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Dante Alighieri

First published Mon Jan 29, 2001; substantive revision Fri Dec 18, 2009

Dante's engagement with philosophy cannot be studied apart from his vocation as a writer, in which he sought to raise the level of public discourse by educating his countrymen and inspiring them to pursue happiness in the contemplative life. He was one of the most learned Italian laymen of his day, intimately familiar with Aristotelian logic and natural philosophy, theology (he had a special affinity for the thought of Albert the Great and Thomas Aquinas), and classical literature. His writings reflect this in its mingling of philosophical and theological language, invoking Aristotle and the neo-Platonists side by side with the poet of the psalms. Like Aquinas, Dante wished to summon his audience to the practice of philosophical wisdom, though by means of truths embedded in his own poetry, rather than mysteriously embodied in scripture.

1. Life

Dante was born in 1265 in Florence. At the age of 9 he met for the first time the eight-year-old Beatrice Portinari, who became in effect his Muse, and remained, after her death in 1290, the central inspiration for his major poems. Between 1285, when he married and began a family, and 1302, when he was exiled from Florence, he was active in the cultural and civic life of Florence, served as a soldier and held several political offices.

Since the early thirteenth century two great factions, the Guelfs and the Ghibellines, had competed for control of Florence. The Guelfs, with whom Dante was allied, were identified with Florentine political autonomy, and with the interests of the Papacy in its long struggle against the centralizing ambitions of the Hohenstaufen emperors, who were supported by the Ghibellines. After Charles of Anjou, with the blessing of the Papacy and strong Guelf support, defeated Hohenstaufen armies at Benevento (1265/6) and Tagliacozzo (1268), the Guelfs became the dominant force in Florence. By the end of the century, the Guelfs were themselves riven by faction, grounded largely in family and economic interests, but determined also by differing degrees of loyalty to the papacy and to Guelf allegiances.

In 1301, when conflict arose between the “Blacks,” the faction most strongly committed to Guelf and papal interests, and the more moderate Whites, Pope Boniface VIII instigated a partisan settlement which allowed the Blacks to exile the White leadership, of whom Dante was one. He never returned to Florence, and played no further role in public life, though he remained passionately interested in Italian politics, and became virtually the prophet of world empire in the years leading up to the coronation of Henry VII of Luxemburg as head of the Holy Roman Empire (1312). The development of Dante's almost messianic sense of the imperial role is hard to trace, but it was doubtless affected by his bitterness over what he saw as the autocratic and treacherous conduct of Pope Boniface, and a growing conviction that only a strong central authority could bring order to Italy.

During the next twenty years Dante lived in several Italian cities, spending at least two long periods at the court of Can Grande della Scala, lord of Verona. In 1319 he moved from Verona to Ravenna, where he completed the Paradiso, and where he died in 1321.

Dante's engagement with philosophy cannot be studied apart from his vocation as a writer—as a poet whose theme, from first to last is the significance of his love for Beatrice, but also as an intellectual strongly committed to raising the level of public discourse. After his banishment he addressed himself to Italians generally, and devoted much of his long exile to transmitting the riches of ancient thought and learning, as these informed contemporary scholastic culture, to an increasingly sophisticated lay readership in their own vernacular.

This project was Dante's contribution to a long-standing Italian cultural tradition. His reading in philosophy began, he tells us, with Cicero and Boethius, whose writings are in large part the record of their dedication to the task of establishing a Latinate intellectual culture in Italy. The Convivio and the De vulgari eloquentia preserve also the somewhat idealized memory of the Neapolitan court of Frederick II of Sicily (1195–1250) and his son Manfred (1232–66), intellectuals in their own right as well as patrons of poets and philosophers, whom Dante viewed as having revived the ancient tradition of the statesman-philosopher [Van Cleve, 299-332; Morpurgo]. Dante himself probably studied under Brunetto Latini (1220–94), whose encyclopedic Livres dou Tresor (1262–66), written while Brunetto was a political exile in France, provided vernacular readers with a compendium of the Liberal Arts and a digest of Aristotelian ethical and political thought [Meier; Imbach (1993), 37–47; Davis (1984), 166–97].

But the fullest medieval embodiment of Dante's ideal is his own writings. In them we see for the first time a powerful thinker, solidly grounded in Aristotle, patristic theology, and thirteenth-century scholastic debate, bringing these resources directly to bear on educating his countrymen and inspiring them to pursue the happiness that rewards the philosopher.

2. Early Poetry

Though he evidently did not begin serious study of philosophy until his mid-twenties, Dante had already been intellectually challenged by the work of a remarkable group of poets, practitioners of what he would later recall as the dolce stil novo, in whose hands a lyric poetry modelled on the canso of the Provençal troubadours became a vehicle for serious enquiry into the nature of love and human psychology. A generation earlier Guido Guinizzelli (1230–1276) had puzzled contemporaries with poems treating love in terms of the technicalities of medicine and the cosmology of the schools, while celebrating in quasi-mystical language his lady's power to elevate the spirit of her poet-lover:

Splende in la intelligenzïa del cielo
Deo crïator, più che ‘n nostri occhi ‘l sole;
ella intende suo fattor oltra ‘l cielo,
e ‘l ciel volgiando, a lui obedir tole;
. . .
così dar dovria, al vero,
la bella donna, poi che ‘n gli occhi splende
del suo gentil, talento,
chi mai da lei obedir non si disprende.

[Al cor gentil rempaira sempre amore, 41–44, 47–50]

God the creator shines in the intelligence of heaven more than the sun in our eyes, and this [intelligence] understands her maker beyond the universe. Making the heavens turn, she submits to obey Him . . . So truly should the beautiful lady, when she shines on the eyes of her gentle [lover], impart the desire that his obedience to her never fail.

The Lady, exerting on her lover a power derived from the participation of her understanding in the divine, plays the role of the celestial intelligenze, who transmit the influence of the First Mover to the universe at large. The poet is thus caught up in a circular process through which his understanding, like theirs, is drawn toward the divine as manifested in the lady's divinely inspired radiance. For Guinizelli this exploitation of the idea of celestial hierarchy is perhaps only a daring poetic conceit. For Dante it will become a means to the articulation of his deepest intuitions.

