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Croce's Aesthetics

First published Sun May 4, 2008; substantive revision Mon Aug 31, 2009

The Neapolitan Benedetto Croce (1860–1952) was a dominant figure in the first half of the twentieth century in aesthetics and literary criticism as well as philosophy generally, but his fame did not last, in either Italy or the English speaking world. He did not lack promulgators and willing translators into English; H. Carr was an early example of the former, R. G. Collingwood was both, and D. Ainslie did the latter service for most of Croce's principal works. But his star rapidly declined after the Second World War. Indeed it is hard to find a figure whose reputation has fallen so far and so quickly; the fact is somewhat unfair not least because Collingwood's aesthetics is still studied, when it is mostly borrowed from Croce. The causes are a matter for speculation, but two are likely. First, Croce's general philosophy was very much of the preceding century. As the idealistic and historicist systems of Bradley, Green, and Joachim were in Britain superseded by Russell and Ayer and analytical philosophy, Croce's system was swept away by new ideas on the continent—from Heidegger on the one hand to deconstructionism on the other. Second, Croce's manner of presentation in his famous early works now seems, not to put too fine a point on it, dismissively dogmatic; it is full of the youthful conviction and fury that seldom wears well. On certain key points, opposing positions are characterized as foolish, or as confused expressions of simple truths that only waited upon Croce to articulate properly. Of course, these dismissals carry some weight—Croce's reading is prodigious and there is more insight beneath the words than initially meets the eye—but unless the reader were already convinced that here at last is the truth, their sheer number and vehemence will arouse mistrust. And since the early works, along with his long running editorship of the journal La Critica, rocketed him to such fame and admiration, whereas later years were devoted among other things to battling with while being tolerated by fascists, it's not surprising that he never quite lost this habit.

Nevertheless, Croce's signal contribution to aesthetics—that art is expression—can be more or less be detached from the surrounding philosophy and polemics. In what follows, we will first see the doctrine as connected to its original philosophical context, then we will attempt to snip the connections.

1. The Four Domains of Spirit (or Mind)

We are confining ourselves to Croce's aesthetics, but it will help to have at least the most rudimentary sketch in view of his rather complex general philosophy.

In Italy at the beginning of the twentieth century, the prevailing philosophy or ‘world-view’ was not, as in England, post-Hegelian Idealism as already mentioned, but the early forms of empiricist positivism associated with such figures as Comte and Mach. Partly out of distaste for the mechanism and enshrinement of matter of such views, and partly out of his reaction, both positive and negative, to the philosophy of Hegel, Croce espoused what he called ‘Absolute Idealism’ or ‘Absolute Historicism’. A constant theme in Croce's philosophy is that he sought a path between the Scylla of ‘transcendentalism’ and the Charybdis of ‘sensationalism’, which for most purposes may be thought of as co-extensive with rationalism and empiricism. For Croce, they are bottom the same error, the error of abstracting from ordinary experience to something not literally experienceable. Transcendentalism regards the world of sense to be unreal, confused or second-rate, and it is the philosopher, reflecting on the world in a priori way from his armchair, who sees beyond it, to reality. Sensationalism, on the other hand, regards only instantaneous impressions of colour and the like as existing. The right path is what Croce calls immanentism: All but only lived human experience, taking place concretely and without reduction, is real. Therefore all Philosophy, properly so-called, is Philosophy of Spirit (or Mind), and is inseparable from history. And thus Croce's favoured designations, ‘Absolute Idealism’ or ‘Absolute Historicism’.

