Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Wed Sep 17, 2008

Dolly, the first mammal cloned from an adult body cell, came into the world as innocent as a lamb; but she has caused panic and controversy, as well as a vast academic and popular literature on the ethics and regulation of cloning. Following the announcement of her birth in February 1997 (Wilmut et al. 1997), an important question arose: if the cloning of mammals is possible, will scientists soon start cloning human beings as well; and if they did, would this be wrong or unwise? More than ten years later, many countries have legally prohibited human cloning or are in the process of doing so, and various institutions, including the United Nations and the European Parliament, are calling for a worldwide ban on all forms of human cloning.

This entry describes the most important areas of disagreement regarding the ethics of human cloning, since human cloning has been the main topic of the cloning debate.

1. What is Cloning?

Strictly speaking, cloning is the creation of a genetic copy of a sequence of DNA or of the entire genome of an organism. In the latter sense, cloning occurs naturally in the birth of identical twins and other multiples. In the debate over cloning, however, the term ‘cloning’ typically refers to somatic cell nuclear transfer (SCNT). SCNT involves transferring the nucleus of a somatic cell (any body cell other than a sperm or egg cell) into an enucleated oocyte, i.e. an oocyte from which the nucleus and thus most of the DNA has been removed. The manipulated oocyte is thereupon treated with chemicals or electric current in order to stimulate cell division and an embryo is formed. Because the embryo's nuclear DNA is that of the somatic cell it is genetically identical to the organism from which the somatic cell was obtained.

Dolly the sheep was the first mammal ever to be cloned using SCNT. Ian Wilmut and his team at the Roslin Institute in Scotland replaced the nucleus from an oocyte taken from a Blackface ewe with the nucleus of a cell from the mammary gland of a six-year old Finn Dorset sheep. They transferred the resulting embryo into the womb of a surrogate ewe and approximately five months later Dolly was born. Dolly had a white face. She was genetically identical to the Finn Dorset ewe from which the somatic cell had been obtained.

Dolly, however, was not 100% genetically identical to the donor animal. Genetic material comes from two sources: the nucleus and the mitochondria in the cytoplasm of a cell. Mitochondria are organelles that serve as power sources to the cell. They contain short segments of DNA. In Dolly's case, her nuclear DNA was the same as the donor animal; other of her genetic materials came from the mitochondria in the cytoplasm of the enucleated oocyte. For the clone and the donor animal to be exact genetic copies, the oocyte too would have to come from the donor animal (or from the same maternal line as mitochondria are passed on by oocytes).

Dolly's birth was a real breakthrough, for it proved that something that had been considered biologically impossible could indeed be done. Before Dolly, scientists thought that cell differentiation was irreversible: they believed that, once a cell has differentiated into a specialized body cell, such as a skin or liver cell, the process cannot be reversed. What Dolly demonstrated was that it is possible to take a differentiated cell, turn back its clock, and make the cell behave as though it was a recently fertilized egg.

Nuclear transfer can also be done using a donor cell from an embryo instead of from an organism after birth. Cloning mammals using embryonic cells has been successful since the mid-1980s (for a history of cloning, see Wilmut et al. 2001). Another technique to produce genetically identical offspring or clones is embryo twinning or embryo splitting, in which an early embryo is split in vitro so that both parts, when implanted in a womb, can develop into individual organisms genetically identical to each other. This process occurs naturally with identical twins.

The cloning debate, however, has focussed on the use of SCNT. There are two possible uses of SCNT: creating cloned human embryos to use in research and therapy, and creating human embryos with the intention of gestating them into full-grown human beings. The latter is called ‘reproductive cloning’. The former is often referred to as ‘therapeutic cloning,’ but in this entry it will be discussed under the heading ‘cloning for research and therapy.’ Both reproductive cloning and cloning for research and therapy involve SCNT, but their aims, as well as most of the ethical concerns they raise, differ. We will first discuss cloning for research and therapy and will then proceed to outline the ethical debate surrounding reproductive cloning.

2. Cloning for Research and Therapy

In cloning for research and therapy, the embryo cloned through SCNT is not transferred into a womb; rather, it is used to obtain tissue- or patient-specific stem cells. Stem cells are very promising tools for research and therapy. Their unique capacities to divide and self-renew for long periods of time and to differentiate into different types of body cells make them invaluable tools in what is now called ‘regenerative medicine’. Stem cells could serve as a virtually inexhaustible source of replacement cells to regenerate diseased or damaged organs and tissues. They could, for example, be induced to differentiate into cardiomyocytes to replace damaged heart tissue or into dopamine producing cells for treatment of Parkinson's disease. One possible source of stem cells is the human embryo at the blastocyst stage. Embryonic stem cells are especially valuable because they can divide easily and are pluripotent, i.e. they have the capacity to give rise to any of the around 200 different cell types of the human body. Embryonic stem cells obtained from cloned embryos have the important advantage that they will not be rejected by the patient's body after transplantation; given that the patient is the donor of the somatic cell, the cells or tissue coming from the embryo will be genetically identical to the patient's other body cells. Cloning, in other words, opens the way to autologous embryonic stem cell transplantation.

