Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Jonathan Edwards

First published Tue Jan 15, 2002; substantive revision Thu Aug 6, 2009

Jonathan Edwards (1703–1758) is widely acknowledged to be America's most important and original philosophical theologian. His work as a whole is an expression of two themes — the absolute sovereignty of God and the beauty of God's holiness. The first is articulated in Edwards' defense of theological determinism, in a doctrine of occasionalism, and in his insistence that physical objects are only collections of sensible “ideas” while finite minds are mere assemblages of “thoughts” or “perceptions.” As the only real cause or substance underlying physical and mental phenomena, God is “being in general,” the “sum of all being.”

Edwards' second theme is articulated in accounts of God's end in creation, and of the nature of true virtue and true beauty. God creates in order to manifest a holiness which consists in a benevolence which alone is truly beautiful. Genuine human virtue is an imitation of divine benevolence and all finite beauty is an image of divine loveliness. True virtue is needed to discern this beauty, however, and to reason rightly about “divine things.”

Edwards' projected History of Redemption would have drawn these themes together, for it is in his redemptive work in history that God's sovereignty, holiness, and beauty are most clearly exhibited.

1. Life

Edwards was born into a family of prominent Congregational ministers in East Windsor, Connecticut in 1703. In 1716 Edwards enrolled in Yale where he read Newton and Locke, and began “Notes on the Mind” and “Notes on Natural Science.” Locke's influence on his epistemology, philosophy of language, and philosophical psychology was profound. Edwards' metaphysics, however, appears more strongly influenced by Malebranche and, to a lesser extent, the Cambridge Platonists, and bears little resemblance to Locke's. After briefly serving congregations in New York and Bolton, Connecticut, Edwards returned to Yale where he completed his Masters of Arts degree and became senior tutor in 1724. In 1725, the church in Northampton chose Edwards to succeed his grandfather, Solomon Stoddard — the so-called “pope of the Connecticut valley.” The most notable events of his tenure were the revivals of 1734 and 1740–41, the latter of which came to be known as the Great Awakening. Edwards' defense of the revivals and criticisms of its excesses culminated in his first major treatise, the Religious Affections (1746). Worsening relations with his congregation came to a head in a dispute over qualifications for church membership. Rejecting the less rigorous standards of his grandfather, Edwards insisted on a public profession of saving faith based on the candidate's religious experiences as a qualification not only for Holy Communion but also for church membership. He was dismissed in 1750 by a margin of one vote. After refusing invitations to pulpits in North America and Scotland, Edwards retreated to the Indian mission at Stockbridge where he had charge of two difficult congregations, supervised a boarding school for Indian boys, and completed his last major works — Freedom of the Will (1754), Original Sin (1758), End of Creation, and True Virtue (both published posthumously in 1765). Edwards accepted an appointment as President of the College of New Jersey (now Princeton) in 1757. He died from complications arising from a smallpox inoculation on March 22, 1758, less than five weeks after his inauguration. Edwards' published works were primarily designed to defend the Puritan version of Calvinist orthodoxy and his influence on Congregational and Presbyterian theology was profound. His extensive notebooks reveal an interest in philosophical problems for their own sake, however, and his deployment of philosophical arguments in his private papers and published works are both sophisticated and frequently original.

2. Metaphysics

2.1 Theological Determinism

Edwards believed that indeterminism is incompatible with our dependence on God and hence with his sovereignty. If our responses to God's grace are contra-causally free, then our salvation depends partly on us and God's sovereignty isn't “absolute and universal.” Freedom of the Will defends theological determinism. Edwards begins by attempting to show that libertarianism is incoherent. For example, he argues that by ‘self-determination’ the libertarian must mean either that one's actions including one's acts of willing are preceded by an act of free will or that one's acts of will lack sufficient causes. The first leads to an infinite regress while the second implies that acts of will happen accidentally and hence can't make someone “better or worse, any more than a tree is better than other trees because it oftener happens to be lit upon by a swan or nightingale; or a rock more vicious than other rocks, because rattlesnakes have happened oftener to crawl over it” (Freedom of the Will, 1754; Edwards 1957–, vol. 1, 327). On the second alternative, acts of choosing (volitions) are neither chosen by us nor determined by reasons or our character or by other states of the soul. But if they are not, then they aren't truly ours and we cannot be held responsible for them. Edwards also argues that libertarianism is inconsistent with ordinary moral concepts. If, for example, the necessity of sinning wholly excuses, then a bias to sin should partially excuse. But it doesn't; a person who acts from settled habits of maliciousness is deemed “so much the more worthy to be detested and condemned” (Freedom of the Will, 1754; Edwards 1957–, vol. 1, 360). Since libertarianism implies that necessity excuses, it is inconsistent with the way we attribute blame.