Guido Cavalcanti, Dante's older contemporary and the single strongest influence on his early poetry, was renowned not only as a poet, but for his knowledge of natural philosophy. His great canzone, “Donna mi prega,” which became the subject of learned Latin commentaries, deals with ideas commonly associated with the “radical Aristotelianism” or “Averroism” of his day. The purpose of this astonishing poem is to describe in precise philosophical terms (“naturale dimostramento”) the experience of love.

For Guido there is an absolute cleavage between the sensory and intellectual aspects of the response to a loved object. Once the phantasma of the object becomes an abstracted form in the possible intellect, it is wholly insulated from the diletto of the anima sensitiva (21–28). This has seemed to modern commentators to imply an Averroist view of the intellect as a separate, universal entity [Corti (1983), 3–37], and the lines which follow (30–56), where the vertú of the sensitive soul displaces reason and “assumes its function,” presenting to the will an object whose desirability threatens a fatal disorientation, sustain this impression. Love is still the aristocratic vocation of the troubadours, and Guido acknowledges that noble spirits are aroused by it to prove their merit. But they work in darkness, for the force that moves them obscures the light of intellectual contemplation (57–68). The canzone is so exclusively an exercise in “natural philosophy,” so centered on biological necessity, that consciousness itself is wholly excluded from consideration. The ethical dimension of love consists in the challenge its blind urgency presents to reason. “Nobility” is a matter of self-control, and the precarious happiness that such love affords has no ideal dimension.

Guido's influence on Dante was profound. But the Vita nuova, an anthology of Dante's early poetry interspersed with a narrative combining commentary on his poetic development with the history of his devotion to Beatrice during her earthly life, reveals a growing realization that his own conception of poetry and love differ fundamentally from Guido's. Like Guido Dante accepted love as being, for better or worse, fundamental to the noble life, and his early lyrics express a sense like Guido's of the internally divisive power of desire. But as the Vita nuova unfolds there is a gradual shift of focus: having failed to win his lady's favor by dramatizing his own sufferings, Dante resolves to devote his poetry henceforth wholly to praise of her [VN, c. 18.4–6]. The result of this new resolve is a canzone, “Donne ch'avete intelletto d'amore” (“Ladies who have intelligence of love”), which returns to the source of his inspiration and Guido's in the poetry of Guinizelli, and makes a wholly new departure. For Guido, the “heavenly” allure of the lady is a deception perpetrated by the senses, all the more dangerous as the lover's gentilezza responds more fully to the attraction of her beauty and subjects itself to the “fierce accident” of passion. Dante, too, sees that the experience his early, tormented lyrics depict is “an accident occurring in a substance” [VN 25.1–2], but the “fiery spirits of love” which strike the eyes of those on whom his lady bestows her greeting are not just goads to desire:

E quando trova alcun che degno sia
di veder lei. quei prova sua vertute,
ché li avvien, ciò che li dona, in salute,
e sì l'umilia ch'ogni offesa oblia.
Ancor l'ha Dio per maggior grazia dato
che non pò mal finir chi l'ha parlato.

[Donne ch'avete intelletto d'amore, 37–42, VN 19.10]

And when she finds one who is worthy to behold her, he feels her power, for what she bestows on him is restorative, and humbles him, so that he forgets any injury. Moreover God has made the power of her grace even greater, for no one who has spoken with her can come to a bad end.

Pursuit of the lady's favor has become a test, not just of nobility, but of virtue. Her beauty is perfect, the fullest possible exampling of nature's power to reveal God's creative love. The climax of the Vita nuova occurs when Dante encounters Guido's lady, Giovanna, followed by his own Beatrice, “one marvel,” as he says, “following the other” [VN 24.8]. At once he realizes that Giovanna's beauty, like the prophecy of the biblical Giovanni, is a precursor, heralding the “true light” of Beatrice, just as Guido's poetry of earthly love is finally a foil to his own celebration of the transcendent love revealed to him in Beatrice.

3. Philosophical Training

The philosophical content of the Vita nuova is minimal, a skeletal version of contemporary faculty psychology and a few brief references to metaphysics. But while finding his orientation as a poet Dante was also engaged in the study of philosophy, and spent “some thirty months” frequenting “the schools of the religious orders and the disputations of the philosophers” [Conv. 2.12.7]. This period must have included study in the Dominican school at Santa Maria Novella, where Dante could have learned logic and natural philosophy, and heard Fra Remigio de'Girolami (d. 1319) expound a theology based on Thomas and Aristotle [Panella; Davis (1984), 198–223]. Remigio, like Dante, read widely in classical literature of all sorts, and he was fond of drawing lessons in political and ethical conduct from his reading. For both Remigio and Dante, moreover, Thomas was primarily the author of the Summa contra Gentiles and the commentary on the Ethics, concerned, like Aristotle himself, to demonstrate the capacities of human reason as a means to truth.

Dante cites a dozen works of Aristotle, apparently at first hand, and shows a particularly intimate knowledge of the Ethics, largely derived, no doubt, from Thomas [Minio-Paluello]. But his Aristotelianism was nourished by other sources as well. Bruno Nardi has argued persuasively that his attitude toward the study of philosophy also owes a great deal to the more eclectic Albert the Great [Nardi (1967), 63–72; (1992), 28–29; Vasoli (1995b)]. In Albert he encountered a wide-ranging encyclopedism which included original work, experimental and theoretical, in natural science, and treated Aristotelian natural philosophy and psychology in the light of a neo-Platonism derived from Arabic philosophers and such Greco-Arab sources as the Liber de Causis, as well as the Christian neo-Platonist tradition of the Pseudo-Dionysius. Albert aimed to discover Aristotle's own meaning, with the help of Greek and Arab commentators who led him into disagreement with other Latini, including at certain points his pupil Thomas, and he asserts more than once that philosophy and theology are separate spheres of knowledge. It was doubtless this willingness to pursue philosophy on its own terms that appealed to Dante, who also sought to distinguish philosophical and religious knowledge without simply subordinating the former to the latter.