Philosophy admits of the following divisions, corresponding to the different modes of mental or spiritual activity. Mental activity is either theoretic—it understands or contemplates—or it is practical—in which case it wills actions. These in turn divide: The theoretic divides into the aesthetic, which deals in particulars (individuals or intuitions), and logic or the intellectual domain, which deals in concepts and relations, or universals. The practical divides into the economic—by which Croce means all manner of utilitarian calculation—and the ethical or moral. Each of the four domains are subject to a characteristic norm or value: aesthetic is subject to beauty, logic is subject to truth, economic is subject to the useful (or vitality), and the moral is subject to the good. Croce devoted three lengthy books written between 1901 and 1909 to this overall scheme of the ‘Philosophy of Spirit’: Aesthetic (1901) and (1907) (revised), Logic (1909) and the Philosophy of the Practical (1908), the latter containing both the economic and ethics (in today's use of term you might call the overall scheme Croce's metaphysics, but Croce himself distanced himself from that appellation).

2. The Primacy of the Aesthetic

Philosophers since Kant customarily distinguish intuitions or representations from concepts or universals. In one sense Croce follows this tradition, but another sense his view departs radically. For intuitions are not blind without concepts; an intuitive presentation is a complete conscious manifestation just as it is, in advance of applying concepts (and all that is true a priori of them is that they have a particular character or individual physiognomy—they are not necessarily spatial or temporal, contra Kant). To account for this, Croce supposes that the modes of mental activity are in turn arranged at different levels. The intellect presupposes the intuitive mode—which just is the aesthetic—but the intuitive mode does not presuppose the intellect. The intellect—issuing in particular judgements—in turn is presupposed by the practical, which issues among other things in empirical laws. And morality tells the practical sciences what ends in particular they should pursue. Thus Croce regarded this as one of his key insights: All mental activity, which means the whole of reality, is founded on the aesthetic, which has no end or purpose of its own, and of course no concepts or judgements. This includes the concept of existence or reality: the intuition plus the judgement of existence is what Croce calls perception, but itself is innocent of it.

To say the world is essentially history is to say that at the lowest level it is aesthetic experiences woven into a single fabric, a world-narrative, with the added judgement that it is real, that it exists. Croce takes this to be inevitable: the subjective present is real and has duration; but any attempt to determine its exact size is surely arbitrary. Therefore the only rigorous view is that the past is no less real than the present. History then represents, by definition, the only all-encompassing account of reality. What we call the natural sciences then are impure, second-rate. Consider for example the concept of a space-time point. Plainly it is not something anyone has ever met with in experience; it is an abstraction, postulated as a limit of certain operations for the convenience of a ‘theory’. Croce would call it a pseudo-concept, and would not call the so-called ‘empirical laws’ in which it figures to be fit subjects for truth and knowledge. Its significance, like that of other pseudo-concepts, is pragmatic.

In fact the vast majority of concepts—house, reptile, tree—are mere adventitious collections of things that are formulated in response to practical needs, and thus cannot, however exact the results of the corresponding science, attain to truth or knowledge. Nor do the concepts of mathematics escape the ‘pseudo’ tag. What Croce calls pure concepts, in contrast, are characterised by their possession of expressiveness, universality and concreteness, and they perform their office by a priori synthesis (this accounts for character mentioned above). What this means it that everything we can perceive or imagine—every representation or intuition—will necessary have all three: there is no possible experience that is not of something concrete, universal in the sense of being an instance of something absolutely general, and expressive, that is, admitting of verbal enunciation. Empirical concepts, then, like heat, are concrete but not universal; mathematical concepts, like number, are universal but not concrete. Examples of pure concepts are rare, but those recognized by Croce are finality, quality and beauty. Such is the domain of Logic, in Croce's scheme.

A critical difference, for our purposes, between Croce's ideas and those of his follower Collingwood, emerges when we ask: what are the constituents of the intuition? For Collingwood—writing in the mid-1930's—intuitions are built up out of sense-data, the only significant elaboration of Russell's doctrine being that sense-data are never simple, comprising what analysis reveals as sensory and affective constituents. For Croce the intuition is an organic whole, such that to analyze it into atoms is always a false abstraction: the intuition could never be re-built with such elements. (Although a deadly opponent of formal logic, Croce did share Frege's insight that the truly meaningful bit of language is the sentence; ‘only in the context of sentence does a word have a meaning’, wrote Frege in 1884).