In January 2008, a research team in California was the first to succeed in creating human embryos in the blastocyst stage using SCNT (French et al. 2008). Of the five blastocysts created, however, only one could be proven to be a clone. The scientists were not able to extract embryonic stem cells from the blastocysts since all the material was used for DNA analyses. The derivation of human embryos by SCNT is still in its infancy stages, and no research team has succeeded in deriving hES cells from human clones. Cloning for therapy is thus not likely to bear fruition in the short term, if it will ever prove valuable at all. Apart from unsolved technical difficulties with nuclear transfer, much basic research in embryonic stem cell research would be needed. The term ‘therapeutic cloning’ has been criticized precisely for this reason. It suggests that therapy using embryonic stem cells from cloned embryos is already reality. In the phase before clinical trials, critics say, it is only reasonable to refer to research on nuclear transfer as ‘research cloning’ or ‘cloning for biomedical research’ (President's Council on Bioethics (PCBE) 2002, de Wert and Mummery 2003).

Cloning for research will in all likelihood be the most promising application of SCNT. Stem cells obtained from cloned embryos could be highly valuable for the creation of cellular models of human diseases. Cloning of a single skin cell, for example, could be used to produce large amounts of cells and tissue from a patient with a certain disease, which could then be experimented upon to understand why disease occurs. Such cellular models of human diseases could also be used for drug screening and toxicity testing. For example, hepatocytes derived from cloned embryos with various genetic and disease backgrounds could be used for predicting liver toxicity of drug candidates. Cloning research could also help to significantly increase our knowledge about early human development and the underlying mechanisms regulating cell growth and differentiation, which would provide better knowledge and control over the manipulation and reprogramming of cells within patients.

Cloning for research and therapy seems to show great promise for future research and perhaps therapy, then; but it has also raised various concerns.

2.1 Creating and Killing Embryos for Stem Cells

Much of the debate about the ethics of cloning for research and therapy turns on a basic disagreement about how we should treat early human embryos. As it is currently done, the isolation of embryonic stem cells destroys the embryo. Moreover, in cloning for research and therapy, embryos are created solely for the purpose of deriving stem cells. Views on whether it is permissible (and if so, under what conditions) to create embryos solely for instrumental use differ profoundly.

Some argue that an embryo is a person or at least should be treated as if it were one; on these views, creating and killing embryos for stem cells is a serious moral wrong. These positions state that embryos should never be deliberately harmed or killed, even if this could save many lives (Deckers 2007). In contrast, some consider the early embryo as a cluster of cells or as human tissue lacking moral status. A common view among such proponents is that, given its promising potential, conducting embryonic stem cell and cloning research is a moral imperative (Devolder & Savulescu 2006). In between these polar positions are various intermediate views which claim that, although the embryo has moral or symbolic value and therefore merits respect, using embryos for research might sometimes be justified. Respect can be demonstrated, it is typically argued, by using embryos only for research that has considerable potential for benefiting many people and that cannot be done using less controversial means, and by acknowledging the use of embryos for research with a sense of regret or loss (Robertson 1995, Steinbock 2001). One common intermediate view holds that the use of surplus IVF embryos to obtain stem cells is consonant with the respect owed to the embryo, whereas the creation and use of cloned embryos for these purposes is not. According to this view, the morally relevant difference is that, in the case of surplus IVF embryos, each of the embryos was created in the hope that it would develop into a child. Each embryo was created for its own sake, or at least had a chance to continue living. By contrast, in cloning for research, embryos are created for instrumental use only; they are created and treated as a mere means, which some regard as incompatible with a respectful attitude towards the embryo (National Bioethics Advisory Commission (NBAC) 1999). Others (including both proponents and opponents of the use of embryos in research) have denied that there is a moral difference between using surplus IVF embryos and cloned embryos as a source of stem cells. In their opinion, if killing embryos for research is wrong, it is wrong regardless of the embryo's origin (Doerflinger 1999, Devolder 2005).

A less common view states that obtaining stem cells from cloned embryos poses fewer ethical problems than obtaining stem cells from surplus IVF embryos. Hansen (2002) has advanced this view, arguing that embryos resulting from SCNT do not have the same moral status we normally accord to other embryos: he calls the combination of a somatic nucleus and an enucleated egg a “transnuclear egg”, which, he says, is a mere “artifact” with no “natural purpose” or potential “to evolve into an embryo and eventually a human being,” and therefore falls outside the category of human beings. McHugh (2004) and Kiessling (2001) advance a similar argument. On their view, obtaining stem cells from cloned embryos is less ethically problematic because embryos resulting from SCNT are better thought of as tissue culture, whereas IVF represents instrumental support for human reproduction. Since creating offspring is not the goal, they argue, it is misleading to use the term ‘embryo’ or ‘zygote’ to refer to the product of SCNT. Their suggested terms include ‘clonote’ and ‘ovasome’.