Albert's view of the procession of the universe from the “substantial light” of the divine intellect through the operation of a hierarchy of lesser intelligences is clearly perceptible in Dante's treatment of the cosmic intelligenze or sostanze separate in the Convivio [Conv. 2.4–5; Nardi (1992), 47–62]. It shows up again in his treatment of the growth of the human embryo, which seems to imply, not a sequence of animations by nutritive, sensitive and intellective powers, as for Thomas, but the continuous operation of a single virtus formativa, whose operation Albert compares to that of the prima intelligentia in the soul [De intellectu & intelligibili 2.2], and which is responsible not only for the development of the human creature but for effecting its union with an essentially external anima intellectiva [Boyde (1981) 270–79; Nardi (1960), 9–68; (1967), 67–70].

Albert is thus a likely conduit for seemingly Averroist elements in Dante's thought. He regards intellectual activity as the operation of the intellectus agens, through which the human soul is illumined by the divine Intelligence. Each soul possesses its own intellect, but this intellect is a “reflection” (resultatio) of the light of the primal mind, which thus, in effect, becomes itself the true agent intellect. Albert explicitly rejects the Averroist view of the active intellect as itself a celestial intelligence, a single, separate substance which actualizes in the passive intellect phantasms supplied by individual human minds. But he argues that only an intellect universal in nature can produce an understanding of universal forms. The intellect and the soul of which it is a function thus partake of the character of the separate intelligences. Soul is not the actualizing essence of the human creature, as in Thomas, but is related to body through the mediation of its organic faculties. In itself, through its agent intellect, the soul is drawn to contemplate the intelligences which order the universe at large, is informed by them with the transcendent knowledge they manifest, and finally “stands” in the divine intellect. In this way certain men are enabled to fulfil the innate human desire for understanding and attain a natural beatitude, “substantiated and formed in the divine being” [Albert, De intellectu & intelligibili 2.2–12; Nardi (1960), 145–50].

That this fulfillment is attained through natural understanding, with no recourse to the theology of grace and revelation, marks a crucial difference between Albert and Thomas, who devotes several chapters of the Summa contra gentiles to a forceful refutation of the notion that final happiness as defined by Aristotle is possible in this life [SCG 3.37–48]. For Thomas the desire to know is one and the same at all levels, and philosophy, seeking the causes of things, is ultimately “ordered entirely to the knowing of God” [SCG 3.25.9] Dante's own position on this question is difficult to define precisely. The poet of the Paradiso is at one with Thomas on the value of philosophy as consisting finally in its power to prepare the mind for faith [Par. 4.118–32; 29.13–45], but he shares Albert's fascination with natural understanding, and in earlier writings his willingness to grant philosophy a “beatitude” of its own hints at a latent dualism in his thought [Foster (1965), 51–71; (1977), 193–208; de Libera (1991), 333–36]. How far this reflects his responsiveness to neo-Platonism as mediated by Albert or in such works as the Liber de causis is hard to determine. Nardi, who argued successfully for seeing Dante as an eclectic thinker [Diomedi (2005), 1–23], stressed the importance of the Liber de Causis. But recent studies have argued that Nardi, in his zeal to free Dante from the constraints of the orthodox Thomism that scholars like Pierre Mandonnet and Giovanni Busnelli claimed to find in him, exaggerates the neo-Platonist strain in his thinking [Iannucci (1997); Moevs, 17–35].

Dante was surely aware also of a “radical” Aristotelianism centered in Bologna, where masters influenced by Siger of Brabant and Boethius of Dacia were affirming the autonomy of human reason and its capacity to attain happiness through its own powers [Corti (1981), 9–31; Vanni Rovighi]. But these thinkers, too, were following paths first taken by Albert, and his influence, together with that of Thomas, is sufficient to account for the distinctive features of Dante's use of philosophy [Imbach (1996b), 399–413]. Whatever the precise channels, Dante was unquestionably one of the most learned Italian laymen of his day, aware of the issues contested in the schools, and at home with the modes of discourse in which they were discussed.

But there is also an old-fashioned strain in Dante's thinking, an idealistic, Platonizing view of the mental universe which recalls not just the neo-Platonized Aristotle of the Liber de causis, but the more primitive encyclopedism of twelfth- century thinkers like Bernardus Silvestris and Alan of Lille, poet-philosophers whose world view, inherited from late-antique neo-Platonism, was defined by the Liberal Arts and the cosmology of Plato's Timaeus [Vasoli (1995a), 83–102; Garin, 64–70]. In Bernardus' Cosmographia and Alan's Anticlaudianus, the unfolding of the secrets of nature by the enquiring mind generates an allegory of intellectual pilgrimage toward truth. Dante's experience of philosophy, though defined in more dynamic and sophisticated terms, is a version of the same journey. The experience of love becomes a means to self-realization, and an awareness of the hierarchy of forces operative in the universe at large, which makes possible an ascensus mentis ad sapientiam, to that “amoroso uso della sapienza” which enables the human mind to participate in the divine.

4. The Convivio

The record of Dante's thirty months of study, and the fullest expression of his philosophical thought, is the Convivio, in which commentary on a series of his own canzoni is the occasion for the expression of a range of ideas on ethics, politics, and metaphysics, as well as for extended discussion of philosophy itself. Dante describes the genesis of his love of philosophy, and reflects on the ability of philosophical understanding to mediate religious truth, tracing the desire for knowledge from its origin as an inherent trait of human nature to the point at which the love of wisdom expresses itself directly as love of God.

Philosophy itself is the “love of Wisdom,” and Dante's central metaphor for representing it is the poetic celebration of a noble lady, a donna gentile, an act which, like Guinizelli, he sees as involving the influence of cosmic powers. His poetry, “materiated” out of love and virtue [Conv. 1.1.14] comes into being because his nature is responsive to the influence of the “movers” of the universe, the intelligences, whose loving understanding determines “the most noble form of heaven” as they in turn respond to “the love of the Holy Spirit” [2.5.13, 18]. Their cosmic activity is a continual translation of understanding into love and natural process, and it is this which causes Dante to sing [2, Canzone, 1–9]:

Voi che ‘ntendendo il terzo ciel movete,
udite il ragionar ch'è nel mio core,
ch'io nol so dire altrui, sì mi par novo.
El ciel che segue lo vostro valore,
gentili creature che voi sete,
mi tragge ne lo stato ov'io mi trovo.
Onde ‘l parlar de la vita ch'io provo,
par che si drizzi degnamente a vui:
però vi priego che lo mi ‘ntendiate.