3. Art and Aesthetics

With such an account of ‘the aesthetic’ in view, one might think that Croce intends to cover roughly the same ground as Kant's Transcendental Aesthetic, and like Kant will think of art as a comparatively narrow if profound region of experience. But Croce takes the opposite line (and finds Kant theory of beauty and art to have failed at precisely this point): art is everywhere, and the difference between ordinary intuition and that of ‘works of art’ is a quantitative difference (Aes.13). This principle has for Croce a profound significance:

We must hold firmly to our identification, because among the principal reasons which have prevented Aesthetic, the science of art, from revealing the true nature of art, its real roots in human nature, has been its separation from the general spiritual life, the having made of it a sort of special function or aristocratic club…. There is not … a special chemical theory of stones as distinct from mountains. In the same way, there is not a science of lesser intuition as distinct from a science of greater intuition, nor one of ordinary intuition as distinct from artistic intuition. (Aes. 14)

But the point is not that every object is to some degree a work of art. The point is that every intuition has to some degree the qualities of the intuition of a work of art; it's just that the intuition of a work of art has them in much greater degree.

4. Intuition and Expression

We now reach the most famous and notorious Crocean doctrine concerning art. ‘To intuite’, he writes, ‘is to express’ (Aes. 11); ‘intuitive knowledge is expressive knowledge’. There are several points that have to be in place in order to understand what Croce means by this, because it obviously does not strike one as initially plausible.

4.1 The Double Ideality of the Work of Art

For our purposes, it is simplest to regard Croce as an idealist, for whom there is nothing besides the mind. So in that sense, the work of art is an ideal or mental object along with everything else; no surprise there, but no interest either. But he still maintains the ordinary commonplace distinction between mental things—thoughts, hopes and dreams—and physical things—tables and trees. And on this divide, the work of art, for Croce, is still a mental thing. In other words, the work of art in doubly ideal; to put it another way, even if Croce were a dualist—or a physicalist with some means of reconstructing the physical-mental distinction—the work of art would remain mental. In what follows, then, except where otherwise noted, we shall treat Croce is being agnostic as between idealism, physicalism, or dualism (see PPH 227).

This claim about the ontological status of works of art means that a spectator ‘of’ a work of art—a sonata, a poem, a painting—is actually creating the work of art in his mind. Croce's main argument for this is the same as, therefore no better but no worse than, Russell's argument by the relativity of perception to sense-data. The perceived aesthetic qualities of anything vary with the states of the perceiver; therefore in speaking of the former we are really speaking of the latter (Aes. 106; Croce does not, so far as I know, consider the possibility that certain states of the perceiver might be privileged, but it is evident that he would discount this possibility).

4.2 The Role of Feeling

Feeling, for Croce, is necessarily part of any (mental) activity, including bare perception—indeed, feeling is a form of mental activity (it is part of his philosophy that there is never literally present to consciousness anything passive). We are accustomed to thinking of ‘artistic expression’ as concerned with specific emotions that are relatively rare in the mental life, but again, Croce points out that strictly speaking, we are thinking of a quantitative distinction as qualitative. In fact feeling is nothing but the will in mental activity, with all its varieties of thought, desire and action, its varieties of frustration and satisfaction (Aes. 74–6). The only criterion of ‘art’ is coherence of expression, that is, of the movement of the will.

Because of this, Croce discounts certain aesthetic applications of the distinction between form and content as confused. The distinction only applies at a theoretical level, to a posited a priori synthesis (EA 39–40). At that level, the irruption of an intuition just is the emergence of a form (we are right to speak of the formation of intuition, that intuitions are formed). At the aesthetic level—one might say at the phenomenological level—there is no identification of content independently of the forms in which we meet it, and none of form independently of content. It makes no sense to speak of work of art's being good on form but poor on content, or good on content but poor on form.

