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Doing vs. Allowing Harm

First published Tue May 14, 2002; substantive revision Fri Sep 21, 2007

Is doing harm worse than allowing harm? If not, there should be no moral objection to active euthanasia in circumstances where passive euthanasia is permissible; and there should be no objection to bombing innocent civilians where doing so will minimize the overall number of deaths in war. There should, however, be an objection—indeed, an outcry—at our failure to prevent the deaths of millions of children in the third world from malnutrition, dehydration, and measles.[1] Moreover, it seems that the question is pertinent to the question of whether consequentialism is true, as consequentialists believe that doing harm is no worse than allowing harm while anti-consequentialists, almost universally, disagree. But is doing harm worse than allowing harm? We might divide approaches to this question into two broad kinds: those that attempt to answer it using examples without saying anything about the nature of the distinction. (Following Shelly Kagan, I'll call this approach ‘the contrast strategy.’) And those that analyze the distinction in depth and try to show that its underlying nature dictates an answer to the moral question.

1. The Contrast Strategy

James Rachels provides a classic example of the first approach.[2] He offers us a pair of cases—in one, Smith drowns his young cousin in the bathtub; in the other, Jones plans to drown his young cousin, but finds the boy already unconscious under water and refrains from saving him. The two cases are exactly alike except that the first is a killing and the second a letting die. Rachels invites us to agree that Smith's behavior is no worse than Jones's. He then concludes that killing per se is no worse than letting die per se, and that if typical killings are worse than typical lettings die that must be because of other factors.

Although Rachels seems correct about Smith and Jones, the inference from these cases to the moral equivalence of killing and letting die in general (where other things are equal) has been challenged. Shelly Kagan argues that it assumes that “if a factor has genuine moral relevance, then for any pair of cases, where the given factor varies while others are held constant, the cases in that pair will differ in moral status.”[3] He claims, moreover, that this assumes the Additive Assumption, the view that “the status of the act is the net balance or sum which is the result of adding up the separate positive and negative effects of the individual factors.”[4] He raises several objections to the Additive Assumption. Firstly, one might describe a pair of cases that are exactly alike except that one is a killing and the other a letting die, where the first intuitively seems far worse than the second. If this pair of cases is as good as Rachels' pair, then either the inference is valid in both cases—to prove the contradiction that killing is both worse and not worse than letting die—or it is invalid in both cases. Secondly, one might raise the rhetorical question: why addition—rather than, say, multiplication or some other function?

Instead of using the contrast strategy, let's try to figure out the nature of the distinction between killing and letting die and, more generally, between doing and allowing harm. In both doing and allowing, an agent is responsible for or relevant to a bad upshot—such as a death or injury—in the sense that she could have prevented it. The contrast is most naturally picked out by the terms ‘doing’ and ‘allowing’, or ‘making’ and ‘allowing’, but since these have vagaries and awkwardnesses in practice, I shall use the terms “positively relevant to an upshot” and “negatively relevant to an upshot” for cases of “doing” and “allowing”, respectively.[5]

2. Distinguishing Distinctions

Suppose some upshot occurs and would not have occurred if the agent had behaved in some different way. The question of whether the agent is positively or negatively relevant to the upshot is often conflated with or distorted by questions that should be kept distinct from it, like the questions of (i) whether the agent intended the upshot, (ii) whether she could easily have prevented the upshot, (iii) whether she guaranteed the upshot or merely made it probable, and even (iv) whether the agent's behavior was morally objectionable. It can easily be seen that these do not coincide with the distinction between doing and allowing.

(i) Consider the distinction between cases where an agent intends the upshot and cases where she does not. If you drive your car into someone's body and she dies as a result, you undoubtedly killed her, even if you did not intend her death. Conversely, someone may intentionally allow a child to drown in order to inherit his fortune.

(ii) It tends to be easier to avoid killing than to avoid letting die, but this is only a tendency. Sometimes saving is easier than not killing. It is easy to throw a life preserver, and it may be difficult to refrain from killing someone who is threatening one or who has treated one appallingly. There are even cases where it is physically difficult to avoid killing; as for example, where one has to hold tight to a tree to prevent one's (light) vehicle whose brakes have failed from running into a pedestrian.

