” conception of scientific knowledge, in particular, the a priori synthetic activity of thought — the activity Kant himself had called “productive synthesis” — is understood as a temporal and historical developmental process in which the object of science is gradually and successively constituted as a never completed “X” towards which the developmental process is converging. For Cohen, this process is modelled on the methods of the infinitesimal calculus (in this connection, especially, see [Cohen 1883]). Beginning with the idea of a continuous series or function, our problem is to see how such a series can be a priori generated step-by-step. The mathematical concept of a differential shows us how this can be done, for the differential at a point in the domain of a given function indicates how it is to be continued on succeeding points. The differential therefore infinitesimally captures the rule of the series as a whole, and thus expresses, at any given point or moment of time, the general form of the series valid for all times,

Cassirer's first “systematic” work, Substance and Function [Cassirer 1910], takes an essential philosophical step beyond Cohen by explicitly engaging with the late nineteenth-century developments in the foundations of mathematics and mathematical logic that exerted a profound influence on twentieth-century philosophy of mathematics and natural science. Cassirer begins by discussing the problem of concept formation, and by criticizing, in particular, the “abstractionist” theory characteristic of philosophical empiricism, according to which general concepts are arrived at by ascending inductively from sensory particulars. This theory, for Cassirer, is an artifact of traditional Aristotelian logic; and his main idea, accordingly, is that developments in modern formal logic (the mathematical theory of relations) allows us definitively to reject such abstractionism (and thus philosophical empiricism) on behalf of the genetic conception of knowledge. In particular, the modern axiomatic conception of mathematics, as exemplified especially in Richard Dedekind's work on the foundations of arithmetic and David Hilbert's work on the foundations of geometry, has shown that mathematics itself has a purely formal and ideal, entirely non-sensory and thus non-intuitive meaning. Pure mathematics describes abstract “systems of order” — what we would now call relational structures — whose concepts can in no way be accommodated within abstractionist or inductivist philosophical empiricism. Cassirer then employs this “formalist” conception of mathematics characteristic of the late nineteenth century to craft a new, and more abstract, version of the genetic conception of knowledge. We conceive the developmental process in question as a series or sequence of abstract formal structures (“systems of order”), which is itself ordered by the abstract mathematical relation of approximate backwards-directed inclusion (as, for example, the new non-Euclidean geometries contain the older geometry of Euclid as a continuously approximated limiting case). In this way, we can conceive all the structures in our sequence as continuously converging, as it were, on a final or limit structure, such that all previous structures in the sequence are approximate special or limiting cases of this final structure. The idea of such an endpoint of the sequence is only a regulative ideal in the Kantian sense — it is only progressively approximated but never in fact actually realized. Nevertheless, it still constitutes the a priori “general serial form” of our properly empirical mathematical theorizing, and, at the same time, it bestows on this theorizing its characteristic form of objectivity.

In explicitly embracing late nineteenth-century work on the foundations of mathematics, Cassirer comes into very close proximity with early twentieth-century analytic philosophy. Indeed, Cassirer takes the modern mathematical logic implicit in the work of Dedekind and Hilbert, and explicit in the work of Gottlob Frege and the early Bertrand Russell, as providing us with our primary tool for moving beyond the empiricist abstractionism due ultimately to Aristotelian syllogistic. The modern “theory of the concept,” accordingly, is based on the fundamental notions of function, series, and order (relational structure) — where these notions, from the point of view of pure mathematics and pure logic, are entirely formal and abstract, having no intuitive relation, in particular, to either space or time. Nevertheless, and here is where Cassirer diverges from most of the analytic tradition, this modern theory of the concept only provides us with a genuine and complete alternative to Aristotelian abstractionism and philosophical empiricism when it is embedded within the genetic conception of knowledge. What is primary is the generative historical process by which modern mathematical natural science successively develops or evolves, and pure mathematics and pure logic only have philosophical significance as elements of or abstractions from this more fundamental developmental process of “productive synthesis” aimed at the application of such pure formal structures in empirical knowledge (see especially [Cassirer 1907b]).