4.3 Feeling, Expression and the Commonplace

When Croce says that intuition and expression are the same phenomenon, we are likely to think: what does this mean for a person who cannot draw or paint, for example? Even we allow Croce his widened notion of feeling, surely the distinction between a man who looks at a bowl of fruit but cannot draw or paint it, and the man who does draw or paint it, is precisely that of a man with a Crocean intuition but who cannot express it, and one who has both.

Croce comes at this concern from both sides. On one side, there is ‘the illusion or prejudice that we possess a more complete intuition of reality than we really do’ (Aes. 9). We have, most of the time, only fleeting, transitory intuitions amidst the bustle of our practical lives. ‘The world which as rule we intuite is a small thing’, he writes; ‘It consists of small expressions … it is a medley of light and colour’ (Aes. 9). On the other side, if our man is seriously focussed on the bowl of fruit, it is only a prejudice to deny that then he is to that extent expressing himself—although, according to Croce, ordinary direct perception of things, as glimpsed in photography, will generally be lacking the ‘lyrical’ quality that genuine artists give to their works.

5. Natural Expression, Beauty and Hedonic Theory

There is another respect in which Croce's notion of expression as intuition departs from what we ordinary think of in connection with the word ‘expression’. For example we think unreflectively of wailing as a natural expression of pain or grief; generally, we think of expressive behaviour or gestures as being caused, at least paradigmatically, by the underlying emotion or feelings. But Croce joins a long line of aestheticians in attempting a sharp distinction between this phenomenon and expression in art. Whereas the latter is the subject of aesthetics, the former is a topic for the natural sciences; ‘for instance in Darwin's enquiries into the expression of feeling in man and in the animals’ (PPH 265; cf. Aes. 21, 94–7). In an article he wrote for the Encyclopaedia Britannica, speaking of such ‘psychophysical phenomena’, he writes:

…such ‘expression’, albeit conscious, can rank as expression only by metaphorical licence, when compared with the spiritual or aesthetic expression which alone expresses, that is to say gives to the feeling a theoretical form and converts into language, song, shape. It is in the difference between feeling as contemplated (poetry, in fact), and feeling as enacted or undergone, that lies the catharsis, the liberation from the affections, the calming property which has been attributed to art; and to this corresponds the aesthetic condemnation of work of art if or in far as immediate feeling breaks into them or uses them as an outlet. (PPH 219).

Croce is no doubt right to want to distinguish these things, but whether his official position—that expression is identical to intuition—will let him do so is another matter; he does not actually analyze the phenomena in such a way as to deduce, with the help of his account of expression, the result. He simply asserts it. But we will wait for our final section to articulate criticisms.

Croce's wish to divorce artistic expression from natural expression is partly driven by his horror at naturalistic theories of art. The same goes for his refusal to rank pleasure as the aim, or at least an aim, of art (Aes. 82–6). He does not of course deny that aesthetic pleasures (and pains) exist, but they are ‘the practical echo of aesthetic value and disvalue’ (Aes. 94). Strictly speaking, they are dealt with in the Philosophy of the Practical, that is, in the theory of the will, and do not enter into the theory of art. That is, if the defining value of the Aesthetic is beauty, the defining value of the Practical is usefulness. In the Essence of Aesthetic (EA 11–13) Croce points out that the pleasure is much wider than the domain of art, so a definition of art as ‘what causes pleasure’ will not do. Croce does speak of the ‘truly aesthetic pleasure’ had in beholding the ‘aesthetic fact’ (Aes. 80). But I think he is being consistent. The pragmatic pleasure had in beholding beauty is only contingently aroused, but in point of fact it always is aroused by such beholding, because the having of an intuition is an act of mind, and therefore the will is brought into play.

6. Externalization

The painting of pictures, the scrape of the bow upon strings, the chanting or inscription of a poem are, for Croce, only contingently related to the work of art, that is, to the expressed intuition. By this Croce does not mean to say that for example the painter could get by without paint in point of fact; nevertheless what he is doing is always driven by the intuition, and thereby making it possible for others to have the intuition (or rather, an intuition). First, the memory—though only contingently—often requires the physical work to sustain or develop the intuition. Second, the physical work is necessary for the practical business of the communication of the intuition.

