Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Collective Responsibility

First published Mon Aug 8, 2005

The notion of collective responsibility, like that of personal responsibility and shared responsibility, refers to both the causal responsibility of moral agents for harm in the world and the blameworthiness that we ascribe to them for having caused such harm. Hence, it is, like its two more purely individualistic counterparts, almost always a notion of moral, rather than purely causal, responsibility. But, unlike its two more purely individualistic counterparts, it does not associate either causal responsibility or blameworthiness with discrete individuals or locate the source of moral responsibility in the free will of individual moral agents. Instead, it associates both causal responsibility and blameworthiness with groups and locates the source of moral responsibility in the collective actions taken by these groups understood as collectives.

Since the notion of collective responsibility is part of what many contemporary philosophers refer to as group morality, it has undergone a great deal of scrutiny in recent years by methodological and normative individualists alike. Methodological individualists challenge the very possibility of associating moral agency with groups, as distinct from their individual members, and normative individualists argue that collective responsibility violates principles of both individual responsibility and fairness. Defenders of collective responsibility set out to show that the majority of critical arguments made about collective responsibility are unfounded and that collective responsibility, along with its assumptions of group intentions, collective actions, and group blameworthiness, is both coherent as an intellectual construct and fair to ascribe in at least some, if not all, cases.

1. Collective Responsibility: the Controversies

While the notion of moral responsibility traditionally understood grounds moral blameworthiness in the wills of discrete individuals who freely cause harm, the notion of collective responsibility associates both causation and blameworthiness with groups and construes groups as moral agents in their own right. Hence, it does not fit easily into the prevailing philosophical literature on moral responsibility, which generally asks about the relationship between free will and determinism. Nor has it been readily accepted by those who are used to construing moral agency in purely individualistic terms. Indeed, the notion of collective responsibility has become the source of three major philosophical controversies over the years by virtue of its very nature as a group-based construct.

The first controversy focuses on the relationship between collective responsibility, on the one hand, and the values of individual liberty, justice, and non-suffering, on the other. How, participants in this controversy ask, can we ascribe moral responsibility to groups in society for harms that only a few of its members directly caused without eroding individual responsibility or violating principles of individual freedom? How can we ascribe collective responsibility in such cases without treating those individuals who did not directly cause harm unjustly? What happens in cases where the harm in question is both very serious and genuinely the product of many hands or the group as a whole? How can we not ascribe collective responsibility to groups in these cases and still hope to prevent such harm from occurring in the future?

The second controversy also places the group-based nature of collective responsibility at the center of our attention. But it does not, like is normative counterpart, concentrate on the consequences of ascribing collective responsibility in practice. Instead, it concentrates on the metaphysical foundations of collective responsibility and its coherence as an intellectual construct. How, its participants ask, can we understand the notion of collective responsibility as a matter of moral—and not just causal—responsibility? Is it possible for groups, as distinct from their members, to cause harm in the sense required by moral responsibility? to act as collectives? to have intentions? Is it possible for groups, as distinct from their members, to be morally blameworthy for bringing about harm? to be guilty as moral agents?

The third controversy, interestingly enough, is not really about the moral responsibility of groups at all, even though it is couched in the language of collective moral responsibility. Instead, it is about the moral responsibility of individuals who belong to groups in cases where these groups are themselves thought to be morally responsible for particular cases of harm. How, its participants ask, can we distribute collective responsibility across individual members of such a group? Does it makes sense to distribute collective responsibility in general? Is it appropriate to hold individual group members morally responsible for harm that other group members caused? that the group itself caused? that the group as a whole failed to prevent? If so, under what conditions and with respect to what particular kinds of groups? random collections of individuals? interest-based groups? corporate entities?

While those participating in these three controversies have focused their attention primarily on the formulation of collective responsibility as a concept rather than on the politics of ascribing collective responsibility in practice, they have not made their arguments in a social and political vacuum. Nor have they ignored the various hard cases of collective responsibility that have racked the consciences of historical actors since WWII. Indeed, participants in all three controversies have placed a variety of such cases, ranging from the extermination of Jews during WWII to the atrocities of the Vietnam War to the racist treatment of American blacks, at the center of their attention in an effort to establish whether or not particular groups in history can legitimately be considered morally responsible for the suffering that their fellow group members have brought about through their faulty actions.