(iii) Sometimes the terms ‘making’ and ‘allowing’ are used to suggest the difference between making certain and making possible or probable. For example, in discussions of the problem of evil, people sometimes say, “Well, God didn't actually make the murder occur. He just allowed it to occur.” This is best understood, I believe, as a distinction between raising the probability of murder to 1 from something less than 1, on the one hand, and raising the probability of murder from 0 to something higher but still less than 1. This is a morally significant distinction but it is not the distinction between doing and allowing. An agent can kill without guaranteeing death. For example, by adding small quantities of poison to her victim's meals she may bring about the death, even though there was a 20% chance that the poison would not kill her. On the other hand, an agent might guarantee the demise of a plant by failing to water it in a situation where she is the only one who can do so.

(iv) Finally, the distinction between doing and allowing harm is sometimes thought to have, as part of its conceptual content, a moral element. This thought is rarely made explicit, but the way people are inclined to classify cases suggests that they are guided by it. There are two main difficulties with this way of drawing the line. Firstly, if it is true by definition that killing is worse than letting die, then the question of whether killing is worse than letting die is settled in a trivial, circular, uninteresting way. Secondly, there are obvious counterexamples to this crude account—morally appalling cases of letting die—failing to feed one's children—and morally acceptable cases of killing. We have no hesitation talking of killing in self-defense. Let's turn to some more plausible candidates. In what follows I discuss a series of accounts of the distinction, and where appropriate, the moral significance or insignificance of each account.

3. Causing and Not Causing Not to Occur

One natural suggestion is that the agent who is positively relevant to the upshot causes it to occur; whereas the agent who is negatively relevant to the upshot doesn't cause it, but simply fails to prevent it where she could have done so.[6] This suggestion has immediate moral implications. It seems true by definition (almost) that you can be causally responsible only for upshots that you cause. And it is arguably true that you can be morally responsible only for what you are causally responsible for. So, if you cause a bad state of affairs, you've probably done wrong; whereas if you don't cause a bad state of affairs, you haven't. In choosing between killing and letting die, you are choosing between doing wrong and not doing wrong. (Of course, this doesn't apply to non-harmful cases of killing, such as, arguably, some cases of active euthanasia.) The question of what you ought to do is then tautologously easy.

This argument begins to get into trouble when we reflect on the fact that we are often responsible for upshots we allow: the death of the houseplants or the child's illiteracy. When we notice that, in these cases, the plants die or the child remains uneducated because of some failure on the agent's part, it becomes clear that the agent does, in some sense, cause the upshots. Moreover, most widely accepted contemporary accounts of causation imply that some event or fact involving these agents causes the deaths or illiteracy. For example, the counterfactual account of causation—according to which (very roughly) event E causes F if and only if had E not occurred F would not have occurred either—implies that it was the agent's failure to water the plants that caused the deaths.[7] John Mackie's INUS condition—according to which E causes F if and only if E is a(n insufficient but) necessary part of a(n unnecessary but)sufficient condition for F—implies that the fact that the agent failed to water the plants causes the plants to die.[8]

4. Counterfactual Accounts

We are concerned then with a contrast between two ways the behavior of agents causes upshots. One suggestion is to say that when the agent is positively relevant to the upshot, the upshot would not have occurred if she had been absent from the scene.[9] Suppose, for example, the victim dies because I push his head under water. He wouldn't have died if I had been absent. On the other hand, suppose he is in deep water and cannot swim and I don't save him. He would have drowned anyway if I had been absent. In these two cases, the counterfactual account draws the line in the intuitively correct way.

This account is sometimes used to support the claim that doing harm is worse than allowing harm, on the grounds that, on this account, allowing harm is simply a matter of letting nature take its course, which, other things being equal, is good, or at least permissible. There are two or three quick objections to this argument. Firstly, it assumes that acting (such as killing or saving lives) is a matter of interfering with the course of nature—in other words, that human action is somehow outside of the course of nature. This is extremely controversial. Secondly, even if human action is outside the course of nature, if the agent is faced with a choice between killing one and allowing two to die at the hand of some other agent, this argument would favor neither option since neither involves letting nature take its course. But, as traditionally understood and used, the Doctrine of Doing and Allowing is supposed to favor letting die in this case just as much as in others. Thirdly, interfering in the course of nature is sometimes obviously the better course of action—to stop the bleeding, restart the heart, and so on.