For example the process of painting is a closely interwoven operation of positive feedback between the intuitive faculty and the practical or technical capacity to manipulate the brush, mix paint and so on:

Likewise with the painter, who paints upon canvas or upon wood, but could not paint at all, did not the intuited image, the line and colour as they have taken shape in the fancy, precede, at every stage of the work, from the first stroke of the brush or sketch of the outline to the finishing touches, the manual actions. And when it happens that some stroke of the brush runs ahead of the image, the artist, in his final revision, erases and corrects it.
It is, no doubt, very difficult to perceive the frontier between expression and communication in actual fact, for the two processes usually alternate rapidly and are almost intermingled. But the distinction is ideally clear and must be strongly maintained… The technical does not enter into art, but pertains to the concept of communication. (PPH 227–8, emphasis added; cf. Aes. 50–1, 96–7, 103, 111–17; EA 41–7)

He also defines technique as ‘knowledge at the service of the practical activity directed to producing stimuli to aesthetic reproduction’ (Aes. 111). Again, we defer criticism to the conclusion.

7. Judgement, Criticism and Taste

The first task of the spectator of the work of art—the critic—is for Croce simple: one is to reproduce the intuition, or perhaps better, one is to realize the intuition, which is the work of art. One may fail, and Croce is well aware that one may be mistaken; ‘haste, vanity, want of reflexion, theoretic prejudices’ may bring it about that one finds beautiful what is not, or fail to find beautiful what is (Aes. 120). But given the foregoing strict distinction between practical technique and artistic activity properly so-called, his task is the same as that of the artist:

How could that which is produced by a given activity be judged a different activity? The critic may be a small genius, the artist a great one … but the nature of both must remain the same. To judge Dante, we must raise ourselves to his level: let it be well understood that empirically we are not Dante, nor Dante we; but in that moment of contemplation and judgement, our spirit is one with that of the poet, and in that moment we and he are one thing. (Aes. 121)

Leave aside the remark that we become identical with the poet. If by taste we mean the capacity for aesthetic judgement—that is, the capacity to find beauty—and by genius we mean the capacity to produce beauty, then they are the same: the capacity to realize intuitions.

In Croce's overall philosophy, the aesthetic stands alone: in having an intuition, one has succeeded entirely insofar as aesthetic value is concerned. Therefore there cannot be a real question of a ‘standard’ of beauty which an object might or might not satisfy. Thus Croce says:

…the criterion of taste is absolute, but absolute in a different way from that of the intellect, which expresses itself in ratiocination. The criterion of taste is absolute, with the intuitive absoluteness of the imagination. (Aes. 122)

Of course there is as a matter of fact a great deal of variability in critical verdicts. But Croce believes this is largely due to variances in the ‘psychological conditions’ and the physical circumstance of spectators (Aes. 124). Much of this can be offset by ‘historical interpretation’ (Aes. 126); the rest, one presumes, are due to disturbances already mentioned: ‘haste, vanity, want of reflexion, theoretic prejudices’ (Aes. 120).

8. The Identity of Art and Language

The title of the first great book of Croce's career was ‘Aesthetic as a Science of expression and general linguistic’ (emphasis added). There are several interconnected aspects to this.