2. Making Sense of Collective Responsibility: Actions, Intentions, and Group Solidarity

Almost all of those now writing about collective responsibility agree that collective responsibility would make sense if it were merely an aggregative phenomenon. But they disagree markedly about whether collective responsibility makes sense as a non-distributive phenomenon, i.e., as a phenomenon that transcends the contributions of particular group members. In this context, as in many others, skeptics set the agenda. Two claims become crucial. The first is that groups, unlike individuals, cannot form intentions and hence cannot be understood to act or to cause harm qua groups. The second is that groups, as distinct from their individual members, cannot be understood as morally blameworthy in the sense required by moral responsibility.

Both claims come out of classical methodological individualism of the sort articulated by Max Weber (Weber 1914) and H. D. Lewis (Lewis 1948) in their respective rejections of collective responsibility. In Economy and Society Vol. I, Weber (Weber 1914) argues that collective responsibility makes no sense both because we cannot isolate genuinely collective actions, as distinct from identical actions of many persons, and because groups, unlike the individuals who belong to them, cannot think as groups or formulate intentions of the kind normally thought to be necessary to actions. H. D. Lewis follows suit in his own arguments and couples his methodological individualism with a sense of moral outrage at the idea of blaming individuals for the actions of others. “Value,” Lewis writes, “belongs to the individual and it is the individual who is the sole bearer of moral responsibility.” “No one is morally guilty except in relation to some conduct which he himself considered to be wrong” ”Collective responsibility is … barbarous.” (Lewis 1948, pp. 3-6.)

Contemporary critics of collective responsibility do not generally go as far as Lewis does here in equating collective responsibility with barbarism. But they do generally share their predecessors' skepticism about the possibility of both group intentions and genuinely collective actions. (See below.) Likewise, they, too, worry about the fairness of ascribing collective responsibility to individuals who do not themselves directly cause harm or who do not bring about harm purposefully “It would be unfair,” Stephen Sverdlik writes, “whether we are considering a result produced by more than one person's action or by a single person, to blame a person for a result that he or she did not intend to produce.” (Sverdlik 1987, p. 68)

Both of these claims—that genuinely collective actions are not possible and that it would be unfair to consider agents morally blameworthy for harm that they did not bring about purposively—rest on two normative assumptions that are key to the critic's position. Both concern the importance of intentions. The first is that actions—whether they are individual or collective—necessarily begin with intentions. (Otherwise, they are not actions but instead kinds of behavior.) The second is that moral blameworthiness has its source in and requires the existence of bad intentions—or at least moral faultiness—on the part of those being held responsible.

The first assumption, namely, that all actions begin with intentions, is very useful to critics because it enables them to write group intentions into the definition of collective action itself and hence render group intentions a necessary condition of collective responsibility. J. Angelo Corlett's definition of a collective action is typical here. According to Corlett,

[a] collective (intentional) action is an action the subject of which is a collective intentional agent. A collective behavior is a doing or behavior that is the result of a collective, though not the result of its intentions. A collective action is caused by the beliefs and desires (wants) of the collective itself, whether or not such beliefs and desires can be accounted for or explained in individualistic terms (Corlett 2001, p. 575).

The second assumption, namely, that moral blameworthiness of all kinds is grounded in the bad intentions of moral agents who cause harm, is also very useful to critics of collective responsibility, since it enables them to stipulate that collective responsibility requires, not just group intentions, but the ability of groups to have bad intentions or at least to be morally faulty. How, critics ask, can groups, as distinct from their individual members, be understood to have bad intentions? to be morally faulty? to have a moral character, faulty or not? How, in other words, can they be understood as appropriate bearers of moral blameworthiness, guilt, or shame?

A majority of critics here concentrate on showing either that actions are associated exclusively with individuals, not groups, or that groups, which do not have minds of their own, cannot make choices or hold beliefs in the sense required by the formulation of intentions. H. D Lewis concentrates on making both points in his 1948 critique of collective responsibility. So, too, does J. W. N. Watkins (Watkins 1957). Later methodological individualists such as Alvin Goldman (Goldman 1970), Stephen Sverdlik (1987), J. Angelo Corlett (Corlett 2001), and Jan Narveson (2002), unlike their predecessors, are generally willing to acknowledge the sensibility of collective responsibility in a limited number of cases. But, they, too, draw attention to the host of difficulties that arise for collective responsibility as a moral construct once we acknowledge the simple fact that collectives do not have full blown mental lives.

Critics of collective responsibility pay somewhat less attention to the nature of collective moral blameworthiness than they do to the nature of collective actions. But they do sometimes worry about the appropriateness of associating moral blameworthiness with groups, as distinct from group members. R. S. Downie, among others, places what turns out to be a very traditional notion of moral responsibility at the center of his attention and argues that

[c]ollectives do not have moral faults, since they don't make moral choices, and hence they cannot properly be ascribed moral responsibility. … For there to be moral responsibility there must be blameworthiness involving a morally faulty decision, and this can only occur at the individual level (Downie 1969, p. 67).