You who by understanding move the third heaven, hear the discourse which is in my heart, and which seems so strange to me that I know not how to say it to others. The heaven which responds to your power, noble creatures that you are, draws me into the state in which I find myself, and so it seems that speech about the life I am experiencing is most appropriately addresses to you. Therefore I pray that you will understand me.

The intellective power or intendimento of the intelligences moves Dante to an utterance which only these same powers can fully understand. Thus there is a continuum, a process of circulazione which begins in the mind of God and descends through the work of the intelligenze to draw Dante's nature into that praise of the donna gentile which constitutes the fulfillment of his own nature, the highest expression of which his desire and intellect are capable [2.5.15, 18; 2.6.5, Diomedi (1999)].

Of the four books or trattati of the Convivio the first is largely a defense of Dante's decision to write his prose commentaries, as well as the poems they expound, in the Tuscan vernacular rather than in Latin. The second book provides a delineation of the Ptolemaic universe which the intelligenze govern, capped by a description of the Empyrean Heaven [2.3.8–11]:

. . . outside all of these [spheres, heavens] the Catholics place the Empyrean heaven, which is to say, “the heaven of flame,” or “luminous heaven”; and they hold it to be motionless because it has in itself, with respect to each of its parts, that which its matter desires. This is why the Primum Mobile has the swiftest movement; for because of the most fervent desire that each part of the ninth heaven has to be conjoined with every part of that divinest, tranquil heaven, to which it is contiguous, it revolves beneath it with such desire that its velocity is almost incomprehensible. Stillness and peace are the qualities of the place of that Supreme Deity which alone completely beholds itself. This is the place of the blessed spirits, according to the will of the Holy Church, which cannot lie. Aristotle, to anyone who rightly understands him, seems to hold the same opinion in the first book of Heaven and the World [i.e. De caelo]. This is the supreme edifice of the universe in which all the world is enclosed and beyond which there is nothing; it is not itself in space but was formed solely in the Primal Mind, which the Greeks call Protonoe. This is that magnificence of which the Psalmist spoke when he says to God: “Your magnificence is exaltled above the heavens.”

The role of the Empyrean in thirteenth-century thought is equivocal. Some thinkers attempt to explain it scientifically, as a comprehensive cosmic principle, while for Thomas and Albert any such realm must be spiritual in nature, and can bear no natural relation to the astronomical universe, though both at times seem to grant it a certain influence on the natural order [Nardi (1967), 196–214; Vasoli (1995a), 94–102]. Dante's account reflects these uncertainties. He begins by citing “the Catholics,” or orthodox belief, as authority for his account of this “abode of the supreme deity,” but then goes on to treat the Empyrean as a created thing, “formed in the Primal Mind,” and as the motionless cause of motion in the physical universe. If God dwells in this place, the Empyrean resides equally in Him, and the universe at large is encompassed, causally and locally, by the Empyrean. Dante deploys the Aristotelian physics of desire to explain the relationship of the Empyrean to the lesser heavens, yet it is at the same time beyond space, a wholly spiritual realm where blessed spirits participate in the divine mind. Dante seems to emphasize this double status by mingling theological and philosophical language, and invoking Aristotle and the neo-Platonists side by side with the poet of the Psalms. In the Paradiso the problems raised here will be implicitly resolved by a brilliant recourse to the “metaphysics of light”; when Dante and Beatrice, emerging from the “greatest body,” the crystalline sphere or Primum Mobile, pass on “al ciel ch'è pura luce, / Luce intellettual piena d'amore” [Par. 30.39–40], we know that we are at the precise point at which the bonum diffusivum sui that is God's love transforms itself to cosmic energy, “the love that moves the sun and the other stars.” But poetry is perhaps the only means of defining this threshold [Bonaventure, Sent. 2. d. 2, a. 2, q. 1, c. 4; Thomas, Quodl. 6, q. 11, a. unicus 19].

Similar ambiguities appear in Dante's discussion of the intelligenze themselves. Since in governing the several heavens the intelligences engage in a kind of civil life, they must enjoy an active as well as a contemplative existence. But the latter is of a higher order than the former, and no single intelligence can partake of both. Influenced perhaps by Thomas's commentary, Dante imputes to Aristotle in the Ethics the view that such divine beings must know only a contemplative life [2.4.13; cp. Aristotle, NE 10.8, 1178b; Thomas, Exp. Eth. 10, lect. 12, 2125]. Dante's attempt to resolve the issue is oddly unpersuasive. He argues that the circular motion of the heavens, by which the world is governed, is really a function of the contemplative activity of the intelligences [2.4.13]. Here, as in the case of the Empyrean which they inhabit, we can see Aristotle's celestial movers undergoing a neo-Platonizing transformation, but Dante ends this stage of his discussion by noting that the truth concerning the Intelligences can not be fully grasped by our earthly understanding [2.4.16–17].

The second book concludes with an extended allegory in which the concentric “heavens” or planetary spheres are identified with the seven Liberal Arts, the “starry sphere” with physics and metaphysics, the Primum mobile with moral philosophy, and the Empyrean beyond with theology. This synthesis of the natural and the intellectual universe expresses an ideal of education which harks back to the late-antique sources of twelfth-century Platonism, but which Dante has imbued with new life. His emphasis on the ordering function of moral wisdom, and on the happiness attainable through intellectual contemplation, reflects an engagement with the philosophical tradition, and a commitment to philosophy as such, which belong to the later thirteenth century. The final chapter of Book Two affirms the beauty that consists in seeing the causes of those “wonders” which, as the opening of the Metaphysics declares, draw us to philosophy.

The third book is perhaps the most important for the student of Dante's knowledge and use of philosophy. Its central theme is praise of philosophy's power, as “l'amoroso uso della sapienza,” “the loving use of wisdom,” to impart the highest happiness to those who love her, perfecting their natures and drawing them close to God, of whose majesty and wisdom her beauty is the expression. It is largely a meditation on love, understood as Dante's response, intellectual, poetic and psychological, to his enlightenment at the hands of the beautiful lady whom he celebrates as Philosophy.

