Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to The Problem of Dirty Hands

1. In fact, the supreme emergency may “justify” very little of the terror bombing since the likelihood of a German invasion of Britain ended with the victory of RAF fighter pilots in the Battle of Britain in the summer of 1940.

2. There has been much debate in recent years about the status of morality vis-a-vis other reason-giving aspirations. Key texts in the debate include Wolf (1982) and Louden (1992).

3. A few realist pronouncements make it seem that politics is subject to a quite different form of morality rather than no morality at all. This would make more sense of the common realist insistence on “national interest” as the dominant value in political affairs, and would connect with one interpretation of dirty hands, namely that which invokes role morality. This entry discusses the problems with a role morality move later. Coady (2006; 2008) has made an attempt at unravelling many of the complexities in the realist tradition, and criticised them.

4. See for instance Grayling (2006, 24).

5. For details of the case see Callahan (1988, 209).

6. Ross does indeed recognise that there can be a sort of residue effect of the fact that a prima facie duty has been overruled. Since we still recognise the prima facie duty as such, then we may feel “compunction” at not being able to fulfil it but “not indeed shame or repentance”. And, in some cases, we may have some further duty to make up “somehow” for the right decision not to heed the prima facie duty. See Ross (1930).

7. Thomas Nagel discusses “threshold deontology” and contrasts it both with utilitarianism and absolutism in his paper, “War and Massacre” in Nagel (1979, 62).

8. The idea of a utilitarian version of the threshold story was suggested by Peter Singer. It is a further question whether this would be consistent with more usual accounts of rule utilitarianism that tend to allow exceptions well short of supreme emergency.