Jan Narveson goes as far in this context as to argue that the bearers of moral blameworthiness have to be individuals because only individuals can have moral agency. “Nothing else,” Narveson writes, can literally be the bearer of full responsibility.” (Narveson 2002, p. 179) The word “literally” here turns out to be significant for those writing on collective responsibility. For, it contrasts with the sense shared by Narveson and others that we might in the end be able to make sense of collective responsibility in metaphorical terms by treating individual moral agency, including both agent causation and moral blameworthiness, as a metaphor for group agency of the sort relevant to moral responsibility traditionally understood.

Defenders of collective responsibility rely on a variety of philosophical strategies to debunk the above claims and to justify both the possibility of collective responsibility in some, if not all, cases, and the coherence of collective responsibility as an intellectual construct. One of these strategies has been simply to point out both that we blame groups all the time in practice and that we do so in a way that is difficult to analyze with the precepts of methodological individualism. David Cooper, among others, uses this strategy to great effect in his own defense of collective responsibility. According to Cooper, [t]here is an obvious point to be recognized and that obvious point is that responsibility is ascribed to collectives, as well as to individual persons. Blaming attitudes are held towards collective as well as towards individuals,” (Cooper 1968, p. 258.)

Cooper and others who rely on this strategy generally acknowledge that we may of course be wrong in our use of language. Hence, they find it necessary to show, not just that we ascribe blame to collectives in practice, but that the collective blame that we ascribe cannot be analyzed in terms of individual blame. Cooper himself takes on this project by exploring particular cases of blame, e.g., those associated with sports clubs and nations, that, he argues, can only attach to groups. According to Cooper, when we look at how such collectives act, we see that whether we regard statements about collectives as propositional functions or not, we cannot deduce from them statements about particular individuals. “This is so,” he argues, “because the existence of a collective is compatible with varying membership. No determinate set of individuals is necessary for the existence of the collective.” (Cooper 1968, p. 260)

In a similar vein, Peter French focuses on that class of predicates that, he contends, can only be true of collectives. According to French,

[t]here is a class of predicates that just cannot be true of individuals, that can only be true of collectives. Examples of such predicates abound … and include ‘disbanded’ (most uses of), ‘lost the football game’, ‘elected a president’, and ‘passed an amendment’. … Methodological individualism would be at a loss in this context. (French 1998, p. 37)

A majority of those who defend the possibility of group actions in this context rely on linguistic analyses. But there are also those who, like Larry May, turn instead to social theory and to the existentialist tradition. May himself uses the relational theory of Jean-Paul Sartre to argue that groups can legitimately be ascribed actions in cases where individuals are related to one another and act in ways together that would not be possible if they acted alone. May sets down two relationally-based conditions under which we can legitimately say of an action that it is collective rather than individual—which for May means, not trans-individual, but relational. The first condition is that the individuals in question be related to each other so as to enable each to act in ways that they could not manage on their own. The second is that some individuals be authorized to represent their own actions as the actions of the group as a whole (May 1987, pp. 55).

What about group intentions? Here, interestingly enough, defenders of collective responsibility frequently turn back to the works of Durkheim (Durkhiem 1895) and Simmel (Simmel 1971), as well as to that of Sartre (Sartre 1960), for inspiration, although they themselves proceed analytically. Margaret Gilbert, who grounds several of her arguments in Durkheim's theory social facts, develops what she calls a “plural-subject account” of shared intentions to justify the coherence of collective responsibility (Gilbert 1989 and 2000). She does so in large part, like Michael Bratman (Bratman 1992 and 1993) and others do, by zeroing in on joint commitments. According to Gilbert, group intentions exist when two or more persons constitute the plural subject of an intention to carry out a particular action, or, in other words, when “they are jointly committed to intending as a body to do A” (Gilbert, 2000, p. 22). David Velleman goes on to stress the unified nature of this plural subject. A “truly plural subject”, he writes, involves “two or more subjects who combine in such a way as to make one subject.” (Velleman 1997).

Raimo Tuomelo chooses a somewhat different strategy in his defense of collective responsibility. He puts forward what he calls “we intentions.” Like Gilbert, he constructs a collective subject on the basis of joint commitments and then applies it to the notion of collective responsibility. But he does not, like Gilbert, stress the pluralistic nature of this subject. Instead, he argues that collective intentional agency supervenes on individual intentional agency in ways that allow us to talk about both collective intentions and collective actions. According to Tuomela, actions by collectives supervene on the actions of the operative members of the collective in such a way that the properties of particular collectives, such their intentions, beliefs, and desires, are “embodied in” and “determined by” the perspectives of the properties of individual members or representatives of the collective in question (Tuomela 1989, p. 494).

