# Disjunction

*First published Sat Jan 6, 2001; substantive revision Wed Oct 1, 2008*

*First published Sat Jan 6, 2001*

Disjunction is a binary truth-function, the output of which is a
sentence true if at least one of the input sentences (disjuncts) is
true, and false otherwise. Disjunction, together with negation, provide
sufficient means to define all other truth-functions. Its supposed
connection with the *or* words of natural language has intrigued
and mystified philosophers for many centuries, and the subject has
inspired much creative myth-making, particularly since the advent of
truth-tables early in the twentieth century. In this article some of
those myths are set out and dispelled.

- 1. Introduction
- 2. Syntax
- 3. Proof Theory
- 4. Semantics
- 5. Inclusive and Exclusive disjunctions
- 6. Natural Language
- 7. The Myth of
*Vel*and*Aut* - 8. The
*Or*of Natural Language - Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Introduction

A disjunction is a kind of compound sentence historically associated
by English-speaking logicians and their students with indicative
sentences compounded with *either* … *or*, such
as

Either I am very rich or someone is playing a cruel joke.

But nowadays the term *disjunction* is more often used in
reference to sentences (or well-formed formulae) of associated form
occurring in formal languages. Logicians distinguish between

(a) the abstractedformof such sentences and the roles that sentences of that form play in arguments and proofs,(b) the

meaningsthat must be assigned to such sentences to account for those roles.

The former represents their *syntactic* and
*proof-theoretic* interests, the latter their *semantic*
or *truth-theoretic* interest in disjunction. Introductory logic
texts are sometimes a little unclear as to which should provide the
defining characteristics of disjunction. Nor are they clear as to
whether disjunctions are primarily features of natural or of formal
languages. Here we consider formal languages first.

## 2. Syntax

The definition of a formal system, either axiomatic or natural
deductive, requires the definition of a language, and here the formal
vocabulary of disjunction makes its first appearance. If the
disjunctive constant ∨ (historically suggestive of Latin
*vel* (*or*)) is a primitive constant of the language,
there will be a clause, here labeled [∨] in the inductive definition
of the set of well-formed formulae (wffs). Using α and β as
metalogical variables, ranging over wffs, such a clause would read:

[∨] If α is a wff and β is a wff, then α ∨ β is a wff

perhaps accompanied by an instruction that α ∨ β is to
be referred to as the *disjunction* of the wffs α and
β, and read as "[name of first wff] vel (or ‘vee’, or
‘or’) [name of second wff]". Thus, on this instruction, the
wff *p* ∨ *q* is the *disjunction* of
*p* and *q*, and is pronounced as ‘pea vel
queue’ or ‘pea vee queue’ or ‘pea or
queue’. In this case, *p* and *q* are the disjuncts
of the disjunction.

If ∨ is a non-primitive constant of the language, then typically it will be introduced by an abbreviative definition. In presentations of classical systems in which the conditional constant → or ⊃ and the negational constant ¬ are taken as primitive, the disjunctive constant ∨ might be introduced in the abbreviation of a wff ¬α → β (or ¬α ⊃ β) as α ∨ β. Alternatively, if the conjunctive & has already been introduced either as a primitive or as a defined constant, ∨ might be introduced in the abbreviation of a wff ¬(¬α & ¬β) as α ∨ β.

## 3. Proof Theory

Much as we would understand the conversational significance of vocabulary more generally if we had a complete set of instructions for initiating its use in a conversation, and for suitable responses to its introduction by an interlocutor, we give the proof-theoretic significance of a connective by providing rules for its introduction into a proof and for its elimination. In the case of ∨, these might be the following:

[∨-introduction] For any wffs α and β, a proof having a subproof of α from an ensemble Σ of wffs, can be extended to a proof of α ∨ β from Σ.

[∨-elimination] For any wffs α, β, γ, a proof that includes

- a subproof of α ∨ β from an ensemble of wffs Σ,
- a subproof of γ from an ensemble Δ ∪ {α}, and
- a subproof of γ from an ensemble Θ ∪ {β},
can be extended to a proof of γ from Σ ∪ Δ ∪ Θ.

Intuitively, the former would correspond to a rule of conversation that
permitted us to assert *A* or *B* (for any *B*)
given the assertion that *A*. Thus if we are told that Nicholas
is in Paris, we can infer that Nicholas is either in Paris or in
Toulouse.