2.2 Research Protections and the Need for Oocytes

If it is to become successful, more research would need to be done on cloning techniques. Given the loss rates involved, such research would require a large number of eggs or oocytes. Oocyte donation involves various risks and discomforts (for a review of the risks see Committee on Assessing the Medical Risks of Human Oocyte Donation for Stem Cell Research et al. 2007).

Among the many issues raised by participating in such donation is what model of informed consent should be applied. Unlike women who are considering IVF, non-medical oocyte donors are not clinical patients. They do not stand to derive any reproductive or medical benefit themselves (though Kalfoglou and Gittelsohn 2000 argue that they may derive a “psychological” benefit). Magnus and Cho (2005) have argued that this group of donating women should not be classified as research subjects since, unlike in other research, the risks to the donor do not lie in the research itself but in the procurement of the materials required for the research. They have suggested that a new category named ‘research donors’ be created for those who expose themselves to substantial risk only for the benefit of others (in this case unidentifiable people in the future) and where the risk is incurred not in the actual research but in the procurement of the materials for the research. Informed consent for altruistic organ donation by living donors to strangers has also been suggested as a model, since, in both cases, the benefits will be for strangers and not for the donor. Critics of this latter suggestion have pointed out, however, that there is a disanalogy between these two sorts of donation. The general ethical rule reflected in regulations concerning altruistic donation, namely that there must be a high chance of a good outcome for the patient, is violated in the case of egg donation for cloning research (George 2007). Mertes and Pennings (2007) believe that although it makes sense to regard non-medical oocyte donors as a special category, that doesn't mean that there are new ethical issues to be considered. Their view is that oocyte donation for cloning should be approached with the same set of principles that are currently applied to other types of research with healthy research subjects: risks and benefits need to be balanced, and concerns about informed consent and possible undue inducement or exploitation of research donors should be carefully considered.

Given the risks for the donor in the absence of direct medical benefit, and given that the benefits for research are uncertain, it is not surprising that the number of altruistic non-medical oocyte donations is very low. Financial incentives might be needed to increase the supply of oocytes for cloning research. But this raises concerns about the commodification of human reproductive material, undue inducement, and the exploitation of women. In some countries, including the US, selling and buying eggs is legal. Some object to these practices because they consider oocytes as integral to the body and think they should be kept out of the market: on their view, the value of the human body and its parts should not be expressed in terms of money or other fungible goods. Some also worry that, through commercialization of oocytes, women themselves may become objects of instrumental use (Alpers and Lo 1995). Many agree, however, that a concern for commodification does not justify a complete ban on payment of oocyte donors and that justice requires that they be financially compensated for the inconvenience, burden, and medical risk they have endured, as is standard for other research subjects (Steinbock 2004, Mertes and Pennings 2007).

A related concern is the effect of financial or other offers of compensation on the voluntariness of oocyte provision. Women, especially economically disadvantaged women from developing countries, might be unduly induced or even coerced into selling their eggs (Dickinson 2002). Baylis and McLeod (2007) have highlighted how difficult it is concomitantly to avoid both undue inducement and exploitation: a price that is too low risks exploitation; a price that avoids exploitation risks undue inducement.

Concerns about exploitation are not limited to concerns about payment, as became clear in the ‘Hwang scandal’ (for a review, see Saunders and Savulescu 2008). Woo-Suk-Hwang, a leading Korean stem cell scientist, had claimed to be the first to clone human embryos using SCNT and to extract stem cells from them. In addition to find that Hwang apparently fabricated many of his research results, Korea's National Bioethics Committee also found that Hwang had pressured junior members of his lab to donate eggs for his cloning experiments.

Some authors have argued that regulating the market in oocytes could minimize ethical concerns raised by the commercialization of oocytes and could be consistent with respect for women (Resnik 2001, Gruen 2007). Researchers are also investigating the use of alternative sources of oocytes for cloning research, including fetal oocytes, and eggs from adult ovaries obtained post mortem or during operation, oocytes derived from stem cells, as well as animal oocytes. Others have suggested asking people about to undergo IVF to donate one or two of their oocytes, perhaps in return for a reduced fee for their fertility treatment, as these women already face the risk of hormone stimulation. If cloning for therapy becomes an option, families, eager to help their dying or sick relative, may well volunteer sufficient oocytes for the treatment of their sick relative.

2.3 Economic and Social Justice Considerations

As McLaren (2001) has pointed out, personalized cloning therapies are likely to remain labor intensive and hence expensive; as such, they would probably be a realistic option only for the very rich, which may raise concerns about social justice, as well as concerns about economic efficiency. On the other hand, therapies may become cheaper, easier and accessible to more people after some time Moreover, cloning may cure diseases and not only treat symptoms. Regardless of price, it remains true that the cloning procedure takes a long time, rendering it inappropriate for certain clinical applications (e.g. myocardial infarction, acute liver failure or traumatic or infectious spinal cord damage). If cloning for therapy would become available, it would likely be reserved for chronic conditions. Ian Wilmut (1997) has suggested that treatments could be targeted to maximize benefit. An older person with heart disease, for example, could be treated with stem cells that are not a genetic match, take drugs to suppress his immune system for the rest of his life, and live with the side-effects. A younger person might benefit from stem cells that match exactly. Devolder and Savulescu (2006) have argued that objections about economic cost are most forceful against ‘cloning for self-transplantation’ rather than cloning for developing cellular models of human disease. The latter will enable research into human diseases and may lead to the development of drugs to treat common diseases, such as cancer and heart disease, which afflict people all over the world, and perhaps in inexpensive ways. Moreover, cloning research is not necessarily more labor intensive than experiments on cells and tissues now done in animals, these commentators say.