Interestingly enough, Tuomela's attempt here to save collective responsibility by positing such a representative subject recalls the efforts of Thomas Hobbes to create a collective subject in the guise of his Leviathan (Hobbes 1651). Hobbes, in an effort both to explain sovereignty in general and to justify the legitimacy of the English monarchy in particular, posited a higher authority in the community—the Leviathan—whose own will, as well as actions, came to be those of its/his subjects as a result of their having transferred their own agency to it/him as part of the only kind of social contract that from Hobbes's perspective made collective life possible. Hobbes's collective subject not only represented group members but captured their very being as members of his Leviathan.

Contemporary defenders of collective responsibility sometimes recall Hobbes's Leviathan in their own attempt to develop a collective subject (see for example: Copp 1980). But they do not, in light of Hobbes's own authoritarianism, go as far as to accept Hobbes's argument that a Leviathan is necessary to capture the collective will. Nor do they generally toy with the possibility of reintroducing the seemingly more benevolent general will of Rousseau (Rousseau 1762) as a way of substantiating group intentions. Instead, they look for an alternative, less authoritarian, way of substantiating group intentions—representational or not—or else argue that group intentions of the sort associated with traditional Kantian notions of moral agency are not after all necessary to collective moral responsibility.

Larry May offers one of the most interesting arguments of the latter sort in his own defense of collective moral agency (May 1987). May rejects many of the above accounts of group intentions as too closely tied to Kantian notions of moral agency. But he does not do away with group intentions as a necessary condition of collective responsibility. Nor does he accept a fully collectivist methodology. Instead, he reformulates group intentions within a theory of what he calls interdependence and, in doing so, develops a general outlook on collective responsibility that not only combines individualism and collectivism but places both relationships and social structures at the center of our attention. The challenge here becomes to describe what such group intentions actually look like.

May relies in this context once again on the work of Sartre to develop his account of group intentions and posits what he calls a “pre-reflective intention”, i.e., “an intention which is not yet reflected upon by each of the members of the group.” (May 1987 p. 64) May makes clear here that group intentions of this sort arise out of the relationships between particular members of a group rather than from any one group member. Hence, while they are not trans-individual or collective in any sense that stands totally above individuals, they can be treated “as if they are collective” (May 1987, p. 64) Moreover, these intentions are, May makes clear, not individual intentions but group-based. “Since each member of the group comes to have the same intention, either reflectively or pre-reflectively”, it is “different from their individual intentions.” Indeed, “the sameness of intention is collective in the sense that it is caused by the group structure, that is, it is group-based.” (May 1987, p. 65)

3. Collective Responsibility and the Structure of Groups

While French, Gilbert, May, and others who concentrate on redeeming collective responsibility as an intellectual construct do so by defending the coherence of collective actions and group intentions, they do not go as far as to assert that all kinds of groups are capable of acting and intending collectively. Nor do they go as far as to assert that all kinds of groups can be understood as collectively responsible for bringing about harm. Instead, they assert that only particular kinds of groups are capable of acting and intending collectively and that only particular kinds of groups are capable of being collectively responsible for harm. What kinds of groups are these?

The most common approach taken to distinguishing between appropriate and inappropriate sites of collective responsibility has been to focus on nations, corporations, and other groups that have well-ordered decision-making procedures in place, since, it is argued, these groups are, by virtue of their well-ordered decision-making procedures, able to demonstrate two things that are often assumed to be necessary to collective responsibility. The first is a set of group actions that have an identifiable moral agent, e.g., a governing board or a representative body, behind them capable of carrying out a group action. The second is a set of decisions that are made self-consciously on a rational basis—or at least purposively—by the group that take the form of group intentions or group choices.

Peter French considers groups that are so organized to be especially appropriate sites of collective responsibility because of three salient features that they all share. The first is a series of organizational mechanisms through which courses of concerted action can be, though not necessarily are, chosen on a rational basis. The second is a set of enforced standards of conduct for individuals that are more stringent than those usually thought to apply in the larger community of individuals, standards that enable us to talk about both group conduct and group discipline. The third is a configuration of “defined roles by which individuals can exercise certain powers “ (French 1984, pp. 13-14) All three of these features, according to French, signal the existence of purposeful and controlled actions that are capable of rendering groups collectively responsible for harm.