A different way the counterfactual account can be used to support the claim that doing harm is worse than allowing harm is this: if something bad happens when you are not present (or, especially, if you had never existed) then you aren't responsible for it. If we turn our attention to another world where you are present, but which is otherwise exactly like the first, it seems that your presence makes no difference empirically and, hence, should make no difference morally. This superficially compelling argument seems to prove too much—politicians' careers have hung on the question of whether they were in the room at the time the conspiracy was being hatched. Moreover, suppose an SS officer, Franz, tortures someone to death. But this is standard practice in the Gestapo. If Franz had stayed home with a sore throat, or if Franz had never existed, his pal Hans would have done the torturing, in the same way, at the same time Franz did. If the counterfactual account is correct, then Franz is negatively relevant to the victim's death by torture. That is, Franz merely allowed the death to occur. This case also creates problems for the idea that killing is worse than letting die, since the fact that Hans was waiting in the wings in no way diminishes Franz's wrongdoing in this case.[10] So, this way of drawing the distinction is problematic, and this argument for the moral significance of the distinction is flawed.

Alan Donagan suggests a similar account of the distinction.[11] To determine whether the agent is positively or negatively relevant to an upshot, we should consider what would have happened if the agent had not acted at the relevant moment, or what would have happened if the agent had ‘abstained from intervening in the course of nature’. It isn't entirely clear what we are supposed to imagine when we imagine this but perhaps it's that the agent is asleep or in a trance or in some other way not exercising her agency. Now—with respect to some behavior that led to some upshot, we might ask: would that upshot have occurred if the agent had abstained from intervening in the course of nature? If it would have, the agent allowed the upshot. If it would not have, then she did it (her relevance to the upshot is positive).

The Hans/Franz example can be revised to work against Donagan's version, but here's an additional counterexample. Suppose a man is lying asleep on the ground. He is awoken by a crash and notices a large rock rolling down the hill towards him. He can easily move out of its way, but realizes that if he does so the rock will gain momentum and kill a group of small deaf children further down the hill. He tenses his muscles, fights his desire to run away and stands his ground. The rock hits and seriously injures him. But he stops it. And he saves the children. Donagan's account, however, seems to imply that he merely allows the rock to stop, since, had he remained asleep, the rock would have struck and been stopped by his body.[12]

5. Action, Inaction and Positive and Negative Rights

Warren Quinn offers an account of the distinction—guided he admits by the conviction that doing harm is worse than allowing harm[13] —according to which an agent is positively relevant to a harmful upshot when his most direct contribution to the harm is an action, whether his own or that of some object.[14] His relevance is negative when his most direct contribution is an inaction, a failure to prevent the harm. An agent's most direct contribution to a harmful upshot of his agency is the contribution that most directly explains the harm. And one contribution explains harm more directly than another if the explanatory value of the second is exhausted in the way it explains the first.

The key difference here is between cases where the agent produces the result by an action and cases where she produces it by an inaction—pushing the head under water or refraining from throwing a life preserver. There's an extra complication here, however. Sometimes, Quinn says, your relevance to a death can be positive, you can kill, in other words, even though you don't act. This happens, for example, when you are on a train headed towards some drowning victims you wish to save when you notice someone tied to the tracks ahead of you. You can stop the train but you choose not to in order to reach your destination. Quinn believes that you kill in this case, because the train acts as your agent, taking you where you want to go, and crushing the person tied to the tracks in the process. On the other hand, if you had chosen not to stop the train for some other reason but you would have not minded had someone else stopped the train, then your failure to stop the train would not have constituted a killing.

What are the moral implications of this way of drawing the line? Following Philippa Foot, Quinn believes that the key here is the distinction between negative and positive rights.[15] Positive relevance to harm involves the violation of negative rights; negative relevance to harm involves the violation of positive rights. Since negative rights are more stringent than positive rights, it is worse to be positively relevant to harm than to be negatively relevant to harm (ceteris paribus). But why should we think negative rights more stringent. Here's Quinn:

[i]n such a morality [neutral vis á vis killing and letting die] the person trapped on the road has a moral say about whether his body may be destroyed only if what he stands to lose is greater than what others stand to gain. But then surely he has no real say at all. For, in cases where his loss would be greater than the gain to others, the fact that he could not be killed would be sufficiently explained not by his authority in the matter but simply by the balance of overall costs. And if this is how it is in general—if we may rightly injure or kill him whenever others stand to gain more than he stands to lose—then surely his body (one might say his person) is not in any interesting moral sense his. It seems rather to belong to the human community, to be dealt with according to its best overall interest…. Whether we are speaking of ownership or more fundamental forms of possession, something is, morally speaking, his only if his say over what may be done to it (and thereby to him) can override the greater needs of others.[16]

To say that one has a negative right against being harmed is to say that it is (at least, prima facie) wrong to harm one unless one wishes to be harmed. It is crucial that we add the phrase “unless one wishes to be harmed”, since without it, the precedence of negative rights wouldn't give the victim any special say about his own body, because it would be just as wrong to harm him even if he asked to be harmed, and it would be wrong for him to harm himself. So, the crucial thing is that the victim has some sort of a say about what happens to himself(i.e., others are morally bound to respect his wishes with respect to his body to a certain extent). Quinn's claim is that if there is no extent to which someone's wishes with respect to his body, etc. are to be respected, then we've completely done away with the idea of ownership of one's body, etc.

One person's wishes about what happens to her body do often clash with someone else's wishes about what happen to his. For example, Susan wishes to marry Paul, but Paul doesn't wish to marry Susan. Morality obviously cannot give all such wishes precedence. So, the suggestion goes, let's give some subset of them precedence. For example, let's give negative wishes precedence. Why, what's so special about negative wishes? “Well, nothing,” the answer seems to go. “But unless we give some wishes precedence, there will be no domain in which the victim's personal preference takes precedence; and in that case, there will be no sense in which the agent is lord in that domain. In other words, without some such precedence there will be no ownership of one's body or mind, etc.” Quinn argues that we cannot give positive rights precedence over negative rights without incoherence.[17] And, hence, he concludes that we must give negative rights precedence over positive rights.

But there are other ways to divide up rights than the division into positive and negative rights. We might divide them into the rights of children and the rights of adults, rights concerning the upper half of the body and rights concerning the lower half, etc. and then give precedence to one set over the other whenever they come into conflict. These seem arbitrary and wasteful, but their rationale seems no worse than Quinn's.

Quinn's is a funny sort of defense of negative rights. Unless I'm missing something, it doesn't pick out any special feature of negative rights that makes them specially worth respecting.

6. The ‘Most of the Things He Could have Done’ Account

Like Quinn, Jonathan Bennett thinks that the fundamental distinction between doing and allowing is between cases where the upshot occurs because of one's action and cases where the upshot occurs because of one's inaction—although he prefers to replace “action/inaction” talk with “positive/negative fact” talk.[18] When Bennett discusses the contrast between positive and negative relevance to harm, he is attempting to capture a deep, philosophically interesting distinction that underlies our talk of ‘doing and allowing’ ‘making and letting’,‘killing and letting die’. He acknowledges that the correspondence between his distinction and the distinctions we make in everyday life and language may be inexact. He says that my behavior is negatively relevant to an upshot if a negative fact about my behavior is the least informative fact that suffices to complete a causal explanation of it; whereas my behavior is positively relevant to that upshot if a positive fact about my behavior is the least informative fact about my conduct that suffices to complete a causal explanation of it. For example, if I jog while you drown, your drowning could be explained by the fact that I jogged, but it could also be explained by the less informative fact that I did not pull you out of the water.

In a nutshell, on Bennett's view, an agent's relevance to an upshot is positive if most of the ways she could have behaved at the time would not have led to the upshot; otherwise, it is negative.[19] For example, suppose I douse a slug with salt and it dies as a result. My relevance to its demise is positive, since most of the ways I could have behaved would not have led to the death. On the other hand, if it dies because I fail to move it from the path of a car, then most of the ways I could have behaved at the time would have led to its death, so my relevance to the death is negative.