In Edwards' opinion, libertarianism's specious aura of plausibility is grounded in a systematic confusion of “philosophical” and “vulgar” (ordinary) usage. For example, in ordinary usage something (e.g., remaining seated) is said to be “necessary to us…when we can't help it, let us do what we will” (Freedom of the Will, 1754; Edwards 1957–, vol. 1, 150). Causal necessity doesn't entail “vulgar necessity,” however. Ingrained habits, deeply felt resentment, and the like may causally necessitate a malicious action. It doesn't follow that the agent wouldn't have refrained from acting maliciously if she had chosen not to act maliciously. Hence, the fact that she was causally unable to act other than she did does not imply that she was unable to do so in the “vulgar” or ordinary sense. Libertarians are therefore mistaken in thinking that because vulgar necessity excuses, so does causal necessity. Again, ‘freedom’ or ‘liberty’ in common speech refer only to “that power and opportunity for one to do and conduct as he will, or according to his choice,” and contains no reference to the “cause or original” of the act of will (Freedom of the Will, 1754; Edwards 1957–vol. 1, 163-64). Hence, that liberty in the ordinary sense is essential to moral agency does not entail that contra-causal freedom is. It is also important to note that action in the ordinary sense is “some motion or exertion of power, that is voluntary, or that is the effect of the will…[the term is] most commonly used to signify outward actions” (Freedom of the Will, 1754; Edwards 1957–, vol. 1, 346). Improperly extending the term ‘action’ to movements of the will has led some libertarians to conclude that since external behavior must be preceded by an act of will to be voluntary, and an appropriate object of moral appraisal, so too must acts of will. A consequence is the libertarian's misleading talk of the will's self-determination.

Edwards' principle reasons for theological determinism are God's sovereignty, the principle of sufficient reason (which requires that everything that begins to be have a complete cause), the nature of motivation, and God's foreknowledge. The latter two are discussed at length.

The argument from motivation depends upon Edwards' identification of willing or choosing with one's strongest inclination or preference. Since choosing just is a prevailing inclination, it is logically impossible to choose in the absence of a prevailing motive. If there is a prevailing motive, however, then the will is necessarily determined by it, for if the will were to choose contrary to a prevailing motive, the agent would have two opposed preponderant inclinations at the same time. All choices, therefore, are necessarily determined.

Edwards' most impressive arguments from divine foreknowledge are based on the impossibility of knowing future contingents and on the necessity of the past. One knows p only if one has evidence for it, and evidence “must be one of…two sorts, either self-evidence or proof.” Propositions about future contingents can't be self-evident, however, because the states of affairs they represent are neither present to the mind nor necessary. But they can't be proved either, for if the state of affairs expressed by the proposition is genuinely contingent, “there is nothing now existent with which the future existence of the contingent event is [necessarily] connected.” Future contingents are thus necessarily unknowable (Freedom of the Will, 1754; Edwards 1957–, vol. 1, 259). Since God's knowledge of the future is comprehensive, it follows that no future event (and so no future human action) is genuinely contingent.

The conclusion also follows from the necessity of the past. Suppose I make a decision D at time t. Since God is omniscient, he has always believed that D occurs at t. Since he can't be mistaken, God's believing at some earlier time tn that D occurs at t entails that D occurs at t. But God's forebelief is past in relation to t and is therefore “now necessary” in the sense that nothing done at t can alter it. What is entailed by a necessary fact is itself necessary, however. Therefore, D could not fail to occur at t. Nor can one evade this conclusion by appealing to God's timelessness as some do. For even if God's ‘forebeliefs’ are timeless and so don't precede the events they are about, divinely inspired prophecies are not. Yet divinely inspired prophecies, too, are necessarily connected with the human actions they foretell and they are clearly past (and hence necessary) in relation to them.