A second approach to the location of appropriate sites of collective responsibility has been to use groups such as ethnic communities, clubs, and social movements as paradigmatic cases of appropriate collective responsibility on the grounds that these groups have members who share interests or needs in common. Two assumptions prevail here. The first is that groups whose members share interests or needs in common show signs of group solidarity, which Joel Feinberg defines in this context as a matter of individuals taking a strong interest in each others' interests (Feinberg 1968). The second is that groups that show signs of group solidarity understood in this way are capable of acting and intending in the sense relevant to collective responsibility, since while they are made up of individuals, they pursue projects together.

Not surprisingly, group solidarity is generally thought to exist primarily in either cases where group members identify themselves as group members and assert their shared interests and needs or in cases where group members exhibit collective consciousness to the extent that they are inclined to take pride or feel shame in group actions without prompting. But, according to at least some of those who make use of the concept of group solidarity here, e.g. Larry May (May 1987) and Howard McGary (McGary 1986), group solidarity does not require group self-consciousness. Indeed, according to both May and McGary, group solidarity can be understood as present in what McGary calls “loosely structured groups”, such as privileged racial groups whose members provide support or benefits to other members qua group members, even though they may not, in McGary's words, “see themselves as interested in one another's interests” (McGary 1986, p. 158). In these groups, McGary contends, mutual benefits, as well as practices that may unbeknownst to those who participate in them maintain forms of oppression such as racism and sexism, signal group solidarity of the sort relevant to collective responsibility.

A third approach here is to pick up on shared attitudes among group members as something that renders the group itself an appropriate site of collective responsibility. The attitudes taken to be relevant here are generally those that both produce serious harm in society and that require acceptance by many individuals in a community together in order to be effective, e.g., attitudes such as racism, sexism, and anti-Semitism. May (May 1987)), McGary (McGary 1986), Marilyn Friedman (Friedman and May 1985) and others cite these attitudes as enough to render groups such as “men” and “white Americans” collectively responsible for the oppression of women and black Americans in some, but not all, cases. Other defenders of collective responsibility, e.g., Peter French, refrain from going this far on the grounds that the groups in question are not organized enough to be capable of sustaining a sense of moral agency that is genuinely collective (French 1984).

All three of the above approaches take us in different directions. Hence, they are sometimes thought to be competing. But they all rest on a general distinction between aggregate and conglomerate collectivities. An aggregate collectivity, Peter French writes, is “merely a collection of people” (French 1984, p. 5). It is not, from the perspective of most of those now writing on collective responsibility, an appropriate site of collective responsibility. A conglomerate collectivity, on the other hand, is an “organization of individuals such that its identity is not exhausted by the conjunction of the identities of the persons in the organization” (French 1984, p. 13). It is, from the perspective of most of those now writing on collective responsibility, an appropriate site of collective responsibility, since, unlike an aggregate collectivity, it supplies us with a moral agent capable of purposeful action.

While most of those who defend collective responsibility as a moral construct adhere to this distinction in general, they do not all agree on what counts as an aggregate collectivity in practice. Indeed, there is considerable disagreement among those now writing about collective responsibility (including some who take the above three approaches) about two particular kinds of groups that appear to some to be aggregative groups. One of these kinds of groups is the mob. The other is what Virginia Held calls a “random collection of individuals.” Neither of these kinds of groups has a decision-making procedure in place. Nor do their members show much solidarity. Hence, they are usually rejected as candidates for collective responsibility by many of those who otherwise find the notion of collective responsibility to be very useful. But there are those who put forward both groups as appropriate sites of collective responsibility.

Virginia Held (Held 1970) argues that members of an unorganized group may be said to be responsible for not taking an action that could have prevented harm in cases where they could have done something to prevent the harm together but chose not to do so. Her particular examples are those of victims of violence who are beaten or killed in full sight of strangers assembled around them, strangers who are themselves neither related to the victim nor there together as part of any group-based project. According to Held, while none of these individuals may have been able to prevent the violence on their own, they could have prevented it if they had organized themselves into a group, i.e., cooperated with at least some of the others. Hence, they can as a group be blamed for the victims' suffering and/or death.

Held acknowledges here that holding a random collection of individuals responsible for harm is more difficult than holding an organized group responsible for it, since the latter, unlike the former, has a method for deciding how to act, whether it is a voting procedure or a set of hierarchical authority relations. But, she argues, we can still hold the former group, i.e., that which she calls a random collection of individuals, responsible for the violence done to victims, since, if they had tried, they could have come up with such decision-making procedures themselves. “In the foregoing examples,” she writes, “we can say that the random collection of individuals was morally responsible for failing to transform itself into an organized group capable of taking action rather than inaction” with respect to the prevention of harm. (Held 1970, p. 479.)