Croce claims that drawing, sculpting, writing of music and so on are just as much ‘language’ as poetry, and all language is poetic; therefore ‘Philosophy of language and philosophy of art are the same thing’ (Aes. 142; author's emphasis). The reason for this is that language is to be understood as expressive; ‘an emission of sounds which expresses nothing is not language’ (Aes. 143). From our perspective, we might regard Croce as arguing thus: (1) Referential semantics—scarcely mentioned by Croce—necessarily involves parts of speech. (2) However:

It is false to say that a verb or noun is expressed in definite words, truly distinguishable from others. Expression is an indivisible whole. Noun and verb do not exist in it, but are abstractions made by us, destroying the sole linguistic reality, which is the sentence. (Aes. 146)

If we take this as asserting the primacy of sentence meaning—glossing over the anti-abstraction remark which is tantamount to a denial of syntactic compositionality—then together with (3) a denial of what in modern terms would be distinction between semantic and expressive meaning, or perhaps in Fregean terms sense and tone, then it is not obvious that the resulting picture of language would not apply equally to, for example, drawing. In that case, just as drawings cannot be translated, so linguistic translation is impossible (though for certain purposes, naturally, we can translate ‘relatively’; Aes. 68).

Interestingly, Croce does not think of all signs as natural signs, as lightning is a sign of thunder; on the contrary, he thinks of ‘pictures, poetry and all works of art’ as equally conventional—as ‘historically conditioned’ (Aes. 125; authors emphasis).

There is no doubt that on this point Croce was inspired by his great precursor, the Neapolitan Giambattista Vico (1668–1744). According to Croce (Aes. 220–34) Vico was the first to recognise the aesthetic as a self-sufficient and non-conceptual mode of knowledge, and famously he held that all language is substantially poetry. The only serious mistake in this that Croce found was Vico's belief in an actual historical period when all language was poetry; it was the mistake of substituting a concrete history for ‘ideal history’ (Aes. 232).

9. Later Developments

As he became older, there was one aspect of his aesthetics that he was uneasy with. In the Aesthetic of 1901 (Aes. 82–7, 114), and again in Essence of Aesthetic of 1913 (EA 13–16) , he had been happy to deduce from his theory that art cannot have an ethical purpose. The only value in art is beauty. But by 1917, in the essay The Totality of Artistic Expression (PPH 261–73), his attitude towards the moral content of art is more nuanced. This may have been only a shift of emphasis, or, charitably perhaps, drawing out a previously unnoticed implication: ‘If the ethical principle is a cosmic [universal] force (as it certainly is) and queen of the world, the world of liberty, she reigns in her own right, while art, in proportion to the purity with which she re-enacts and expresses the motions of reality, is herself perfect’ (PPH 267). In other words, he still holds that to speak of a moral work of art would not impinge upon it aesthetically; likewise to speak of an immoral work, for the values of the aesthetic and moral domains are absolutely incommensurable. It is not merely an assertion that within the domain of pure intuition, the concepts simply don't apply; that would merely beg the question. He means that a pure work of art cannot be subject to moral praise or blame because the Aesthetic domain exists independently of and prior, in the Philosophy of Spirit, to the Ethical.

In the Encyclopaedia article of 1928, Croce asserts positively that the moral sensibility is a necessary condition of the artist:

The foundation of all poetry is therefore the human personality, and since the human personality fulfill itself morally, the foundation of all poetry is the moral conscience. (PPH 221)

But even here I don't think he changed his view. For instance, Shakespeare could not have been Shakespeare without seeing into the moral heart of man, for morality is the highest domain of spirit. But we have to distinguish between the moral sensibility—the capacity to perceive and feel moral emotions—and the capacity to act morally. Croce's position is that only the first is relevant to art.

The early emphasis on beauty is downplayed in subsequent writing in favour of the successful work art as expression, as constituting a ‘lyrical intuition’. In Essence of Aesthetic he writes:

…what gives coherence and unity to the intuition is feeling: the intuition is really such because it represents a feeling, and can only appear from and upon that. Not the idea, but the feeling, is what confers upon art the airy lightness of a symbol: an aspiration enclosed in the circle of a representation—that is art; and in it the aspiration alone stands for the representation, and the representation alone for the aspiration. (EA 30)