Cassirer's next important contribution to scientific epistemology [Cassirer 1921] explores the relationship between Einstein's general theory of relativity and the “critical” (Marburg neo-Kantian) conception of knowledge. Cassirer argues that Einstein's theory in fact stands as a brilliant confirmation of this conception. On the one hand, the increasing use of abstract mathematical representations in Einstein's theory entirely supports the attack on Aristotelian abstractionism and philosophical empiricism. On the other hand, however, Einstein's use of non-Euclidean geometry presents no obstacle at all to our purified and generalized form of (neo-)Kantianism. For we no longer require that any particular mathematical structure be fixed for all time, but only that the historical-developmental sequence of such structures continuously converge. Einstein's theory satisfies this requirement perfectly well, since the Euclidean geometry fundamental to Newtonian physics is indeed contained in the more general geometry (of variable curvature) employed by Einstein as an approximate special case (as the regions considered become infinitely small, for example). Moritz Schlick published a review of Cassirer's book immediately after its first appearance [Schlick 1921], taking the occasion to argue (what later became a prominent theme in the philosophy of logical empiricism) that Einstein's theory of relativity provides us with a decisive refutation of Kantianism in all of its forms. This review marked the beginnings of a respectful philosophical exchange between the two, as noted above, and it was continued, in the context of Cassirer's later work on the philosophy of symbolic forms, in [Cassirer 1927b] (see [Friedman 2000, chap. 7]).

Cassirer's assimilation of Einstein's general theory of relativity marked a watershed in the development of his thought. It not only gave him an opportunity, as we have just seen, to reinterpret the Kantian theory of the a priori conditions of objective experience (especially as involving space and time) in terms of Cassirer's own version of the genetic conception of knowledge, but it also provided him with an impetus to generalize and extend the original Marburg view in such a way that modern mathematical scientific knowledge in general is now seen as just one possible “symbolic form” among other equally valid and legitimate such forms. Indeed, [Cassirer 1921] first officially announces the project of a general “philosophy of symbolic forms,” conceived, in this context, as a philosophical extension of “the general postulate of relativity.” Just as, according to the general postulate of relativity, all possible reference frames and coordinate systems are viewed as equally good representations of physical reality, and, as a totality, are together interrelated and embraced by precisely this postulate, similarly the totality of “symbolic forms” — aesthetic, ethical, religious, scientific — are here envisioned by Cassirer as standing in a closely analogous relationship. So it is no wonder that, subsequent to taking up the professorship at Hamburg in 1919, Cassirer devotes the rest of his career to this new philosophy of symbolic forms. (Cassirer's work in the philosophy of natural science in particular also continued, notably in [Cassirer 1936].)

4. The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms

At Hamburg Cassirer found a tremendous resource for the next stage in his philosophical development — the Library of the Cultural Sciences founded by Aby Warburg. Warburg was an eminent art historian with a particular interest in ancient cult, ritual, myth, and magic as sources of archetypal forms of emotional expression later manifested in Renaissance art, and the Library therefore contained abundant materials both on artistic and cultural history and on ancient myth and ritual. Cassirer's earliest works on the philosophy of symbolic forms appeared as studies and lectures of the Warburg Library in the years 1922-1925, and the three-volume Philosophy of Symbolic Forms itself appeared, as noted above, in 1923, 1925, and 1929 respectively. Just as the genetic conception of knowledge is primarily oriented towards the “fact of science” and, accordingly, takes the historical development of scientific knowledge as its ultimate given datum, the philosophy of symbolic forms is oriented towards the much more general “fact of culture” and thus takes the history of human culture as a whole as its ultimate given datum. The conception of human beings as most fundamentally “symbolic animals,” interposing systems of signs or systems of expression between themselves and the world, then becomes the guiding philosophical motif for elucidating the corresponding conditions of possibility for the “fact of culture” in all of its richness and diversity.

Characteristic of the philosophy of symbolic forms is a concern for the more “primitive” forms of world-presentation underlying the “higher” and more sophisticated cultural forms — a concern for the ordinary perceptual awareness of the world expressed primarily in natural language, and, above all, for the mythical view of the world lying at the most primitive level of all. For Cassirer, these more primitive manifestations of “symbolic meaning” now have an independent status and foundational role that is quite incompatible with both Marburg neo-Kantianism and Kant's original philosophical conception. In particular, they lie at a deeper, autonomous level of spiritual life which then gives rise to the more sophisticated forms by a dialectical developmental process. From mythical thought, religion and art develop; from natural language, theoretical science develops. It is precisely here that Cassirer appeals to “romantic” philosophical tendencies lying outside the Kantian and neo-Kantian tradition, deploys an historical dialectic self-consciously derived from Hegel, and comes to terms with the contemporary Lebensphilosophie of Wilhelm Dilthey, Henri Bergson, Max Scheler, and Georg Simmel — as well as with the closely related philosophy of Martin Heidegger.