Mobs are often thought to be the last groups that we should be tying to hold collectively responsible. For, they completely lack decision-making procedures, their members are seemingly not related, and they are often chaotic and irrational. But, Larry May (May 1987), Raimo Tuomela (Tuomela 1989), and others argue, we can nevertheless hold mobs collectively responsible if at least some of their members contribute directly to harm and others either facilitate these contributions or fail to prevent them. For, in these cases, all mob members are “implicated” in mob action, even if not all of them produced specific harms or organized together to do so. Tuomela (Tuomela 1989), much like Le Bon (Le Bon 1896) before him, argues that both crowds and rioters are appropriate sites of collective responsibility by virtue of the fact that they perform their acts as members of a group, even if they do not think of themselves as doing so.

Crowds and rioters … are without much or any structure (and divisions of tasks and activities) … with respect to the goals and interests of the group. … But they can be said to act in virtue of their members' actions. … Thus in a riot the members of the collective typically perform their destructive actions as members of a collective without acting on its behalf. (Tuomela 1989, p. 476.)

Interestingly enough, in both of these cases—mobs and what Held calls random collections of individuals—the groups in question may not be as unrelated as Held and others suggest they are. Indeed, it may be precisely because these groups are made up of individuals who become related to each other in the process of producing harm together (even though they were initially strangers) that they are now potentially appropriate sites of collective responsibility. Stanley Bates suggests as much in his own arguments that Held has presented us with a group that is neither as random nor as disconnected as the term “random” normally suggests, but that is “related” to the extent that group whose members share a particular challenge and are capable of communicating with one another (Bates 1971).

4. A Question of Distribution

Contemporary moral and political philosophers are generally careful to distinguish between collective responsibility, on the one hand, and individual or shared responsibility, on the other. But they do not leave individual moral agents behind altogether. Indeed, after analyzing collective responsibility as part of group morality, they frequently place individual moral agents back at the center of their attention in an effort to discern what collective responsibility means on the level of individual moral actors. Is it possible, they ask, for individual members of a group to be collectively responsible for group-based harms in cases where they did not directly cause it? in cases where they did not do anything to stop it? If so, under what conditions?

While those who answer these questions tend to focus on the transferability of collective responsibility and its relationship to individual moral agency in general, they do not ignore concrete historical examples in which the moral responsibility of particular groups of individuals for harm is in question. Indeed, almost all of those who write about collective responsibility and the question of distribution place such concrete historical examples of harm at the center of their analyses of collective responsibility in an effort, not just to understand collective responsibility as an abstract construct, but to discern whether or not particular groups of individuals in history can be held morally responsible for harms that their groups caused, whether those groups are ethnic groups (“Germans”), nations (“America”) or racial groups (“Whites”).

Both Karl Jaspers (Jaspers 1961) and Hannah Arendt (Arendt 1987), as well H. D. Lewis (1948), were clearly concerned in their writings on collective responsibility about whether or not the German people can legitimately be held collectively responsible for World War II Nazi crimes. So, too, were Sanford Levinson (Levinson 1974), Richard Wasserstrom (Wasserstrom 1971) and others who produced their own arguments about collective responsibility in light of the Nuremberg trials. The My Lai killings of the Viet Nam War, along with the Kitty Genovese murder and corporate scandals of all kinds, influenced much of the philosophical work done on collective responsibility during the 1970s and 80s, including that of Peter French, Larry May, and Virginia Held, and while it is only recently that group-based oppression such as racism and sexism have come to be of interest to those writing on collective responsibility, they now figure importantly in the writings of Larry May (1987 and 1992), Howard McGary (1986), Marilyn Friedman (Friedman and May 1980), and Anthony Appiah (Appiah 1987).

In all of these discussions, the question is whether the whole community—or large parts of it—can be held responsible for the harms produced by particular group members in cases where not all group members caused the harm directly. Is it appropriate to hold all Germans responsible for the deaths of extermination camp victims during WWII? all Americans for the atrocities of the Viet Nam War? Can we legitimately blame all men for the gender-based oppression and sexual violence that women experience in all societies? Can we blame all whites for the racist treatment of blacks in the U.S.? What about members of these groups who go out of their way to stop the harm? Are they excused from blame because they tried to reform their communities or are they, too, responsible for the harm in question by virtue of their group membership?