Some are skeptical about the claimed benefits of cloning for research and therapy. For many diseases in which cloned embryonic stem cells might offer a therapy, there are also alternative treatments and/or preventive measures in development, including gene therapy, pharmacogenomical solutions and treatments based on nanotechnology. Further, other stem cell sources might enable us to achieve the same aims as cloning, including adult stem cells, embryonic stem cell banks with defined major histocompatibility complex backgrounds, blastocysts with diseases identified through preimplantation genetic diagnosis, entities with a lower or undetermined status (e.g., hybrids and parthenotes), or genetically manipulated embryonic stem cells to reduce or actively combat immune rejection.

Although scientists have said that these alternatives are unlikely to completely replace the need for embryo cloning, a recent development has raised hopes that it might do so. In November 2007, two separate research teams announced that they had reprogrammed human skin cells into embryonic stem-cell- like cells (Takahashi et al. 2007, Yu et al. 2007). They generated what has been labelled ‘induced pluripotent stem cells’ (iPS cells) by inserting four transcription factors into the genome of a human skin cell using retroviruses. Soon afterwards, proof of principle was provided that iPS cells can be used for therapy, at least in mice (Hanna 2007). Unlike the application of cloning technology, this method could provide tissue- and patient-specific cells without relying on the need for human eggs or the creation and destruction of embryos. The technique would also be less costly and less labour intensive, and would avoid most of the ethical pitfalls of cloning and hES cell research.

This promise notwithstanding, many scientists have warned that it would be premature to stop all cloning research. iPS cells are not identical to embryonic stem cells and different methods of obtaining pluripotent stem cells might prove more useful for particular purposes. Cloning, for example, may be capable of teaching us things that iPS cells cannot, and different diseases might be treatable by different types of stem cells or some combination of stem cells.

2.4 A Slippery Slope to Reproductive Cloning

Slippery slope arguments express the fear that permitting a certain practice may place us on a slippery slope to a dangerous or otherwise unacceptable outcome. Several commentators have argued that allowing cloning for research and therapy is a first step that would place us on a ‘slippery slope’ to reproductive cloning. As Leon Kass (1998, 702) put it: “once the genies put the cloned embryos into the bottles, who can strictly control where they go?”

Others are more skeptical about slippery slope arguments and think that effective legislation can prevent us from sliding down the slope (Savulescu 1999, de Wert and Mummery 2003). If reproductive cloning is unacceptable, these critics say, it is reasonable to prohibit this specific technology rather than to ban non-reproductive applications of cloning. The UK and Belgium, for example, allow cloning research but prohibit the implantation of cloned embryos in a womb.

Apart from the question of how slippery the slope might be, another question raised by such arguments concerns the feared development —reproductive cloning—and whether it is really ethically objectionable. Profound disagreement exists about the answer to this question.

3. Human Reproductive Cloning

The central argument in favor of reproductive cloning is expansion of opportunities for reproduction. Human reproductive cloning could offer a new means for prospective parents to satisfy their reproductive desires. It is most often presented as a possible treatment for infertility. For those unable to produce embryos of their own, cloning opens up the possibility of using donated eggs (or the woman's own eggs if she is able to produce viable eggs) and then using a somatic cell nucleus of the mother or that of her partner to create a child closely genetically related to one of them. If the female partner's egg is used to clone the genome of her male partner, the resulting child would be genetically related to both parents since the egg contains the mother's mitochondrial DNA. Helping infertile people to have a child through cloning has been defended on the grounds of human wellbeing, personal autonomy, and the satisfaction of the natural inclination to produce offspring (Häyry 2003, Strong 2008). Further, and in particular, cloning could be used to provide homosexual couples with genetically related children. Offering individuals or couples the possibility to reproduce using cloning technology has been said to be consistent with the right to reproductive freedom, which, according to some, implies the right to choose what kind of children we will have (Brock 1998, 145). Some authors think the main benefit of reproductive cloning is that it would enable prospective parents to control what genome their children would be endowed with (Fletcher 1988, Harris 1997 and 2004, Pence 1998, 101–6, Tooley 1998). By cloning the genome of a healthy person, parents may avoid passing on inheritable diseases to their child. People might also choose to give their child the genome of a person with good health and other desirable characteristics in order to provide the child with a wide array of possible life plans. Another possible use of reproductive cloning is to help create a child that is a tissue match for a sick sibling. The stem cells from the umbilical cord blood or from the bone marrow of the cloned child could be used to cure the diseased child. Such children, referred to as ‘saviour siblings’, have already been created through sexual reproduction or, more efficiently, through a combination of IVF, preimplantation genetic diagnosis and HLA testing.