Intuitively, the latter rule would correspond to a rule that, given
the assertion that *A* or *B*, would permit the assertion
of anything that is permitted both by the assertion of *A* and
by the assertion of *B*. For example, given the assertion on
certain grounds that Nicholas is in Paris or Toulouse, we are warranted
in asserting on the same grounds plus some geographical information,
that Nicholas is in France, since that assertion is warranted (a) by
the assertion that Nicholas is in Paris together with some of the
geographical information and (b) by the assertion that Nicholas is in
Toulouse together with the rest of the geographical information. More
generally we may sum the matter up by saying that the rule corresponds
to the conversational rule that lets us extract information from an
*or*-sentence without the information of either of its clauses.
In the example, we are given the information that Nicholas is in Paris
or Toulouse, but we are given neither the information that Nicholas is
in Paris nor the information that he is in Toulouse.

## 4. Semantics

In its simplest, classical, semantic analysis, a disjunction is
understood by reference to the conditions under which it is true, and
under which it is false. Central to the definition is a
*valuation*, a function that assigns to every atomic, or
unanalysable sentence of the language a value in the set {1, 0}. In
general the inductive truth-definition for a language corresponds,
clause by clause to the definition of its well-formed formulae. Thus
for a propositional language it will take as its basis, a clause
according to which an atom is true or false accordingly as the
valuation maps it to 1 or to 0. In systems in which ∨ is a primitive
constant, the clause corresponding to disjunction takes α ∨
β to be true if at least one of α, β is true, and takes
it to be false otherwise. Where ∨ is introduced by either of the
definitions earlier mentioned, that truth-condition can be computed for
α ∨ β from those of the conditional (→ or ⊃) or
conjunction (&) and negation (¬).

Now the truth-definition can be regarded as an extension of the valuation from the atoms of the language to the entire set of wffs with 1 understood as the truth-value, true, and 0 understood as the truth-value, false. Thus, classically, disjunction is semantically interpreted as a binary truth-function from the set of pairs of truth-values to the set {0, 1}. The tabulated graph of this function, as dictated by the truth-definition, is called the truth-table for disjunction. That table is the following:

α β α ∨ β 1 1

1 0

0 1

0 01

1

1

0

## 5. Inclusive and Exclusive disjunctions

Authors of introductory logic texts generally take this opportunity to distinguish the disjunction we have been discussing from another binary truth-function ∨ whose graph is tabulated by the table:

α β α ∨ β 1 1

1 0

0 1

0 00

1

1

0

where α ∨
β is read α *xor* β. This truth-function is
referred to variously as exclusive disjunction, as 0110 disjunction
(after the succession of values in its main column), and as logical
difference. The wff α ∨ β is true when
exactly one of α, β is true; false otherwise. To make
matters explicit, the earlier discussed truth-function ∨ is called
inclusive, or non-exclusive or 1110 disjunction.

## 6. Natural Language

It is an assumption, at any rate a claim, of many textbook authors
that there are both uses of *or* in English that correspond to
1110 disjunction and uses that correspond to 0110 disjunction, and
this supposition generally motivates the introduction and discussion
of the xor connective. Since we are following the usual order of
textbook exposition, this is perhaps the moment to make a few
observations on this score. The first are purely
syntactic. The *or* of English that such authors cite is a
coordinator (or coordinating conjunction). It can coordinate
syntactic elements of virtually any grammatical type, not merely whole
sentences. Moreover, if we consider only its uses joining whole
sentences, we must notice that it can join sentences of virtually any
mood: interrogative sentences and imperatives as well as indicative
sentences can be joined by *or* in English. And again, if we
restrict our attention to its uses joining indicative sentences, we
must note that *or* is by no means restricted to the binary
cases in this role. Indeed, there is no theoretical finite limit to
the number of clauses that it can join. This is perhaps the most
fundamental relevant syntactic difference between *or* on the
one hand and ∨ and
∨ on the other. The
sentence

Nathalie has been and gone or Nathalie will arrive today or Nathalie will not arrive at all

is a perfectly correct sentence and not ambiguous as between

(Nathalie has been and gone or Nathalie will arrive today) or Nathalie will not arrive at all

and

Nathalie has been and gone or (Nathalie will arrive today or Nathalie will not arrive at all).