While the arguments made in this context tend to be tied to particular cases of group-based harm, they are for the most part designed either to establish general criteria for distributing collective responsibility among group members or to demonstrate that collective responsibility cannot in the end be distributed at all. The latter arguments frequently proceed as follows: While collective entities generally act through their individual members, their actions do not coincide with their member's actions. Nor is their moral agency merely the moral agency of their members or the moral agency of group representatives. Instead, such agency is—if it is to be genuinely collective moral agency—an agency that is attached to the collective itself and hence not the kind of thing that can be distributed across group members or, for that matter, attached to anything other than a collective itself. In other words, such agency is the kind of thing that necessarily has collectives, and not individuals, as its subject matter.

Peter French makes such an argument himself in Individual and Collective Responsibility (French 1998). But he cautions that the non-distributional character of collective responsibility does not mean that individual members of the group that is collectively responsible for harm are themselves blameless. Indeed, he claims, many of these group members will be morally responsible for all sorts of harms that their group causes.

[I]t should be noted that from ‘Collectivity A is blameworthy for event n, and A is composed of x, y, and z,’ it would be presumptuous to conclude that x, y, and z do not warrant any blame for n, or that x, y, r z is not himself blameworthy in the case of n. My point is that such judgments assessed on members of the collectivity do not follow necessarily from judgments of collective blame (French 1998, p. 25).

The above claim clearly makes sense if we are talking about keeping collective responsibility in tact qua collective responsibility in our efforts to ascribe it in practice. But we might want to loosen things up here a bit and suggest that collective responsibility is the basis upon which we ascribe responsibility to individual group members for harm that the group itself caused In other words, we might want to suggest that individual group members can take collective responsibility into themselves as persons, in which case collective responsibility changes form and becomes something closer to personal responsibility, albeit personal responsibility that exists only because one's collective is responsible for harm. In many cases, this is what those in philosophical circles who are concerned with the question of how to distribute collective responsibility seem to have in mind. How do they attempt to distribute collective responsibility?

In The Question of German Guilt, Karl Jaspers (Jaspers 1961) distinguishes between moral guilt that is based on what one does and moral guilt that is based on who one is. He argues that the latter, which he calls “metaphysical guilt”, can be distributed to all members of a community who stand by while their fellows produce harm, e.g., murder Jews. In this context, to be morally blameworthy for harm is largely a matter of belonging to an “evil” community without asserting one's own moral powers over the community to cleanse it of such evil. According to Jaspers, “[t]here exists a solidarity among men as human beings that makes each as responsible for every wrong and every injustice in the world, especially for crimes committed in his presence or with his knowledge. If I fail to do whatever I can do to prevent them, I too am guilty.” (Jaspers 1961, p. 36.

Jaspers has several contemporary followers, including Larry May and Juha Raikka (Raikka 1997), who choose to express Jaspers' notion of metaphysical guilt as “moral taint”, a notion that emphasizes, among other things, the extent to which, in Anthony Appiah's terms, we are “dirtied” by association with our community's harmful actions. Appiah himself is very reluctant to apply the language of moral taint in general and does so only in particular cases where there are strong causal connections between individuals and harm. May, on the other hand, finds moral taint in many places and goes as far as to tout the utilitarian virtues of distributing collective responsibility widely. According to May, “seeing one's own moral status as interrelated to that of one's fellow group members will negate the tendency to ignore the most serious moral evils: those which can only be thwarted by the collective efforts of the community.” (May 1987, p. 253)

Methodological and normative individualists tend to reject the notion of metaphysical guilt on two related grounds. The first is that it severs the link between responsibility and control, especially in cases where the group membership being invoked is one that individuals cannot possibly choose, e.g., membership in racial, ethnic or national communities (For a very interesting assessment of this claim, see: Radzik 2001). The second is that the metaphysical notion of guilt violates the liberal ethic of what Rawls calls the “separateness of persons”. According to Rawls, in ascribing responsibility we have to consider persons separately and focus on their own actions so as not to violate principles of justice, principles of justice that for Rawls themselves begin with the value of discrete individuals (Rawls 1971).

While not all liberal individualists agree with Rawls' particular claims here, they do agree with Rawls that, at the very least, individual group members have to be faulty in some way in order to be held collectively responsible for harm. Joel Feinberg's theory of group liability is often taken as a starting point of discussion in this context. According to Feinberg, in distributing collective responsibility, we need to focus on two kinds of cases: cases in which all members of a collective share the same fault or cases in which all members of a collective contribute to harm but at different levels. In both kinds of cases, Feinberg stresses, there does not need be a direct link between the individual being held responsible and the harm, but there does need to be the sharing of faultiness.

Various faults can exist in the absence of any causal linkage to harm, where that absence is only a lucky accident reflecting no credit on the person who is at fault. Where every member of a group shares the same fault, but only one member's fault leads to any harm, and that not because it was more of a fault than that of others, but only because of independent fortuities, many will be inclined to ascribe collective liability to the whole group (Feinberg 1968, p. 687).