Many people, however, have expressed objections to human reproductive cloning and think it should be legally prohibited worldwide. Some have no objections to reproductive cloning but do not promote it either. In criticising the arguments that have been produced against cloning they sometimes have been misidentified as ‘defenders’ of cloning. However, they seldom recommend the practice, being for the most part content to expose the problematic nature of many of the arguments against it.

What follows is an outline of some of the main areas of concern and disagreement about human reproductive cloning.

3.1 Safety and Efficiency

Despite the successful creation of viable cloned offspring in various species during the past decade, researchers have very limited understanding of how cloning works on the subcellular and molecular level. The rate of abortions, stillbirths and developmental abnormalities in cloned mammals has been very high. Although the overall efficiency and safety of SCNT has increased steadily over the past ten years, it is not yet a safe and efficient process. Another source of problems is the possible shortening of telomeres. Telomeres are repetitive DNA sequences at the tip of chromosomes. As an animal gets older, the length of the telomeres gets shorter. When the telomeres of a cell get so short that they disappear, the cell dies. Shortly after Dolly was born, scientists thought that she might suffer from premature aging as she was conceived from the nuclear DNA of a six-year-old ewe. If she inherited the shortened telomeres of the older ewe, her lifespan too might be shorter. This has led to concern about the longevity of cloned humans, and concerns that such individuals, as teenagers, might become demented or get other diseases associated with aging. More recently, scientists have offered some reassurance, after successfully cloning healthy mammals with normal telomere length (see for example Kubota et al. 2004); but further research would need to be done for full reassurance.

Many have argued that concerns about safety indicate that cloning in humans should be prohibited. The strongest version of this argument states that it would be wrong now to produce a child using SCNT because it would constitute a case of wrongful procreation (Strong 2005). Some adopt a consent-based objection and condemn cloning because the person conceived cannot consent for being exposed to significant risks involved in the procedure (Kass 1998, PCBE 2002). Lane (2006), citing Derek Parfit's non-identity problem, has argued against these views and claims that even if reproductive cloning is unsafe, it may still be morally permissible if there are no safer means to bring that very child into existence so long as the child is expected to have a life worth living. Scientists have said, however, that with the actual rate of advancement in cloning, one cannot exclude a future in which the safety and efficiency of SCNT will be comparable or superior to that of IVF or even sexual reproduction. A remaining question, then, is whether, if cloning does become safe and efficient, those who condemn cloning because of its experimental nature should continue to condemn it morally and legally. Some authors have reasoned that if, in the future, cloning becomes safer than sexual reproduction, perhaps they should instead make it our reproductive method of choice (Fletcher 1988, Harris 2004 chapter 4).

3.2 Welfare of the Individual Conceived through Cloning

3.2.1 Personal Identity, Individuality and Autonomy

One of the main concerns raised by human cloning is that it will threaten personal identity and individuality, which in turn could lead to reduced autonomy of the person conceived through cloning (Ramsey 1966, Kitcher 1997, Annas 1998, Kass 1998). In particular, those created from cloning who know the person they were cloned from may experience difficulties in establishing their identity. In its report on human cloning, the President's Council on Bioethics (2002, Chapter 5) wrote that being genetically unique is “an emblem of independence and individuality” and allows us to go forward “with a relatively indeterminate future in front of us”. In a resolution on cloning the European Parliament (1997) claimed that cloning violates each individual's ‘right to his or her own genetic identity’.

Others have argued against these concerns. They refer to the millions of already existing ‘clones’: genetically identical twins. Tooley (1998, 79–82), for example, writes that if we reproduce knowing that in doing so we will create twins, this does not seem to violate any right. Moreover, these critics point out, notwithstanding the fact that twins sometimes look very similar and often share character traits, habits and preferences, each twin considers him or herself as a unique person with a distinct identity, as do their friends and relatives (Segal 2000). Others point to the widely accepted view that what and who we become is influenced not only by our genes, but also the complex and irreproducible context in which our life takes place. Individuals created from cloning would, in essence, be ‘delayed’ twins, which would, according to some authors, make them even more distinct from their genetically identical predecessor (Devolder and Braeckman 2001, Harris 1997 and 2004, Tooley 1997, 78).