Necessity is consistent with moral responsibility, however. We are said to be responsible for our actions when we act as we choose and determinism does not deny that our actions often spring from our choices. Nor is necessity incompatible with praise and blame. Even though God and Christ necessarily act for the best, their actions are eminently praiseworthy.

It is worth noting that the aim of Edwards' philosophically sophisticated arguments is theological. He saw that

if modern divines…can maintain their peculiar notion of freedom, consisting in the self-determining power of the will, as necessary to moral agency…, then they have an impregnable castle, to which they may repair, and remain invincible, in all the controversies they have with the reformed divines concerning original sin, the sovereignty of grace, election…, and other principles of the like kind. (Original Sin, 1758; Edwards 1957–, vol. 3, 376)

Edwards recognizes that “modern divines” pretend that doctrines like these undermine “the very foundation of all religion and morality” (Freedom of the Will, 1754; Edwards 1957, vol. 1, 422). Freedom of the Will concludes by arguing that, on the contrary, they do a much better job of supporting them.

2.2 Occasionalism, Idealism, Mental Phenomenalism, and Views on Identity

Edwards' occasionalism, idealism, and mental phenomenalism provide a philosophical interpretation of God's absolute sovereignty: God is the only real cause and the only true substance.

Edwards implicitly distinguishes between a real or true cause and a cause in the ordinary or “vulgar” sense. The latter is “that, after or upon the existence of which, or the existence of it after such a manner, the existence of another thing follows” (“The Mind,” no. 26; Edwards 1957–, vol. 6, 350). Vulgar causes aren't real causes, however. In the first place, so-called second causes are spatially or temporally distinct from their effects, and “no [real] cause can produce effects in a time and place on which itself is not” (Original Sin, 1758; Edwards 1957–, vol. 3, 400). In the second, real causes necessitate their effects and second causes do not. “It don't at all necessarily follow,” for example, “that because there was…color, or resistance,…or thought, or any other dependent thing at the last moment, that therefore there shall be the like at the next” (Original Sin, 1758; Edwards 1957–, vol. 3, 404). Finally, if second causes were real causes they would be sufficient to produce their effects. If they were sufficient, however, then God's activity would be redundant and it is not. Unlike second causes, God's causal activity meets all three conditions. Since God is not in time or space, there is no temporal or spatial separation between his activity and its effects. Since God is essentially omnipotent, his will is necessarily effective; it is logically impossible for him to will s and s not take place. The third condition is also met. Because God is omnipotent he doesn't need the cooperation of other causal powers to produce his effects. And because sovereignty belongs to him alone he doesn't share his causal power with others. God's decrees are thus fully sufficient for their effects. God alone, then, is the only real cause. Vulgar causes (e.g., heating water) are simply the occasions upon which God produces effects (e.g., the water's boiling) according to “methods and laws” which express his customary manner of acting.

In an early paper (“Of Atoms”) Edwards pointed out that the concept of a material substance is the concept of something subsisting by itself, standing “underneath,” and keeping “up solidity and all other [physical] properties” (Edwards 1957–, vol. 6, 215). He then argued that God alone meets these conditions, and concluded that if the concept of material substance refers to anything, it refers to God's causal activity.

Edwards also thought that “nothing has existence any where else…but either in created or uncreated consciousness.” It follows that “the material universe exists only in the mind;” “the existence of all corporeal things is only ideas” (“Of Being,” “The Mind,” no. 51, and “Miscellanies,” no. 179; Edwards 1957, vol. 6, 204, 368, and vol. 13, 327).