By contrast, the wff *p* ∨ *q* ∨ *r*, far
from being ambiguous as between (*p* ∨ *q*) ∨
*r* and *p* ∨ (*q* ∨ *r*), is, on the
inductive definition of well-formedness, not a wff. If the
parenthesis-free notation is tolerated in general logical exposition,
this is because ∨ is *associative*, that is, the wffs
(*p* ∨ *q*) ∨ *r* and *p* ∨
(*q* ∨ *r*) are syntactically interderivable, and
semantically have identical truth-conditions. The formal account of
disjunction could readily be liberalized to accommodate that fact, and
even conveniently in languages in which ∨ was primitive. In that
case our inductive definition of the language could permit any such
string as ∨(α_{1}, … ,
α_{i}, … , α_{n})
to be well-formed if α_{1}, … ,
α_{i}, … and α_{n}
are. The relevant clause of the truth-definition would accordingly be
modified in such a way as to give ∨(α_{1}, … ,
α_{i}, … , α_{n})
the maximum of the truth-values of α_{1}, … ,
α_{i}, … and
α_{n}. Moreover, this accords well with such
cases as the one cited in which *or* joins more than two simple
clauses: such a sentence is true if at least one of its clauses is
true; false otherwise.

The fact that English *or* is not binary does not accord so
well with the claim made by many textbook authors that there are uses
of *or* that require representation by 0110 disjunction. To be
sure, ∨ is
associative, so that a notational liberalization would be possible,
parallel to the one described for ∨. But, as Hans Reichenbach seems
first to have pointed out (in
Reichenbach [1947]),
the truth-definition for ∨ (α_{1},
… , α_{i}, … ,
α_{n}) would have to be such as to give it the
value 1 if any odd number of α_{1}, … ,
α_{i}, … , α_{n}
have the value 1; the value 0 otherwise. The result is evident from the
truth-table where *n* > 2. For *n* = 3, suppose that
α ∨ β
∨ γ has the
value 1. The truth-definition as given by the table requires that
exactly one of α ∨ β, γ has the
value 1. Let γ have the value 1; then α ∨ β has the value 0.
Then α and β have the same value. That is, either both
α and β have the value 0, or both α and β have
the value 1. In the former case exactly one of α, β, γ
has the value 1; in the latter, all three have the value 1. That is,
the disjunction will take the value 1 if and only if an odd number of
disjuncts have the value 1. A simple induction will prove that this
result holds for an exclusive disjunction of any finite length. It is
sufficient for present purposes to note that, in the case where
*n* = 3, ∨
(α_{1}, α_{2}, α_{3}) will be
true if all of its disjuncts are true. Now there is no naturally
occurring coordinator in any natural language matching the
truth-conditional profile of such a connective. There is certainly no
use of *or* in English in accordance with which five sentences
*A*, *B*, *C*, *D*, and *E* can be
joined to form a sentence *A* or *B* or *C* or
*D* or *E*, which is true if and only if either exactly
one of the component sentences is true, or exactly three of them are
true or exactly five of them are true.

Most of the texts make no claims about exclusive disjunctive uses of
either English or Latin *or*-words beyond the two-disjunct case.
But it is a fair presumption that the belief in exclusive disjunctive
uses of *or* in English includes just such three-disjunct uses
of *or*. Such a use of *or*, would be one in accordance
with which three sentences *A*, *B*, and *C* can
be joined to form a sentence *A* or *B* or *C*,
which is true if and only if exactly one of the component sentences is
true. Though not a 0110-disjunctive use of *or*, this would be a
general use representable as 0110 disjunction in the two-disjunct
case.^{[1]}

The question as to whether there is such a use of *or* in
English, or any other natural language goes to the very heart of the
conception of truth conditional semantics. For it seems certain that
there are conversational uses of *or* that invite the inference
of exclusivity, but which do not seem to require exclusivity for their
truth. Thus, for example, if one says (as in
Tarski [1941],
21) ‘We are going on a hike or we are going to a
theater’, even with charged emphasis upon the *or*, one
will have spoken falsely if in the event we do both, unless, as in
Tarski's example, one has also denied the conjunction.