Early in the third book Dante cites the Liber de Causis: Every “substantial form” proceeds from the first cause, God, and participates in His divine nature according to its nobility [3.2.4–7; LC 1.1]. The human soul, noblest of all created forms, loves all things to the degree that they manifest the divine goodness, but desires above all to be united with God. Philosophy is the expression of this desire: Its “form” is “an almost divine love of knowledge” [3.11.13] which leads to “the spiritual uniting of the soul with what it loves” [3.2.3]. It is through philosophy that humanity perfects its “truly human or, better, angelic nature, that is to say the rational [nature]” [3.3.11], discovering in itself “that distinguished and most precious part which is deity” and “participating in the divine nature as an everlasting intelligence” [3.2.14, 19]. As such it mirrors the nobility, wisdom and love of the divine essence and its “loving use of wisdom” becomes by participation “marriage” with God [3.12.11–14].

All of this may appear sheer fantasy, but we should remember that the aim of philosophy as the Convivio pursues it is to attain, through natural reason, the greatest happiness of which we are capable in our earthly state. Such felicity is of course circumscribed by our mortality, and the Dante who can celebrate philosophical understanding as a quasi-mystical union with God knows at the same time that true union is granted only through grace, to a soul made receptive by the infusion of virtues which wholly transcend the workings of rational, natural virtue. For as Thomas says, the rational virtues “are dispositions by which man is fittingly disposed with reference to the nature by which he is a man. But the infused virtues dispose man in a higher way, and in view of a higher end; and also, it follows, with reference to some higher nature” [ST]. This “higher nature” is of course the divine nature “through participation in which we are reborn in grace.”

Dante acknowledges Thomas's distinction when he speaks of the soul after death as “more than human” [2.8.6], and asserts that to perceive God is not possible for our nature [3.15.10]. For both Dante and Thomas humanness is defined by the conjoining of soul and body, and human knowledge depends on the evidence of the senses [Foster (1965), 69–71; Thomas, ST 1.89a1]. Aristotle had similarly argued that a life of pure contemplation is beyond our strictly human capacity; we can live in this way only to the extent that we have in us “something divine” [NE 10.7, 1177b]. Thomas argues more subtly that the modus essendi of the soul joined to the body differs from that of the soul in separation; though they are the same in nature, the separated soul understands, not by means of sensory images, but “through species which it participates in by virtue of the divine light” [ST 1.89.1r]. In the meantime, as Dante acknowledges, there are truths which we can apprehend only as if in a dream, “come sognando,” [Conv. 3.15.6; Nardi (1944), 81–90], and our desire for perfect understanding is necessarily limited, “proportionate to the wisdom which can be acquired here”; for to desire what is beyond the capacity of our intellectual nature would be ethically and rationally incoherent, a desire for imperfection rather than perfection of understanding [3.15.8–10].

But the Convivio continually strains against these limits. For Dante, first and foremost a poet of love, the experience of acquiring philosophical understanding has an important psychological component. By enabling us to analyze the processes of perception, philosophy brings us into contact with the true nature of things, and for Dante, as Kenelm Foster observes, the slightest such contact could have a metaphysical value [Foster (1965), 59–60]: “It did not in one sense matter to Dante what the particular object of his knowing might be, since the joy of knowing it was already a foretaste of all conceivable knowledge and all joy; and this precisely because, in knowing, the mind seized truth. . . . once intelligence, the truth-faculty, had tasted truth as such, that is, its own correspondence with reality, it could not help desiring truth whole and entire, that is, its correspondence with all reality.” At this point knowledge and the joy of possessing it combine to prepare the ground for faith. By explaining phenomena which without her guidance would merely astonish us, philosophy inspires us to believe “that every miracle can be perceived by a superior intellect to have a reasonable cause” [3.14.14]:

Our good faith has its origin in this, from which comes the hope that longs for things foreseen; and from this springs the activity of charity. By these three virtues we ascend to philosophize in that celestial Athens where Stoics and Peripatetics and Epicureans, by the light of eternal truth, join ranks in a single harmonious will.

Philosophy thus conceived can still be regarded as the handmaid of theology, but as Dante develops his philosophical ideal metaphorically in terms of the beauty of the Donna Gentile, it assumes a religious value of its own. Since the wisdom she embodies is the consummation of human self-realization, the Donna Gentile resides in the divine mind as “the intentional exemplar of the human essence” [3.6.6]. In desiring her we desire our own perfection, for she is “as supremely perfect as the human essence can be.” When at this point Dante adds a reminder that nothing in our human experience can fully satisfy this desire, he seems to be acknowledging that what Thomas' Ethics commentary calls “the ultimate end of desire's natural inclination” is unattainable in this life, since it would require an understanding more complete than any human being can possess [Thomas, Exp. Eth. 1, lect. 9, 107; SCG 3.48.2].

But having provided this caution, Dante seems to ignore it, as if unable to resist the conviction that philosophy satisfies our desire in a manner proper to itself. Everything naturally desires its own perfection, and for human beings this is “the perfection of reason” [3.15.3–4; cp. Thomas, Exp. Eth. 9, lect. 9, 1872]. But philosophy, as embodied in the Donna Gentile, is not just the consummation of natural understanding. For Dante, as for Aristotle, the human intellect as such is somehow more than human, and he is at times similarly unclear on the question of whether human beings can attain happiness through the exercise of virtue, and to what extent it is a gift of the gods [Foster (1977), 198–201]. Repeatedly he draws a distinction between merely human happiness and that attainable through grace, only to seemingly disregard it in subsequent discussion. Thus in the final chapter of the third treatise he acknowledges the “strong misgivings” that one might have about the happiness attainable through philosophy. Since certain things—God, eternity, and primal matter are named—exceed the capacity of our intellect, our natural desire to know must remain unfulfilled in this life [3.15.7]. Dante answers this by affirming, as noted above, that the natural desire for perfection is always proportionate to our capacity to attain it; for to desire the unattainable would be to desire our imperfection [3.15.8–11]. Human happiness, then, consists in the attainment of Aristotle's “human good,” through the exercise of the virtues. This is what Dante calls “l'umana operazione,” and its end is the highest that human beings can attain through their own powers.