On this account, doing harm is no worse than allowing harm. If some upshot obtains because of the way you behaved, then the fact that there were many ways (rather than only a few) you could have behaved which would also have had that result is morally insignificant. This conclusion is surprising, even shocking. Bennett's account, however, can explain why we tend to think of killing as worse than letting die. He claims, quite plausibly, that it is morally worse to be causally relevant to a bad upshot one could easily have avoided than a similarly bad upshot one could have avoided only with great difficulty. If most of the ways one could have behaved would have led to an upshot, then it was probably somewhat difficult or onerous to avoid the upshot; whereas if most of the ways one could have behaved would not have led to an upshot, then it was probably fairly easy to avoid the upshot. This correlation is not inevitable, however. It is easy to call 911, and can be difficult to refrain from killing a child at the bottom of a well if your only alternative is to continue hanging from a rope above her.

In spite of its virtues, Bennett's account faces some formidable difficulties. It has often been attacked with counterexamples like the following:

Raccoon: Returning to the campsite after fetching water, I notice a raccoon eating my food. Hiding behind some trees downwind of him, I know that if I make a noise he will run away. I notice a large bell near me, but decide against using it, allowing the raccoon to eat my food.

Bennett's account, of course, says just that. But let's change the story slightly. Suppose now that I am closely surrounded by bells. If I move at all, I will make a sound loud enough to scare off the raccoon. Again, I don't move and he eats on undisturbed. It seems that I still allow the food to be eaten. The addition of more bells doesn't change this.

Some philosophers argue that such examples refute Bennett's account.[20] Their diagnosis of the difficulty goes like this: “What's important here is that the agent is immobile throughout. Immobility is incompatible with positive relevance to an upshot. Nifty slogan: ‘You cannot do anything by doing nothing.’ Bennett's account wrongly implies that immobility is compatible with positive relevance to an upshot.”

But immobility is not necessarily incompatible with positive relevance to an upshot. Consider the case I described earlier of the agent who was positively relevant to the rock's stopping and the children's being unscathed by standing his ground, precisely by not moving. Here's another case. After a mild earthquake the agent finds herself lying on and crushing a tube connected to a life support machine that is keeping someone alive. Unless the agent moves soon, the victim will die from lack of oxygen. She stays put. The victim dies. It is not implausible to say that the agent killed the victim, although she was completely immobile throughout the relevant time period.[21] These cases make it clear that immobility doesn't rule out positive relevance. But if it is not my immobility that explains the fact that I am negatively relevant to the raccoon's consuming my food, what is it?

Before answering this question, let's consider another difficult case for Bennett's account, Sassan: An assassin, A. Sassan, is preparing to assassinate Victor by shooting him. A second assassin, Baxter, is waiting across the street watching Sassan to ensure his success. If Sassan shows any signs of hesitation, Baxter will shoot Victor himself. Suppose Sassan knows about Baxter and his intentions and also knows that he can turn his gun on Baxter instead of on Victor if he so chooses. Although this thought crosses his mind, he quickly suppresses it, since he is committed to Victor's annihilation. He shoots Victor and Victor dies instantly. Most of the ways he could have behaved would have led to the shooting and death of Victor (either by himself or by Baxter). By Bennett's account, Sassan's relevance to the fact that Victor is shot and killed is negative. This means that Sassan doesn't kill Victor, but merely lets him die. Hold on! I just said that Sassan shot Victor. He pulled the trigger. The gun fired. A bullet flew out of the barrel and entered Victor's body. Victor died from the bullet wound. A clearer case of killing is impossible to find. Bennett might repeat the point that positive relevance to a death is not exactly the same as killing. Nevertheless, insofar as we have any pre-theoretical grip on (and interest in) the concept of positive relevance to a death, Sassan's relevance to Victor's death must strike us as positive rather than negative.[22] And yet Bennett's account implies that it is negative.

Someone sympathetic with Bennett's account may attempt to demonstrate that that account does accommodate our intuitions on this score by claiming that it implies that Sassan's behavior is positively relevant to the actual death that Victor died, since if Baxter had killed him, he would have died a different death. This response is not consistent with Bennett's approach, however, since it the phrases ‘the actual death’ and ‘a different death’ seem to be referring to events rather than facts. And Bennett is clearly concerned with relevance to facts not events.