Croce still holds that art is intuitive, a-logical or nonconceptual, and therefore by ‘it represents a feeling’ he does not mean that our aesthetic mode of engagement involves that concept, and he does not mean that art is to be understood as symbolic, implying a relation which would require an intellectual act of mind to apprehend. Both would imply that our mode of aesthetic engagement would be something more, or something other than, the aesthetic, which is as always the intuitive capacity. The point is simply that our awareness of the form of the intuition in nothing but our awareness of the unifying currents of feeling running through it. It is a claim about what it is that unifies an intuition, distinguishes it from the surrounding, relatively discontinuous or confused intuition. This is, in effect, a claim about the nature of beauty:

An appropriate expression, if appropriate, is also beautiful, beauty being nothing but the precision of the image, and therefore of the expression. …(EA 48).
Expression and beauty are not two concepts, but a single concept, which it is permissible to designate with either synonymous word … (EA 49).

Genuinely new in the 1917 essay was Croce's appealing but enigmatic claim that art is in a sense ‘universal’, is concerned with the ‘totality’:

To give artistic form to a content of feeling means, then, impressing upon it the character of totality, breathing into it the breath of the cosmos. Thus understood, universality and artistic form are not two things but one. (PPH 263).


In intuition, the single pulsates with the life of the whole, and the whole is in the life of the single. Every genuine artistic representation is itself and is the universe, the universe in that individual form, and that individual form as the universe. In every utterance, every fanciful [imaginative] creation, of the poet, there lies the whole of human destiny, all human hope, illusions, grief's, joys, human grandeurs and miseries, the whole drama of reality perpetually evolving and growing out of itself in suffering and joy. (PPH 262)

Croce—and undoubtedly the political situation in Italy in 1917 played a role in this—was anxious to assert the importance of art for humanity, and his assertion of it is full of feeling. And the claim marks a decisive break from earlier doctrine: form is now linked with universality rather that with particular feelings. But I confess I'm unable to see beyond such metaphors as ‘impressing upon it the character of totality’ (not even with the help of Croce's Logic). One is reminded of the Kantian dictum that in aesthetics we ‘demand universality’ in our judgements, but there are no explicit indications of such. There is one piece of Crocean philosophy behind it: Since art takes place prior to the intellect, so the logical distinction between subject and predicate collapses; therefore perhaps at least one barrier is removed from speaking of the ‘universality of art’. But that does not indicate what, positively, it means. It obvious that there is something right about speaking of the ‘universal character’ of a Beethoven or a Michelangelo as opposed to the pitiful, narrow little spectacle of this month's girl band, but I don't think that Croce tells us what justifies or explains such talk (various others have reached a similar conclusion; see Orsini p. 214). Still, that doesn't mean that he had no right to proclaim it, and perhaps not to count his readers as agreeing to it.

10. Problems

There is a lot of Croce's aesthetics that we have not discussed, including his criticisms of the discipline of Rhetoric (Aes. 67–73; PPH 233–35), of the doctrine that there are aesthetic differences amongst different kinds of art (Aes. 111–17, EA 53–60, PPH 229–33), of psychological and other naturalistic views of art (Aes.87–93; EA 41–7); there is also his magnificent if contentious précis of the history of aesthetics (Aes. 155–474). But these are points of relative detail; the theory is whole is sufficiently well before us now to conclude by mentioning some general lines of criticism.

10.1 Acting versus Contemplation

The equation of intuition with expression is not, in end, plausible. C. J. Ducasse (1929) put his finger on it. When we look at a vase full of flowers, it does not matter how closely or in what manner we attend to it; we do not create a ‘work of art’ unless we draw or paint it. Croce has lost sight of the ordinary sense of passively contemplating and doing something; between reading and writing, looking and drawing, listening and playing, dancing and watching. Of course all the first members of these pairs involve a mental action of a kind, and there are important connections between the first members and the corresponding seconds—perhaps in terms of what Berenson calls ideated sensations—but that is not to say that there are not philosophically crucial distinctions between them.