Some authors have sought examples of 0110 disjunction in
*or*-sentences whose clauses are mutually exclusive. For
example, Kegley and Kegley discuss the case
(Kegley and Kegley [1978],
232):

John is at the play, or he is studying in the library

of which the authors remark, "There is no mistaking the sense of
*or* here: John cannot be in both places at once". If their
example were an example of exclusive disjunction, we could safely infer
from it that the play is not being performed in the library, that the
theatre is not in the library, that John is not swotting in the stalls
between acts while his companion fights her way to the bar to fetch the
drinks. In fact, even, perhaps particularly, when the disjuncts are
genuinely mutually exclusive, there are no grounds for the supposition
that the *or* represents 0110 disjunction. Were there such
grounds the ∨ of formal logic would require distinct semantic
accounts for the wffs *p* ∨ *q* and *p* ∨
¬*p*. As Barrett and Stenner point out
(Barrett and Stenner [1971]),
the case requires quite
the reverse. Since the truth-tables of ∨ and
∨ differ exactly in the
output value of the first row, what alone would clinch the case for the
existence of an exclusive *or* would be a sentence in which both
disjuncts were true, and the disjunction therefore false. No author has
yet produced such an example.

## 7. The Myth of *Vel* and *Aut*

If the logic texts dictate the structure and content of our discussion,
it is perhaps as well to dispel another current myth — namely that the
notational choice of ∨, (read as *vel*) as the connective of
inclusive disjunction, and the claim that the English *or* has
0110-disjunctive uses are supported by the facts of the Latin language.
I. Copi is as explicit as any
(Copi [1971],
241):

The Latin word "vel" expresses weak or inclusive disjunction, and the Latin word "aut" corresponds to the word "or" in its strong or exclusive sense.

The idea is, first, that whereas English has only one
*or*-word, Latin has two: *vel* and *aut*, and
secondly, that the uses of *vel* in Latin would be representable
as 1110 disjunction and the uses of *aut* as 0110 disjunction.
As to the first, the very shape of the claim is likely to mislead. The
case is not that Latin had two words for *or*, but rather that
Latin had more than one word that gets translated into English as
*or*. In fact, Latin had *many* words that are translated
into English as *or*, including, besides the two listed, at
least *seu, sive* and the enclitic *ve*. So does English
have many words that can be translated into English as *or*,
including *unless, if … not, but* (It does not rain but
it pours) and so on. All vocabulary has a history, and languages
accumulate vocabulary that becomes adapted to nuanced uses.

Now the supposition that Latin had a 0110 coordinator must suffer
from the same implausibilities as the corresponding supposition about
English. What of the two-disjunct case? If any general tendency can be
detected in actual Latin usage, say in the classical period, that would
distinguish the uses of *vel* from those of *aut*, it is
that *aut* tended to be brought into use in the formation of
lists of disjoint or contrasted or opposed items, categories or classes
or states, as for example

Omne enuntiatum aut verum aut falsum est[Every statement is either true or false] (Cicero,De Fato, 222).

The difficulty with these examples is that the exclusiveness of the
states independendently of the choice of connective must mask any
disjointness that the connective could itself impose. That it does not
impose *any* disjointness itself is best seen in its
list-forming uses. Consider the list (Cicero,
*De Officiis*):

tribunos aut plebes[the magistrates or the mob, (accusative plural)]

to be sure the categories are disjoint, and this fact might be supposed
to contribute to the selection of *aut*. But the mutual
exclusion in such cases need not survive the addition of a verb.

Timebat tribunos aut plebes[one feared the magistrates or the mob]

does not exclude the case in which one feared both. However, what clinches the refutation of this mythical supposition is that if that whole clause is brought within the scope of a negator, the resulting sentence will expect a reading along the lines of 1110 disjunction.

Nemo timebat tribunos aut plebes[No one feared the magistrates or the mob]

just means no one feared either. It does not mean everyone either
feared neither or feared both. Since the negation of a 0110
disjunction is a 1110 disjunction (either both disjuncts are true or
both disjuncts are false), this use of *aut* cannot be a 0110
disjunctive use.