The most basic and primitive type of symbolic meaning is expressive meaning, the product of what Cassirer calls the expressive function (Ausdrucksfunktion) of thought, which is concerned with the experience of events in the world around us as charged with affective and emotional significance, as desirable or hateful, comforting or threatening. It is this type of meaning that underlies mythical consciousness, for Cassirer, and which explains its most distinctive feature, namely, its total disregard for the distinction between appearance and reality. Since the mythical world does not consist of stable and enduring substances that manifest themselves from various points of view and on various occasions, but rather in a fleeting complex of events bound together by their affective and emotional “physiognomic” characters, it also exemplifies its own particular type of causality whereby each part literally contains the whole of which it is a part and can thereby exert all the causal efficacy of the whole. Similarly, there is no essential difference in efficacy between the living and the dead, between waking experiences and dreams, between the name of an object and the object itself, and so on. The fundamental Kantian “categories” of space, time, substance (or object), and causality thereby take on a distinctive configuration representing the formal a priori structure, as it were, of mythical thought.

What Cassirer calls representative symbolic meaning, a product of the representative function (Darstellungsfunktion) of thought, then has the task of precipitating out of the original mythical flux of “physiognomic” characters a world of stable and enduring substances, distinguishable and reidentifiable as such. Working together with the fundamentally pragmatic orientation towards the world exhibited in the technical and instrumental use of tools and artifacts, it is in natural language, according to Cassirer, that the representative function of thought is then most clearly visible. For it is primarily through the medium of natural language that we construct the “intuitive world” of ordinary sense perception on the basis of what Cassirer calls intuitive space and intuitive time. The demonstrative particles (later articles) and tenses of natural language specify the locations of perceived objects in relation to the changing spatio-temporal position of the speaker (relative to a “here-and-now”), and a unified spatio-temporal order thus arises in which each designated object has a determinate relation to the speaker, his/her point of view, and his/her potential range of pragmatic activities. We are now able to distinguish the enduring thing-substance, on the one side, from its variable manifestations from different points of view and on different occasions, on the other, and we thereby arrive at a new fundamental distinction between appearance and reality. This distinction is then expressed in its most developed form, for Cassirer, in the linguistic notion of propositional truth and thus in the propositional copula. Here the Kantian “categories” of space, time, substance, and causality take on a distinctively intuitive or “presentational” configuration.

The distinction between appearance and reality, as expressed in the propositional copula, then leads dialectically to a new task of thought, the task of theoretical science, of systematic inquiry into the realm of truths. Here we encounter the third and final function of symbolic meaning, the significative function (Bedeutungsfunktion), which is exhibited most clearly, according to Cassirer, in the “pure category of relation.” For it is precisely here, in the scientific view of the world, that the pure relational concepts characteristic of modern mathematics, logic, and mathematical physics are finally freed from the bounds of sensible intuition. For example, mathematical space and time arise from intuitive space and time when we abstract from all demonstrative relation to a “here-and-now” and consider instead the single system of relations in which all possible “here-and-now”-points are embedded; the mathematical system of the natural numbers arises when we abstract from all concrete applications of counting and consider instead the single potentially infinite progression wherein all possible applications of counting are comprehended; and so on. The eventual result is the world of modern mathematical physics described in Cassirer's earlier scientific works — a pure system of formal relations where, in particular, the intuitive concept of substantial thing has finally been replaced by the relational-functional concept of universal law. So it is here, and only here, that the generalized and purified form of (neo-)Kantianism distinctive of the Marburg School gives an accurate characterization of human thought. This characterization is now seen as a one-sided abstraction from a much more comprehensive dialectical process which can no longer be adequately understood without paying equal attention to its more concrete and intuitive symbolic manifestations; and it is in precisely this way, in the end, that the Marburg “fact of science” is now firmly embedded within the much more general “fact of culture” as a whole. (The final volume of The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms, The Phenomenology of Knowledge [1929b], articulates this embedding most explicitly, where the significative function of symbolic meaning is depicted as dialectically evolving — in just the sense of Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit — from the expressive and representative functions.)