Yet philosophy offers the promise of more. The same chapter is climaxed by the vision of Wisdom as “the mother of all things,” the origin of all motion and order in the created universe, guiding the quest of human wisdom by the light of the divine intellect. When the human mind is fully informed by philosophy, it would appear, it becomes virtually one of the intelligenze, who know both what is above them and what is below, God as cause and the created universe as effect [3.6.4–6]. Thus Dante can speak of our rational nature as our “truly human, or, to speak more exactly, our angelic nature” [3.3.11], as if it enjoyed a more or less mystical existence of a higher order as well as that of the “merely” human nature that pursues the active life of virtue [Moevs, 83–86].

The Liber de causis says that each cause infuses into its effect the goodness it receives from its own cause, or, in the case of the soul, from God [Conv. 3.6.11; LC 4.48]. When in gazing on the body of the Donna Gentile we behold maravigliose cose, we are perceiving the effect of a cause which is ultimately God, and thus, Dante asserts [3.6.12–13]:

it is evident that her form (that is, her soul), which directs the body as its proper cause, miraculously receives the goodness of God's grace. Thus outward appearance provides proof that this lady has been endowed and ennobled by God beyond what is due to our nature . . .

Thus in effect the Donna Gentile is the perfection we desire. Through her we experience the divine goodness, by an outflowing, a discorrimento which Dante glosses with a further reference to the Liber de Causis [3.7.2; LC 20.157], in terms of the hierarchical emanation of the divine goodness. In the quasi-continuous series of gradations that descends from angel to brute animal, there is no intervening grade between man and angel, so that some human beings are so noble as to be nothing less than angels [Aristotle, NE 7.1, 1145a]. Such is the Donna Gentile; she receives divine virtue just as the angels do [3.7.7]. She is a thing visibilmente miraculosa, ordained from eternity by God in testimonio de la fede for us [3.7.16–17; Foster (1965), 56]. Philosophy has “wisdom for her subject matter and love for her form” [3.14.1], and God, by instilling his radiance in her, “reduces” that love as nearly as possible to his own similitude [3.14.3; cp. Thomas, SCG 1.91].

Philosophy has clearly become far more than the means whereby human nature achieves self-realization, though this ideal continues to provide a framework for Dante's praise of her. She has assumed the status of Wisdom, sapientia, the divine mind as expressed in the order and harmony of creation. Her beauty can only be described in terms of its effects, like the separate substances and God Himself. The true philosopher “loves every part of wisdom, and wisdom every part of the philosopher, since she draws him to herself in full measure” [3.11.12]. Here we may recall Dante's account of how the swift motion of the Primum Mobile expresses its desire for total participation in the divinity of the Empyrean [2.3.8]. And it is in such terms that Dante ends his account of philosophy-as-wisdom. In the final chapter of the third treatise she is explicitly identified with the all-creating Wisdom of God [3.15.15], and Dante concludes in prophetic exhortation [3.15.17]:

O worse than dead are you who flee her friendship! Open your eyes, and gaze forth! For she loved you before you existed, preparing and ordering your coming; and after you were made, she came to you in your own likeness in order to place you on the straight way.

The fourth treatise of the Convivio seems to have been written later than the first three, and it is markedly different in orientation. The principal theme of its canzone is the true nature of nobility. Introducing his prose discussion, Dante gives a curious account of how an interruption in his philosophical studies, caused by what the canzone calls “disdainful and harsh” behavior on the part of the Donna Gentile, provided an occasion for taking up this topic [4.1.8]:

Since this lady of mine had somewhat altered the tenderness of her looks at me, especially in those features at which I would gaze when seeking to learn whether the primal matter of the elements was intended by God—and for this reason I refrained for a short period of time from coming into the presence of her countenance—while living, as it were, in her absence, I set about contemplating the shortcoming within man regarding the above-mentioned error [i.e. a false perception of the bases of human nobility].

That God is the creator of prime matter was an article of faith, and Thomas had dealt decisively with the role of divine will and intellect in the creative act [SCG 2.20.7, 21–24]. That Dante should admit to having entertained doubts about such a question is perhaps a way of indicating his awareness of a danger inherent in his philosophical studies. Deeply concerned to affirm the dignity of reason and the truth embodied in material creation, he may have sensed himself idolizing the secondary powers in whose hierarchical circulazione he felt himself, as poet, to be in a special sense participant, and allowing these preoccupations to cloud his awareness of God's omnipotence. The anger of the Donna Gentile would then express his sense of a corresponding loss of focus, a failure to affirm her unique and transcendent role in the expression of the divine will.

Whatever the precise nature of the dilemma to which Dante alludes, the fourth treatise is marked by a noticeable shift away from metaphysics in the direction of ethics and rhetoric. Philosophical knowledge is redirected to the purposes of social and political life, and the treatise, while punctuated like the others by numerous digressions, pursues a single sustained argument. Dante begins by explaining that social order as a condition of human happiness, and that it requires a single governor whose authority embraces that of all particular governors and directs their several efforts to a single end [4.4]. After a long digression on the role of Rome in the providential design of human history, he turns from political to philosophical authority, citing Aristotle as in effect the governor of the mind, “master and leader of human reason insofar as it is directed to man's highest work” [4.6.8]. He then proceeds to qualify both political and philosophical authority, justifying himself at length as he does so. Imputing to Aristotle the statement that “whatever appears true to the majority cannot be entirely false” [Topica 1.1, 100b? NE 1.9. 1098b?], he explains that this must be understood to apply, not to sense perception, but only to acts of the mind [4.8.6]. An emperor's authority, too, must be circumscribed; the art of ruling and the laws it creates cannot overrule rational judgment based on the laws of nature [4.9].

On this basis Dante proceeds to refute the view that nobility consists in wealth and ancestry, a view which he here attributes to Frederick II, “the last emperor of the Romans,” and for which he will elsewhere cite Aristotle's Politics [Mon. 2.3.4; Pol. 4.8, 1294a]. Perhaps as significant as the arguments he musters to show the treacherous nature of riches and the uncertain course of nobility from one generation to another is the assertion of Dante's own authority, as philosopher and citizen, that is implied by his elaborate apology for speaking as he does [Ascoli, 35–41]. The gesture nicely epitomizes the project of the Convivio, a vernacular discourse which defines for its lay audience the limits of political and scholastic authority, and affirms the autonomy and potential dignity of individual human reason.