Other commentators, however, have argued that twins provide a poor model for the psychological and social aspects of cloning. Levick (2004, 1–23), for example has argued that the twin model fails to reflect important aspects of the parent-child relationship that would incur if the child is cloned from one of the rearing parents. Because of the dominance of the progenitor, Levick argues, the risk of reduced autonomy and confused identity may be greater for inter-generational cloned individuals than it would be for twins. Søren Holm expresses concern that ‘the clone will lead a life in the shadow’ of the genetically identical predecessor (Holm 1998). The cloned individual's life may be compared to the life of the older twin; people may have problematic expectations of the clone; and she may feel damaging pressure to live up to these expectations (Kass 1998, Levick 2004, 101, Sandel 2007, 57–62). Others worry that she (or he, of course) may have the feeling that her life has already been lived, that she is predetermined to do the same things and repeat the choices made by the genetically identical foregoer, and may thereby have difficulty assuming responsibility for her actions (Habermas 2003, 62–3, Levy and Lotz 2005). According to some authors, such threats to a cloned individual's personal identity and individuality may severely restrict the array of life plans available to him or her and, consequently, may violate a right to ‘ignorance about one's future’ (Jonas 1974) or to ‘an open future’ (Feinberg 1980). Even if it is not only genes that determine who and what we become, the cloned individual's perception may still limit a sense of self and independence and thus reduce his or her autonomy, these commentators argue.

Others disagree (Harris 1997 and 2004, Tooley 1998, 84–5, Brock 1998, Pence 1998). They believe the aforementioned concerns involve a misguided belief in genetic determinism that could be minimized by adequate education and information. Further, they argue, even if people persist in these mistaken beliefs and their attitudes or actions lead to cloned individuals believing they do not have an open future, this does not imply that the clone's right to ignorance about one's personal future or to an open future has actually been violated (Brock 1998, Buchanan et al. 2000, 198). Some authors have also pointed out that a younger twin could derive benefits from knowing the older twin's life-course, as he or she can learn from the older twins' mistakes (Brock 1998, 154). Others point to comparisons with what we already accept in sexual reproduction. Harris (2004, chapter three), for instance, has argued that if possible psychological harm arising from knowledge of one's genetic origins is a sufficient ground to ban reproduction, then interference in reproductive liberty would be very frequent, as there are many children now who experience psychological harm because of such knowledge. Pence and others point out that high expectations are true of most parenting and that parents with high expectations nonetheless usually give their children the best chances to lead a happy and successful life (Pence 1998, 138). Many of these critics also argue that parents reduce or increase the array of life plans available to their children all the time through non-genetic means such as their education. In their view, rather than prohibiting cloning, the more rational strategy would be to concentrate on how we can help to prevent parents from restricting the array of available life plans open to their children, regardless of the way in which the children were conceived.

3.2.2 Replacement Children

In 2004, US fertility doctor Panos Zavos claimed to have created a cloned embryo using tissues from deceased people, one of them an 11-year-old girl who had died in a car crash. Such a result, he stated, pointed to the possibility that people in the future could replace the deceased. Cloning for the purpose of trying to create a replacement child has raised the concern that parents will compare the new child with the deceased child and that the “ghost of the dead child” will get more attention and devotion than its replacement, which could adversely affect the replacement child's self-esteem. Parents may expect the child to be like the lost child, or some idealized image of it, which could hamper the development of the replacement child's own identity (Levick 2004, 111–32).

Many people agree that, should reproductive cloning ever become a new reproductive technique, efforts should be made to help candidate parents understand that bringing loved ones back to life is impossible and that the child created through cloning is a different person. Others are less concerned with this issue, arguing that, even if their intentions or reasons are misguided, creating a replacement child is one of the many self-centered reasons why people decide to have children and is not intrinsically related to cloning (Brock 1998, 148–9; Pence 1998, 131–40).

3.2.3 Awareness of Genetic Predispositions for Diseases

Another area of disagreement is the impact on the individual conceived through cloning of his or her knowledge about the genetically identical predecessor's medical history. For instance, a person conceived through cloning who knows that his genetic parent has developed a severe single gene disease at the age of forty knows chances are very high that the same will happen to him or her. Unlike people who choose to have themselves genetically tested, clones who know their genetic parent's medical history will be involuntarily informed. Disagreement exists on whether or not this is a good thing. Some have pointed out that having information about one's genetic predispositions can prolong one's life by suggesting methods of reducing the risks revealed by genetic information, including behavioural changes and preventive medication. Others are concerned about psychological consequences for the clone, especially when the inherited disease is non-treatable, as is the case with Huntington's disease.

Concerns about genetics leads others to the opposite conclusion: John Harris, for instance (2004, chapter 1), argues that when we clone we can have available a ‘tried and tested’ genome, not one created by the genetic lottery of sexual reproduction and the random combination of chromosomes. If we choose our cell donor wisely, Harris argues, we will be able to protect the clone from many hereditary disorders and many other genetic problems.

3.2.4 Societal Prejudice and Respect for Clones

Some are concerned that clones may be the victims of discrimination who will not be respected as full persons (Deech 1999, Levick 2004, 185, 187). Savulescu (see 2005 in Other Internet Resource) has referred to possible negative attitudes towards clones as ‘clonism’: a new form of discrimination against a group of humans who are different in a non-morally significant way. Savulescu and others have argued that concerns about such discriminatory reactions and prejudicial attitudes is not a sound ground for banning cloning; they argue that, rather than limiting people to make use of assisted reproduction techniques, we should combat existing prejudices and discrimination (see also Pence 1998, 46, Harris 2004, 92–3). Macintosh (2005, 119–21) has warned that these prejudices as well as misguided stereotypes about human clones are actually reinforced by common objections to cloning. For example, saying that a clone would not have a personal identity prejudges the clone as inferior or fraudulent (the idea that originals are more valuable than their copies) or even less than human (as individuality is seen as an essential characteristic of human nature).