Bennett himself has pointed out that the upshot that concerns us is not the fact that Victor died (no-one could prevent that) but the fact that Victor died at T (or perhaps, the fact that Victor died no later than T).[23] He suggested that perhaps Sassan is positively relevant to that, since most of the ways he could have behaved would have resulted in Victor's dying later than T. But we could, with minimal artifice, ensure that Baxter is disposed to kill Victor at exactly T if Sassan does not. For example, we could imagine that there is only a fraction of a second when Victor is vulnerable to a bullet and that Baxter is located closer to him (or has a faster acting gun) so that there is a moment T2 such that if Sassan does not shoot at T2, he will not succeed in killing Victor, but such that Baxter still has a chance to get a shot off at T1 with the result that Victor will die at T.

Perhaps someone may try to argue that Sassan is positively relevant to something—the fact that Victor is killed with this bullet rather than that, or more simply the fact that Victor is killed by him rather than by Baxter. The latter suggestion will not do, since it begs the question. Bennett cannot assume that his account implies that Sassan kills Victor, since that is the very claim at issue. As to the suggestion that Sassan is positively relevant to Victor's being killed with this bullet rather than that, surely we could modify the story in such a way that if Sassan does not pull the trigger, Baxter can push a switch that will guarantee that the gun fires.

So it seems that Bennett is committed to the claim that Sassan is negatively relevant to (the various salient facts concerning) Victor's death, and hence, that Sassan let Victor die. This seems wrong.

7. The Transfer of Energy Account

Why do we think of Sassan's relevance to Victor's death as positive? Surely because Sassan ‘acts on’ him in a way that one does not ‘act on’ a drowning victim if one simply stands by and watches him drown. Similarly, the woman who deprived the victim of oxygen by lying on the oxygen tube (while remaining immobile) acted on the victim to cause his death. By contrast, in Raccoon, my role in the event of the raccoon's consuming my food was precisely not to act on the raccoon. In cases of ‘acting on’, it seems, physical forces run from the agent to the affected object or patient. This seems to distinguish typical cases of doing from typical cases of allowing harm.

Let's clarify the account. Obviously the agent need not act on the patient directly—it is enough that physical forces run from one to the other, however indirectly. Moreover, it cannot be sufficient for positive relevance to an upshot that physical forces run from the agent to the victim or patient at the appropriate time. The agent may have acted on the patient but done so to produce some other effect. For example, instead of drowning him or pulling him out, she throws him a rose. A passenger on a runaway trolley doesn't seem to kill the victim of that trolley in spite of the fact that his weight adds to the momentum of the trolley and, hence, there is a transfer of energy between the two. We should add that the way in which she acts on him must explain the upshot. In the case just described, because her throwing him a rose doesn't explain his death by drowning, she doesn't count as positively relevant to his death.[24]

A puzzle remains. What about cases where the agent removes a safety net from beneath a falling victim, unplugs a respirator, kicks a rock out of the path of the runaway vehicle, and other similar cases? No physical forces run from the agent to the victim. So, by the account under discussion, they are cases of negative relevance, and yet many of them, at least by many people, are confidently judged to be cases of positive relevance. Of course, such cases are by their nature troublesome and controversial. Unlike Sassan and Raccoon, these may be cases of “spoils to the victor”—cases we should classify in whatever way the otherwise best theory does.[25] The “acting on” account could fairly easily be adapted so that it treated such “safety net” cases as cases of positive relevance. Instead of insisting on one or another version of that account, let me outline three versions of it.

  1. According to the first, safety net cases are cases of negative relevance because, although the agent acts on the net, the net does not act on the victim.
  2. According to the second, they are cases of positive relevance because the agent acts on the net (physical forces run from the agent to the net) and the position of the net is a necessary part of the causal explanation of the victim's death. More generally: The agent is positively relevant to an upshot U if the agent acts on X to produce feature F in X and Xs having F is a necessary part of the causal story leading to U.[26]
  3. According to the third version, it is not a clear case of positive relevance because although she acts on the net, the net does not act on the victim, but nor is it a clear case of negative relevance, because the relevance of her behavior to the upshot is not in terms of her failure to act on something. It is a borderline case.