In fact, in classical Latin, *aut* was favoured over
*vel* in constructions involving negations, and in that use,
*aut* behaves analogously to ∨. But pretty well anywhere an
*aut* could be used, a *vel* could be substituted, and
vice versa. The resulting sentence would have a different flavour, and
in some instances would be mildly eccentric, but would not have a
different truth condition. The uses of *vel* reflected its
origins as an imperative form of *volo*. The flavour of

Nemo timebat vel tribunos vel plebes

would be closer to that of

Name which group (of the two) you will: no one feared them.

*Aut*was adversative: no one feared either social extremity. (For more examples and a more detailed discussion, see Jennings [1994], 239–251.)

## 8. The *Or* of Natural Language

There are undoubtedly disjunctive uses of *or* in English, and
of corresponding vocabulary in other natural languages. But the uses of
*or* after the pattern of the logic texts:

Either Argentina will boycott the conference or the value of lead will diminish

and so on constitute only a very small proportion, certainly fewer than
5% of the occurrences of *or* in English, and, it can be
supposed, of corresponding words in all other natural languages as
well. It is therefore not surprising that it should be some of these
non-disjunctive uses that have been misidentified as instances of
exclusive disjunction. The example cited (in
Richards [1978],
84) is a good representative example of one such common
misidentification:

So how can we find a clear-cut case of the exclusive ‘or’? Imagine a boy who asks for ice creamandstrawberries for tea. He is told as a sort of refusal:‘You can have ice creamorstrawberries for tea’.Here there is no doubt: not both may be had.

Once again there is a difficulty in trying to account for the
exclusivity by reference to truth-conditions, though, if we are
permitted to consult the intentions of the speaker (as Richards himself
does) we may be in no doubt as to the prohibition of strawberries and
icecream, however curious such a prohibition might seem. But this
example, in company with the many others like it (which this author has
sometimes referred to collectively as *the argument from
confection*) suffers from the even more serious flaw that it is not
a disjunction at all. The problem is not that the *or* does not
join whole clauses. Even if we expand the example to

’You can have ice cream for teaoryou can have strawberries for tea’,

the sentence cannot be construed as a disjunction. The reason is that the child would be correct in inferring that he can have ice cream for tea, and would be correct in inferring that he can have strawberries for tea. Such sentences are elliptical for conjunctions, not for disjunctions, even on a truth-conditional construal. It just happens that for such conjunctions, questions of exclusivity, or rather non-combinativity also arise.

Not every *or* of English (nor every counterpart of
*or* in other languages) is disjunctive, even among those that
join pairs of indicative sentences.

## Bibliography

- Barrett, Robert B.,
and Stenner,
Alfred J., 1971, "The Myth of the Exclusive ‘Or’",
*Mind*, 80(317): 116–121. - Cicero, Marcus Tullius,
*De Fato*, Translated by H. Rackham. Cambridge, Mass 1942. - Cicero, Marcus Tullius,
*De Officiis*, Translated by Walter Miller. Cambridge, Mass 1975. - Copi, I.M.,
1971,
*Introduction to Logic*, New York: Macmillan. - Jennings, R.E.,
1994,
*The Genealogy of Disjunction*, New York: Oxford University Press. - Kegley, Charles W.,
1978, and
Kegley, Jacquelyn Ann,
*Introduction to Logic*, Lanham, MD: University Press. - McCawley, J.,
1993,
*Everything that Linguists Have Always Wanted to Know About Logic*, 2nd edition, Chicago: University of Chicago Press. - Pelletier, F.J. and Hartline, A.J.,
2008, "Ternary exclusive
*or*",*Logic Journal of the IGPL*, 16(1): 75–83. - Pelletier, F.J. and Martin, N.,
1990, "Proving Post's functional completeness theorem",
*Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic*, 31: 462–475. - Post, E.,
1941,
*The Two-Valued Iterative Systems of Mathematical Logic*, Princeton: Princeton University Press. - Reichenbach, Hans,
1947,
*Elements of Symbolic Logic*, New York: MacMillan. - Richards, T.A.,
1978,
*The Language of Reason*, Rushcutters Bay, NSW. - Alfred Tarski,
1941,
*Introduction to Logic and to the Methodology of the Deductive Sciences*, New York: Oxford University Press, second edition, revised, translated by Olaf Helmer, 1963.

## Other Internet Resources

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## Related Entries

connectives: sentence connectives in formal logic