10.2 Privacy

The equation also defeats the purpose of art criticism or interpretation, and indeed of the very notion of an aesthetic community, of an audience. To say that the work of art is identical with the intuition is to say that it is necessarily private. It is to say, for example, that since one man's intuition of Botticelli's Venus is necessarily different from any one else's, there is no such thing as Botticelli's Venus, understood not as a material painting but as a work of art; there is only Botticelli's-Venus-for-A, Botticelli's-Venus-for-B, and so on. But these intuitions cannot be compared, and there is no higher standard; thus they cannot be said to agree or disagree, since any such comparison would be logically impossible. The position is perhaps not contradictory, but it is exceedingly unattractive; it renders art a diversion away from reality, when as Freud emphasized—to invoke a figure who is Croce's opposite in almost every respect— the artist's struggle with the medium is the attempt to conquer reality. Although Croce disowned this consequence, it's hard not to conclude that on this view art is a domain of fancy (in the bad sense), without any check upon vanity (see Aes. 122 for a point at which Croce almost sees the point). If we bring back the material painted object into the picture, of course, then there is no such difficulty: ones ‘intuition’ will be accurate, or one's interpretation will be correct, just in case it corresponds to the picture (of course the notion of ‘corresponds to the picture’ is only a placeholder for a great deal to be supplied by theories of representation, perspective, expression and other parts of aesthetics; but the one thing that plausible theories will share is a commitment to the object, the material painting).

It's worth emphasizing again that Croce's claim that intuition is expression, and consequently that works art are mental objects, is not just an application of his general idealism. It is independent of it. In the Encyclopaedia Britannica article, for example, he allows himself to speak for convenience of the ‘spiritual’ and ‘physical’, in order to make the point that the physical object is only of practical, and not of aesthetic significance (PPH 227–8).

10.3 The View of Language

Undoubtedly Croce was influenced by his lifelong immersion in literature in his proclamation that all language is poetry. And perhaps it is true that all language has some poetic qualities, and perhaps it is true that language ‘in its actuality’ consists of sentential utterances. But as Bosanquet pointed out in 1919, this does not mean that language is only poetry, or that the referential dimension of language does not exist. It must have something that distinguishes a scientific treatise from a tune—in fact it must be that the same thing, which I am calling the referential dimension, that serves to distinguish poetry from a tune (it has to have sound and sense, as we say). So to say that drawings and tunes are equally good examples of language seems, at best, strained. Croce would have no doubt said that the referential dimension does not exist, or is a false abstraction; but his general philosophical views, I think, are forcing him down an unprepossessing path. More promising would be a formalist endeavor to try to isolate the pure sonic aspect of poetry—comprising metre, alliteration and so on—and then to search for instantiations or at least analogies in the other arts.

11. Conclusion

Suppose Croce were to give up the idea that art is intuition, and agree that the work of art is identical with the material work—remember this would not prevent him being an idealist in his general philosophy—and suppose he allowed that he was wrong about language. What would remain of his theory would arguably be its essence: that art is expression that we engage with via the intuitive capacity.

In closing, the reader may find it useful if I summarize the major differences between Croce and his follower Collingwood. First, whereas Croce's theory does not tend to regard the expressive content of work of art as something ‘in the artist’, emphasizing instead its form and later its ‘universality’, Collingwood tries to explain expressive content in terms of a detailed theory of the emotions. Second, although Croce does devote some energy to discrediting the ‘technical’ theory of art, Collingwood offers a more organized and detailed analysis of why art is not ‘craft’, though arguably the main points are Croce's. Finally, Collingwood devotes his final sections to a topic left unaddressed by Croce: the problem of whether or what way the responses of the audience can constrain the object presented by the artist.


Primary Sources

Works by Croce:

Secondary Sources

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

art, definition of | Collingwood, Robin George: aesthetics | Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich | idealism | intuition | privacy | Vico, Giambattista


Thanks to Dr. Martine Lejeune of the Department for Applied Linguistics, College Ghent, for bibliographical help and for pointing out certain errors in the original entry.