3.2.5 Complex Family Relationships

Another concern is that a cloned individual would be confused about his or her kinship ties (Kass 1998, O'Neil 2002, 67–8). Cloning, it is worried, will blur generational boundaries. For example, a woman who has a child conceived through cloning would actually be the twin of her child and the woman's mother would, genetically, be its mother, not grandmother. Some have argued against these concerns, replying that a cloned child would not necessarily be more confused about his or her family ties than other children. There are children now who never knew their genetic parents, or whose nurturing parents are not their genetic parents, or who think that their nurturing father is also their genetic father when they were actually conceived with the sperm of the nurturing mother's lover, or have four nurturing parents because of a divorce, or are nurtured by their grandparents. While these complex family relationships can be troubling for some children, they are not insurmountable, these critics say. As with all children, the most important thing is the relation with people who nurture and educate them, and children usually know very well who these are (Harris 2004, 77–8).

Onora O'Neil (2002, 67–8) argues that such responses are misplaced. While she acknowledges that there are already children now with confused family relationships, she argues that it is very different when prospective parents seek such potentially confused relationships for their children from the start.

3.3 Effects on Others and Society as a Whole

3.3.1 Adoption and the Importance of Genetic Links

Levy and Lotz (2005) and Levick (2005, 185) have advanced an argument against cloning on the basis of potential harmful effects, not on the cloned individual, but on other children. One concern is that the availability of reproductive cloning could reduce the adoption rate and hence would work against the interests of children waiting to be adopted. In response, Strong (2008) has argued that this effect is uncertain, and that there are other, probably more effective, ways to help such children or to prevent them from ending up in such a situation. Moreover, if cloning is banned, infertile couples may opt for embryo or gamete donation rather than adoption.

This discussion should be considered in the light of profound disagreement about the importance of genetic links between family members and of genetics in general. Levy and Lotz (2005), for instance, argue not only that there are no sound reasons to desire genetically related offspring, but that allowing cloning to help fulfil such a desire will have harmful effects by giving too much weight to genetics, potentially reinforcing a mistaken view that we ‘own our children’.

3.3.2 Genetic Diversity

An important concern voiced by some is the worry that, as an asexual way of reproducing, cloning would decrease genetic variation among offspring and, in the long run, might even constitute a threat to the preservation of the human race if the gene pool narrows sufficiently to threaten humanity's resistance to disease. In response, many argue that if cloning becomes possible, the number of people who will choose it as their mode of reproduction will very likely be too low to constitute a threat to genetic diversity – it would, for instance, be unlikely to be higher than natural twinning, which, occurring at a rate of 3.5/1000 children, does not seriously impact on genetic diversity. Further, even if millions of people would create children through cloning, the same genomes will not be cloned over and over: each person would have a genetic copy of his or her genome, which means the result will still be a high diversity of genomes. Others argue that, even if genetic diversity were not diminished by cloning, a society that supports reproductive cloning might be taken to imply that variety is not important. Conveying such a message in a multicultural society, these authors say, could have harmful consequences.

3.3.3 Eugenics

One of the major concerns raised by cloning is that it could lead to eugenic practices. In one sense of the term, eugenics is a positive notion: as Buchanan et al. (2000, 56) have pointed out, “the core notion of eugenics, that people's lives will probably go better if they have genes conducive to health and other advantageous traits, has lost little of its appeal.” And some see the increase in control of what kind of genome we want to pass to our children as a positive development (Fletcher 1988, Harris 1997 and 2004, Pence 1998, 101–6, Tooley 1998). But this shift ‘from chance to choice’ also raises several issues (for an extensive analysis, see Buchanan et al. 2000). First, the history of eugenics includes some of the darkest chapters of the western world in the 19th and 20th centuries (for a history of eugenics as well as an analysis of philosophical and political issues raised by eugenics, see Kevles 1985 and Paul 1995). The eugenic movements in the 19th century in the United States and Europe were responsible for hundreds of thousands of forced sterilizations, and the Nazi eugenic programs during World War II involved some of the cruellest crimes against humanity, all in the pursuit of so called ‘racial hygiene’.