The later portions of the fourth treatise are grounded in another Aristotelian definition of nobility, as the perfection of a thing according to its nature [Conv. 4.16.7; Physics 7.3.246a]. The human expression of this perfection is virtue, moral and intellectual. Electing to address the moral virtues, as more accessible to a lay understanding, Dante begins by describing how nobility is implanted in the nascent soul as the seed of virtue, from which spring the two branches of the active and the contemplative life. The final chapters of the Convivio show how the virtues that stem from nobility can direct “the natural appetite of the mind,” enabling it to evolve through love of them to the happiness which is the end of virtue [Conv. 4.17.8–9; NE 1.13, 1102a].

In the final stanza of the canzone analyzed in the fourth treatise, Dante addresses the poem itself as “Contra-li-erranti mia,” “my song against-the-erring ones,” and the final chapter of the commentary explains this as an allusion to the Summa contra gentiles of Thomas, written “to confound all those who stray from our faith” [Conv. 4.30.3]. By thus declaring himself the follower of so fine a craftsman, Dante suggests, he hopes to “ennoble” his own undertaking.

The Contra gentiles may seem an odd choice of model. Bruno Nardi considers that Dante had at most a superficial knowledge of this work at the time when he wrote the Convivio, and it is certainly the case that he is fundamentally at odds with Thomas over such specific matters as the origin of the soul, the role of the celestial intelligences in creation, and, more important, in claiming for philosophy the power to fulfil the human desire for knowledge in this life [Nardi (1992), 28–29]. On all of these matters Dante is closer to the position of Albert.

On the broader question of the nature of the human desire for knowledge, and the extent to which this desire can be fulfilled by the rational intellect, Dante remains, throughout the Convivio, sharply at odds with Thomas. The fourth treatise offers what we may take as his final word, as philosopher, on this question. Having dwelt at length on the insatiability of the base desire for riches, Dante addresses the question of whether our desire for knowledge, too, since it continues to grow as knowledge is acquired, is not similarly base. Dante begins his answer by asserting that “the supreme desire of each thing, and the one that is first given to it by nature, is to return to its first cause,” and illustrates this proposition by the images of a traveller on an unfamiliar road, who imagines each house he encounters to be the inn he seeks, and the desires of youth, which focus first on an apple or a pet bird, then evolve to encompass love and prosperity [Conv. 4.12.15–16]. But while this may seem to evoke Thomas's view of a single desire which seeks to grow continuously toward union with God, Dante's point is that the path to fulfillment involves multiple desires and the attainment of multiple perfections [Conv. 34.13.2]:

For if I desire to know the principles of natural things, as soon as I know them this desire is fulfilled and brought to an end. If I then desire to know what each of these principles is and how each exists, this is a new and separate desire. Nor by the appearance of this desire am I dispossessed of the perfection to which I was brought by the other, and this growth is not the cause of imperfection but of greater perfection.

Thomas can speak of the natural desire to know as a force like gravity, whose attraction intensifies as it approaches its object [SCG 3.25.13]. In contrast Dante's insistence on types and stages of knowing may seem almost perverse, a matter of emphasizing the stages of the mind's ascent rather than the desire that leads it forward from stage to stage. But what is at stake for Dante is the need to acknowledge human ends as having a definite value of their own, and this need will play an equally important role in Dante's other major philosophical work, the Monarchia.

Before leaving the Convivio, however, I would like to suggest a way in which Dante's citation of the Summa contra gentiles is, after all, an appropriate way of labelling his own undertaking. The Contra gentiles is unique among medieval summae in aiming to demonstrate, not just the compatibility of Aristotelian physics and metaphysics with revealed truth, but the extent to which the invisibilia Dei can be understood without recourse to that truth. In Norman Kretzmann's phrase it is “a risky tour de force” that actively engages unbelievers in metaphysical argument, and spends more time undoing mistakes than affirming Christian doctrine. Revealed truth provides a means of determining the topics to be discussed, and the harmony of natural demonstration with revelation is repeatedly noted, but the basis for demonstration is provided by Aristotle, and what the first three of Thomas's four books present is a case, not for Christianity, but for theism [Kretzmann, pp. 43–53].

Dante seems to acknowledge the pioneering aspect of Thomas's undertaking. Like Thomas, he is testing philosophy, privileging Aristotle as a unique resource capable of helping him discover truth by natural means. Gauthier sees Thomas “nel mezzo del cammin” as he composes the Contra gentiles, adopting the position of the Aristotelian sapiens to reflect on his own ongoing work and justify it to contemporaries [Gauthier, 179–81]. Dante, too, is deeply concerned to define and justify his own position as a voice of wisdom for his contemporaries. The truths he affirms are encoded in his own poetry, rather than mysteriously embodied in Scripture, and he addresses a cultured but non-Latinate audience unschooled in philosophy. But in substituting the Donna Gentile of philosophical wisdom for Beatrice beata, the “authentic,” salvific Beatrice who will reemerge as the voice of truth in the Commedia, Dante is establishing a relationship between secular knowledge and the truth that Beatrice embodies analogous to the relation Thomas establishes between philosophy and theology proper.

5. The Monarchia

The Monarchia is in its own way as idiosyncratic as the Convivio. Its purpose, foreshadowed in the discussion of empire in Convivio IV, is to demonstrate the necessity of a single ruling power, reverent toward but independent of the Church, capable of ordering the will of collective humanity in peace and concord. Under such a power the potential intellect of humanity can be fully actuated—the intellect, that is, of collective humanity, existent throughout the world, acting as one. For just as a multitude of species must continually be generated to actualize the full potentiality of prime matter, so the full intellectual capacity of humanity cannot be realized at one time nor in a single individual [Mon. 1.3.3–8]. Here Dante adds his own further particularization of this Aristotelian doctrine [De Anima 3.5, 430a10–15], asserting that no single household, community, or city can bring it to realization. The ordering of the collective human will to the goal of realizing its intellectual potential requires universal peace [1.4], and this in turn requires a single ordering power through whose authority humanity may achieve unity and so realize the intention and likeness of God [1.8].