5. Cassirer and Twentieth-Century Philosophy

As noted above, in the same year (1929) that the final volume of The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms appeared, Cassirer took part in an historically significant encounter with Martin Heidegger in Davos — where, in particular, Cassirer challenged Heidegger's radical “finitism” by reference to the presumed necessary (and eternal) universal validity found in both the mathematical sciences and human moral or practical experience. Heidegger had already distanced his own “existential analytic of Dasein” from Cassirer's analysis of mythical thought in Being and Time (see [Heidegger 1927, §§ 10, 11]), and he had then published a respectful but critical review of Cassirer's volume on mythical thought [Heidegger 1928]. Cassirer, for his part, added five footnotes on Being and Time before publication of his final volume in 1929, and he then published a similarly respectful but critical review of [Heidegger 1929] alluding to the Davos disputation at the end [Cassirer 1931]. Unlike in his remarks at the Davos disputation itself, Cassirer here places his primary emphasis on the practical and aesthetic dimensions of Kant's thought, as expressed in the Critique of Practical Reason and the Critique of Judgement. His main point is that, whereas the transcendental analytic of the Critique of Pure Reason may indeed be written from the point of view of human temporality or finitude, the rest of the Kantian system embeds this particular theory of human cognition within a much wider conception of “the intelligible substrate of humanity.” Cassirer's remarks here thus mirror his own attempt to embed the Marburg genetic conception of mathematical-scientific knowledge within a much wider theory of the development of human culture as a whole, and thereby reflect, as indicated at the beginning, his distinctive mediating role between the Naturwissenschaften and the Geisteswissenschaften — and thus between the analytic and continental philosophical traditions.

The Logic of the Cultural Sciences [Cassirer 1942] presents Cassirer's most developed and systematic articulation of how it is possible to achieve objective and universal validity in both the domain of the natural and mathematical sciences and the domain of practical, cultural, moral, and aesthetic phenomenon. Cassirer argues, in the first place, that an ungrounded prejudice privileging “thing perception [Dingwahrnehmen]” — based on the representative function (Darstellungsfunktion) of thought — over “expressive perception [Ausdruckswahrnehmen]” is a primary motivation for the widespread idea that the natural sciences have a more secure evidential base than do the cultural sciences (and it is here, in particular, that he presents his criticism of Rudolf Carnap's “physicalism” alluded to above). In reality, however, neither form of perception can be reduced to the other — both are what Cassirer calls “primary phenomena [Urphänomene].” Thus, whereas the natural sciences take their evidential base from the sphere of thing perception, the cultural sciences take theirs from the sphere of expressive perception, and, more specifically, from the fundamental experience of other human beings as fellow selves sharing a common intersubjective world of “cultural meanings.” In the second place, moreover, whereas intersubjective or objective validity in the natural sciences rests ultimately on universal laws of nature ranging over all (physical) places and times, an analogous type of intersubjective or objective validity arises in the cultural sciences quite independent of such universal laws. In particular, although every “cultural object” (a text, a work of art, a monument, and so on) has its own individual place in (historical) time and (geographical-cultural) space, it nevertheless has a trans-historical and trans-local cultural meaning that emerges precisely as it is continually and successively interpreted and reinterpreted at other such times and places. The truly universal cultural meaning of such an object only emerges asymptotically, as it were, as the never to be fully completed limit of such a sequence. In the end, it is only such a never to be fully completed process of historical-philosophical interpretation of symbolic meanings that confers objectivity on both the Naturwissenschaften and the Geisteswissenschaften — and thereby reunites the two distinct sides of Kant's original synthesis


Selected works by Cassirer:

(fuller bibliographies may be found in [Schilpp 1949], [Krois 1987]; many of Cassirer's German writings are reprinted by the Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft, Darmstadt)

Note: Cassirer's unpublished writings are now appearing in volumes edited by J. Krois and E. Schwemmer, Nachgelassene Manuskripte und Texte. Hamburg: Meiner.

Secondary and Other Relevant Literature:

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Einstein, Albert: philosophy of science | general relativity: early philosophical interpretations of | Heidegger, Martin | Kant, Immanuel | Natorp, Paul | Schlick, Moritz | Vienna Circle