More recently, the language of eugenics has made a comeback, not only among critics but also amongst proponents of these new biotechnologies. Some have called for a new ‘liberal’ eugenics (Agar 2004). Unlike the coercive and state-directed eugenics of the past, liberal eugenics defends values such as autonomy, reproductive freedom, beneficence, empathy and the avoidance of harm. Enthusiasts of liberal eugenics are interested in helping individuals to prevent or diminish the suffering and increase the well-being of their children by endowing them with certain genes. However, disagreement exists about whether and to what extent the new liberal eugenics really differs from eugenic programs in the past (Buchanan et al. 2000, Habermas 2003, Sandel 2007, 75–83). According to Sandel (2007, chapter 5), for instance, liberal eugenics might imply more state compulsion than first appears: just as governments can force children to go to school, they could require people to use genetics to have ‘better’ children. Because cloning can be used to create ‘better’ people by copying the genome of people with desirable characteristics, some are concerned that it may set a precedent for more problematic non-therapeutic interventions, such as height, eye color and intelligence

This entry is not the right place to give an account of all the concerns raised by enhancement technologies, but two important issues are directly related to cloning. Sandel (2007, 52–7) has argued that cloning and enhancement technologies may result in a society in which parents will not accept their child for what it is, reinforcing an already existing trend of heavily managed, high-pressure child-rearing or ‘hyper-parenting’. Asch and Wasserman (2005, 202) have expressed a similar concern; arguing that having more control over what features a child has can pose an “affront to an ideal of unconditioned devotion”. The second concern, most often expressed by disability rights advocates, is that if cloning is used to have ‘better’ children, it may create a more intolerant climate towards the disabled and the diseased, and that such practices can express negative judgments about people with disabilities. This argument has also been advanced in the debate about selective abortion, prenatal testing, and preimplantation genetic diagnosis. Disagreement exists about whether these effects are likely. For example, Buchanan et al. (2002, 278) have argued that one can devalue disability while valuing existing disabled people and that trying to help parents who want to avoid having a disabled child does not imply that society should make no efforts to increase accessibility for existing people with disabilities.

3.4 Human Dignity

UNESCO's Universal Declaration on the Human Genome and Human Rights (1997) was the first international instrument to condemn human reproductive cloning as a practice against human dignity. Article 11 of this Declaration states: “Practices which are contrary to human dignity, such as reproductive cloning of human beings, shall not be permitted…” This position is shared by the World Health Organization, the European Parliament and several other international instruments. Critics have pointed out that the reference to human dignity is often problematic, as it is rarely specified how human dignity is to be understood, whose dignity is at stake, and how dignity is relevant to the ethics of cloning (Harris 2004, chapter 2, Birnbacher 2005, McDougall 2008,). Some commentators state that it is the copying of a genome that violates human dignity (Kass 1998); in response, others have pointed out that this interpretation could be experienced as an offence to genetically identical twins, and that we typically do not regard twins as a threat to human dignity (although some societies in the past did), nor do we prevent twins from coming into existence. On the contrary, IVF is a widely accepted fertility treatment and we know that chances are very high that twins will result from this procedure.

Human dignity is most often related to Kant's second formulation of the Categorical Imperative, namely the idea that we should never use a human individual merely as a means to an end. Some are concerned that creating children through cloning could implicate this concept. Putnam (1997, 7–8), for example, imagines a scenario in which cloning is widely used by ordinary people to create children ‘just like so-and-so,’ causing people to view them as objects or as commodities like a new car or a new house, especially given the expense that would be involved in their creation. These critiques have also been expressed with regard to other forms of assisted reproduction; but some worry that individuals created through cloning may be more likely to be viewed as commodities because their total genetic blueprint would be chosen – they would be “fully made and not begotten” (Ramsey 1966, Kass 1998, PCBE 2002, 107).

Strong (2008) has argued that these concerns are based on a fallacious interference. It is one thing to desire genetically related children, and something else to believe that one owns one's children or that one considers one's children as objects, he writes. Other commentators, however, have pointed out that even if parents themselves will not commodify their children, cloning might still have an impact in society as a whole on people's tendencies to do so (Levy and Lotz 2005, Sandel 2007). A related concern expressed by Levick (2004, 184–5) is that allowing cloning might result in a society where ‘production on demand’ clones are sold for adoption to people who are seeking to have children with special abilities – a clearer case of treating children as objects.

The concern about using children as a mere means has been discussed in depth in the context of creating saviour siblings. According to some, a child who is created to save a sick sibling is created solely for instrumental purposes. Others have argued that, even if such a child is created as a means, this does not imply it is created merely as means. Parents have children for all kinds of instrumental reasons, including the benefit for the husband-wife relationship, continuity of the family name, and the economic and psychological benefits children provide when their parents become old. This is generally not considered to be problematic as long as the child is also valued in its own right. According to some authors, there is good reason to think that such a child will be raised in no less loving way than is normally the case (Harris 2004, 41–2, Pence 1998, Devolder 2005).

McDougall (2008) and Birmbacher (2008) have argued not that cloning is in itself a violation of human dignity, but that it can be under certain circumstances, as, for example, when it would divert scarce resources away from those who lack sufficient health to enable them to exercise basic rights and liberties.

4. Religious perspectives

No unified religious perspective on human cloning exists; indeed, there are a diversity of opinions within each individual religious tradition. For an overview of the evaluation of cloning by the main religious groups see, for example, Cole-Turner (1997) and Walters (2004). For a specifically Jewish perspective on cloning, see, for example, Lipschutz (1999), for an Islamic perspective, Sadeghi (2007) and for a Catholic perspective, Doerflinger (1999).


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feminist (topics): perspectives on reproduction and the family | personal identity | reproductive technologies