The basis of this argument for empire is evidently the first sentence of the Prologue to Thomas' literal commentary on the Metaphysics, where he declares that when several things are ordered to a single end, one of them must govern, “as the Philosopher teaches in his Politics” [Thomas, Exp. Metaph., Proemium; Aristotle, Politics 1.5, 1254a-55a]. For Thomas this is only an analogy, a way of introducing the theme of order as it applies to the soul and its pursuit of happiness. The passage he cites from the Politics is concerned only with the rudiments of hierarchy; the idea of “ordering of things to one end” is present only by implication, and Aristotle makes no attempt to develop its metaphysical implications. Dante, however, seems clearly to associate with Aristotle, or with Thomas' reference to Aristotle, the idea of “a political organization which leads in its way to ‘beatitudo’ for the whole human race” [Minio-Paluello, 74–77]. One may wonder if Dante's erroneous impression of the Aristotelian passage, which he cites directly with no reference to Thomas in both the Convivio and the Monarchia [Conv. 4.4.5; Mon. 1.5.3], is not a symptom of his intense need to draw the Philosopher into support of his view of world empire.

The second of the Monarchia's three books deals with the great example of Rome, describing the city's providential role in world history, largely by way of citations from Roman literature aimed at demonstrating the consistent dedication of Roman power to the public good, and the conformity of Roman imperium with the order of nature and the will of God. The third book deals with the crucial issue of the relationship between political and ecclesiastical authority. Dante argues on various grounds that power in the temporal realm is neither derived from nor dependent on spiritual authority, though it benefits from the power of the Papacy to bless its activity. These arguments consist largely in refutations of traditional claims for the temporal authority of the Papacy, but the final chapter makes the argument on positive grounds. Since man consists of soul and body, his nature partakes of both the corruptible and the incorruptible. Uniting two natures, his existence must necessarily be ordered to the goals of both these natures [Mon. 3.16.7–9]:

Ineffable providence has thus set before us two goals to aim at: i.e. happiness in this life, which consists in the exercise of our own powers and is figured in the earthly paradise; and happiness in the eternal life, which consists in the enjoyment of the vision of God (to which our own powers cannot raise us except with the help of God's light) and which is signified by the heavenly paradise. Now these two kinds of happiness must be reached by different means, as representing different ends. For we attain the first through the teachings of philosophy, provided that we follow them putting into practice the moral and intellectual virtues; whereas we attain the second through spiritual teachings which transcend human reason, provided that we follow them putting into practice the theological virtues, i.e. faith, hope, and charity. These ends and the means to attain them have been shown to us on the one hand by human reason, which has been entirely revealed to us by the philosophers, and on the other by the Holy Spirit . . .

This is Dante's most explicit, uncompromising claim for the autonomy of reason, reinforced by the entire world-historical argument of the Monarchia and constituting its final justification for world empire. Dante here goes well beyond Augustine's sense of the stabilizing function of empire, and eliminates any hint of the anti-Roman emphasis in Augustine's separation of the earthly and heavenly cities. In the final sentences of the Monarchia the temporal monarch becomes, like the aspiring intellect of the Convivio, the uniquely privileged beneficiary of a divine bounty which, “without any intermediary, descends into him from the Fountainhead of universal authority” [Mon. 3.16.15]. Like the Averroistic reasoning of his earlier claim that only under a world empire can humanity realize its intellectual destiny, this crowning claim shows Dante appropriating Aristotle to the service of a unique and almost desperate vision of empire as a redemptive force. But whether we consider the world view of the Monarchia an aberration [D'Entreves, 51] or take it as Dante's straightforward exposition of his views on the relations of secular and religious authority, its categorical definition of the twofold purpose of human life is impossible to explain away. In the Paradiso [8.115–17] as in the Monarchia, to be a “citizen” is essential to human happiness, and the idea of an imperial authority independent of papal control remained fundamental to his political thought.

6. The Commedia (The Divine Comedy)

The Monarchia's crowning vision is not Dante's last word on the subject of human happiness, nor on the possibility of achieving happiness by natural means. The “earthly paradise” which we attain for ourselves through philosophy is certainly not the paradise Dante the pilgrim will discover at the summit of Purgatory. To the philosopher the Commedia promises only the cold light and enamelled greenery of Limbo, the somber Elysium where Dante encounters Aristotle and the “philosophic family” who look to him as their master, living out an eternity, not of happiness, but of desire without hope [Inf. 4.111–20, 130–44, Iannucci (1997)].

The contrast expresses the difference in orientation between the Commedia on the one hand and the Convivio and Monarchia on the other. The Commedia is concerned always with the ultimate, eternal destiny of human life, with the transcendence, rather than the fulfillment of human understanding. When Beatrice at the summit of Purgatory utters prophetic words which “soar” far beyond Dante's power to envision her meaning, she explains that his limitations are those of “that school which you have followed,” whose teachings are as far from the divine way as the earth from the Primum Mobile [Purg. 33.82–90]. The “school” in question is the study of philosophy as Dante had pursued and celebrated it in earlier writings. It is his training in this school that makes possible the luminous precision of the great doctrinal passages in the Purgatorio and Paradiso [Purg. 17.90–139; 25.37–87; Par. 2.112–48; 7.64–77; 13.52–78; 29.13–45; 30; 97–108], but it is a training that harbors the danger of rationalism and intellectual pride. The Commedia has its moments of significant intellectual independence [e.g. Imbach (2002)]. But as Christian Moevs makes plain, in what is surely the best book ever written on the philosophical aspect of the Commedia [Moevs, 11–12, 82–90], the fact that the celebration of truth in the Convivio is interrupted by the ‘radical revelatory poetics’ of the Commedia expresses Dante's recognition that the experience the Convivio records had finally involved no inner change, no ‘awakening.’ In the Convivio God is the highest good, but remains the distant, unchanging focus of the aspiring mind. In the Commedia God assumes an active, transformative role as the dispenser of that grace without which the intellectual quest is futile:

Io veggio ben che già mai non si sazia
nostro intelletto, se ‘l ver non lo illustra
di fuor dal qual nessun vero si spazia.

[Par. 4.124–26]

I see well that never is our intellect satisfied, unless that truth illumines it beyond which no truth may soar.


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Albert the Great [= Albertus magnus] | Book of Causes [= Liber de causis]