Feinberg himself is willing to ascribe collective responsibility to group members for such harm in some cases, although, he makes clear, in doing so we need to shift our attention away from strict liability to a softer kind of social blame on grounds of fairness. He concerns himself with three kinds of cases in particular, namely, those in which large numbers of individuals are independently at fault; those in which the harm is caused by a joint undertaking of numerous persons acting cooperatively, and those in which the harm is ascribed to a particular feature of the common culture which is self-consciously accepted by or participated in by members of the group. Feinberg is willing to accept the possibility of ascribing collective responsibility in all three kinds of cases. But he cautions that we need to proceed on a situation-by-situation basis, since to ascribe collective responsibility in cases such as these requires not only that we locate genuinely shared faults but assess various incommensurable dimensions of individual contributions, including degrees of initiative, importance of assigned task, levels of authority, etc.

A second way of tackling the distribution question in this context that does not seem to violate the principle of individual freedom is to look, not just at the particular role that individuals played in their community's production of harm, but at how much freedom the individuals had to distance themselves from the community that has done wrong. Here we might want to use voluntariness of membership as a criterion of responsibility. Jan Narveson (Narveson 2002) does so himself in his generally skeptical work on collective responsibility. Narveson argues that in thinking about the responsibility of individuals for group harms we need to be careful to distinguish between four different kinds of groups, namely: those that are fully voluntary; those that are involuntary in entrance but voluntary in exit; those that are voluntary in entrance but involuntary in exist; and those that are voluntary in neither respect. As Narveson makes clear, responsibility is diminished, if not eradicated, as we go down this list.

Interestingly enough, one of the major points of agreement among those now writing about collective responsibility is that responsibility cannot be distributed to those group members who openly resist or fight against their communities' bad actions or policies. See here, for example, the arguments of Joel Feinberg (Feinberg 1968), Peter French (French 1998), Howard McGary (McGary 1986), J. R. Lucas (Lucas 1993), and Michele Moody-Adams (Moody-Adams 1994). While the above writers, who find collective responsibility to be a compelling moral construct in general, differ in particular respects, they all agree that it would be wrong to ascribe responsibility to dissenters or, in other words, that if one tries to fight harm one should not be held responsible for it. McGary makes his own claim here in terms of what he calls the “dissociation condition”, according to which a person is exempt from collective responsibility in cases where one's community caused harm if he or she dissociates him or herself from the action of the community by opposing its bad actions or policies (McGary 1986).

But we do find those who call for the distribution of collective responsibility to individuals even in cases where these individuals actively opposed their community's wrong doings. Juha Raikka, for example, claims that the only way that opposition can exonerate those who, say, live in a society that systematically pollutes the environment or depletes resources, is if they are able, by dissenting, to avoid supporting the system that does these things (a condition that, Raikka acknowledges, is very hard to meet). According to Raikka,

[o]pposing an evil practice cleans one's hands only on the condition that it does not require supporting another evil practice. … In the end, even those who oppose evil practices may be blameworthy for those practices. A single member of a group may have acted as he or she, all things, considered, ought to have acted, but still share responsibility for the group's evil practices. (Raikka 1997, p.104.)

Raikka claims in this context that dissenters can be morally blameworthy even if they cannot control the system that implicates them in evil. Hence, he finds it necessary to do two things that not only place him squarely in the camp of Karl Jaspers and other advocates of metaphysical guilt but that are very telling with respect to contemporary philosophical debates about collective responsibility in general. The first is to subtract from the set of conventionally invoked criteria of collective responsibility a criterion that the majority of those now writing about collective responsibility take very seriously, namely, the ability of individuals to control those things (whether actions or harms) for which they are being blamed. The second is to detach moral blameworthiness from the will of discrete individuals (where traditional, Kantian notions of agency place it) and to locate its source in the greater community of which the individuals deemed guilty are ostensibly a part.

Both of these moves force us to acknowledge that, in the end, the various differences that exist among contemporary philosophers with respect to the coherence and applicability of collective responsibility as a construct have their source, not just in competing theories of intentions and actions, but also in competing notions of moral blameworthiness. While neither defenders nor critics of collective responsibility generally take on the nature of the moral blameworthiness that they put at the center of our attention—See Smiley 1992 for an extended discussion of the different kinds of moral blameworthiness that we as a community invoke—they do make clear that for some of them the traditional, Kantian standards of moral blameworthiness still prevail and that for others the appropriate standards of moral blameworthiness take us beyond the wills of discrete individuals to the structure of guilty communities.


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moral responsibility | self-determination, collective