I submit that this distinction between cases where the agent acts on the victim and cases where she does not is at least one strand in the complex tangle underlying our commonsense distinction between doing and allowing. If that is right, what are the moral implications? Not clear, I think, but this distinction does help explain our tendency to be more upset when we kill than when we let die. When physical forces run from the agent to the victim (even where the agent is uncontroversially innocent) there tends to be something like a jolt—as one experiences the death of which one is a causal factor. Consider a case where the victim jumps or is thrown in front of the agent's car. Although there is no question of the agent's guilt in this case, the event must feel more distressing to her than would a case where she is aware of a death that she cannot prevent.[27]

8. More on ‘Safety Net’ Cases

Jeff McMahan puts “safety net cases” front and center of his own account of the distinction, arguing that some of them qualify as killings and some as lettings die.[28] A number of factors distinguish the killings from the lettings die. “Among these are whether the person who terminates the aid or protection is the person who has provided it, whether the aid or protection is self-sustaining or requires more of the agent, and whether the aid or protection is operative or as yet inoperative.”[29] Here are three cases he discusses:

Convinced that (Burning Building 2) is importantly like (Burning Building 1), McMahan points out that sometimes one agent can act on behalf of another, or they can act as a team (e.g., of firefighters) so that whether it is the first or the second firefighter doesn't matter, since they are acting in a capacity that is “role-based”. In (Burning Building 3), however, where the second firefighter is motivated by malice against the victim, he is acting on his own and kills the victim.

The messy, somewhat ad hoc nature of McMahan's way of drawing the line is clearly a strike against it, as is the fact that it is clearly motivated by a desire to accommodate the moral intuition that killing is worse than letting die. If, however, some or all of the factors that McMahan lists as affecting the question of whether a case is one of killing or letting die can be seen to follow from some simpler, deeper account of the distinction, so much the better for that account and for McMahan's judgments about cases. Here's a way this might be done. It is somewhat arbitrary how we count actions—whether my typing the word ‘word’ involves four actions or just one, for example. Similarly, it is arbitrary whether the behavior of first writing a (potentially life-saving) check and then tearing it up count as a single action or as two. The simple action of tearing it up might be classified as a killing, whereas the complex ‘act’ of writing it and tearing it up might seem equivalent to the non-act of never writing it, and, hence, count as letting die. In asking whether the agent killed or let die in such a case, we may sometimes focus on the second (simple) act and sometimes on the complex act. Whether the two are performed by the same person, the time between the two, whether the first was self-sustaining, etc. all affect our choice here. It seems that Bennett's or the counterfactual account may, with minimal artifice, be modified so that most of the cases that McMahan wants to classify as lettings die are so classified. For example, we might consider what would have happened if the agent had not been present (during the entire period—including the time of writing the check and the time of tearing it up.) or we might consider whether most of the ways the agent could have behaved throughout the entire period would have had the result that upshot obtained.

McMahan's suggestion that the firefighter kills if he acts with a malicious intention, whereas he lets die if he acts with a good intention seems wrong, however. Whatever else we think about doing and allowing, we should be able to distinguish them without reference to internal mental states of the agent.

9. Conclusion

This discussion suggests, I think, that “the distinction between doing and allowing” does not refer uniquely. More likely, it refers indefinitely to a tissue of largely overlapping distinctions—such as Bennett's, the counterfactual account, and the transfer of energy account, in addition to, (if we like) complex, conjunctive distinctions like Quinn's or McMahan's. The fact that each account faces counterexamples may not show that each is incorrect, but simply that none is the unique distinction. In that case, it seems that the sensible approach is to acknowledge this variety of distinctions, and to ask with respect to each, whether it is morally significant.[30] I believe my discussion has shown that there is no decisive reason to say that any of these distinctions is morally significant, as long, that is, as we remember that intention plays no part in the distinction between doing and allowing harm. I have no doubt that the intention with which an agent acts can make a difference to the moral status of her act. (Exactly how is a big question—for another paper.) The claim that doing harm is no worse than allowing harm flies in the face of powerful intuitions to the contrary. I believe that these intuitions can be partially explained away by pointing to other morally significant distinctions (distinctions concerning intentions, difficulty or ease of avoiding the harm, etc) that often coincide with the distinction between doing and allowing harm. A residue remains, however, and we seem faced with a conflict between theory and intuitions about cases.


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I am grateful to Jonathan Bennett, Tom Downing, Dan Howard-Snyder, Hud Hudson, Phillip Montague, Alastair Norcross, John Hawthorne, Stuart Rachels and Kadri Vihvelin for comments on earlier drafts of this paper. I am also grateful to the Bureau for Faculty Research at Western Washington University for support while writing it.