Edwards' arguments for idealism are similar to (but apparently uninfluenced by) Berkeley's. One of the best examples occurs in “The Mind,” no. 27. Edwards first argues that the idea of a body can be resolved into ideas of color and resistance. Figure, for example, is the termination of color or resistance. Solidity is resistance, while motion is “the communication of this resistance from space to space.” “Every knowing philosopher” agrees that colors exist only in minds. ‘Resistance’ refers either to instances in which one body resists another or to a power, namely, a body's disposition to resist other bodies. The first is a mode or property of ideas; it is ideas which are “resisted…move and stop, and rebound.” For example, our observation of a billiard ball's ricocheting from the cushion can be resolved into impressions of a particular configuration of color and figure (the billiard ball) moving closer to another (the cushion), touching it, and then moving away from it. The power of resistance is no more than a divine “establishment,” namely, “the constant law or method” of “the actual exertion of God's power” producing instances of resistance. So instances of resistance are qualities of ideas and the power of resistance is a stable divine intention to act in certain ways. Resistance, therefore, exists only in relation to minds. Since the idea of a body can be reduced to ideas of color and resistance, and color and resistance have only mental existence, “the world is…an ideal one” (Edwards 1957–, vol. 6, 350–51).

Edwards' mental phenomenalism is a natural extension of his occasionalism and views on substance. If God is the only real cause of spatio-temporal phenomena, he is the only real cause of “thoughts” or “perceptions.” If a substance is what “subsists by itself,” “stands underneath,” and “keeps up” a set of properties, then a mental substance can only be what subsists by itself, stands underneath, and keeps up mental properties. It follows that the concept of mental substance either denotes nothing or refers to God's causal activity. “What we call spirit,” then, “is nothing but a composition and series of perceptions [mental events]…connected by…laws” (“Notes on Knowledge and Existence”; Edwards 1957–, vol. 6, 398).

Mental and physical substance are thus identical with God's causal production of the mental events constituting minds and the sensible ideas or “sensations” which constitute bodies “according to…methods and laws ” which he has freely established (“The Mind,” no. 13; Edwards 1957–, vol. 6, 344). God is thus the only true substance as well as the only true cause.

God's sovereignty also extends to criteria of identity. “Species” (kinds or natures) are the ways we classify things. But our classifications depend on our needs and interests, and the character of the world we live in. Hence, in determining every feature of the spatio-temporal world, God has determined how things will be classified, that is, what counts as a “species” or kind. Since a thing's criteria of identity are determined by its nature or kind, God is their ultimate ground. In short, laws determine kinds and kinds determine criteria of identity. In determining laws God has therefore determined criteria of identity. (One implication is that God can so arrange things that Adam and his posterity count as one thing for purposes of punishment and reward.)

2.3 God as Being in General

God is “being in general.” He “is the sum of all being, and there is no being without his being; all things are in him and he in all” (“Miscellanies,” no. 880; Edwards 1957–, vol. 20, 122). Edwards appears to have borrowed the phrase “being in general” from Malebranche. What does he mean by it?

He does not mean that God is the power of being or being as such as earlier commentators like Clyde Holbrook and Douglas Elwood have suggested. God is neither a power nor a universal but a concrete entity or substance — a necessarily existing “intelligent willing agent such as our souls, only without our imperfections, and not some inconceivable, unintelligent, necessary agent” (“Miscellanies,” no. 383; Edwards 1957–, vol. 13, 452).

True Virtue associates being with capacity or power, and asserts that “degree of existence” is a function of “greater capacity or power,” of having “every faculty and every positive quality in an higher degree. An archangel must be supposed to have more existence, and to be every way further removed from nonentity than a worm or a flea” (True Virtue, 1765; Edwards 1957–, vol. 8, 546). Miscellany 94 identifies perfect entity and perfect activity:

God is a pure act…because that which acts perfectly is all act, and nothing but act. There is an image of this in created beings that approach to perfect action.“ Thus, ”the saints of heaven are all transfigured into love. dissolved into joy, become activity itself, changed into mere ecstasy. (Edwards 1957–, vol. 13, 260f.)

“An Essay on the Trinity” argues that God's essence is a love which subsists “in pure act and perfect energy,” his holy will or activity (Edwards 1957–, vol. 21, 113–14, 122). “Of Being” and “The Mind,” no. 45 identify being with consciousness. “Perceiving being only is properly being” (Edwards 1957–, vol. 6, 363). Although Edwards never systematically developed or integrated these scattered observations, their drift is toward the identification of being with mind in act, and of degree of being with degree of mind or consciousness and the comparative perfection of the activity in which it is engaged. God's consciousness and power are unlimited, and his activity is perfect. His being is therefore unlimited.

Why, though, is God being in general? Because finite beings are absolutely and immediately dependent upon him for both their being and properties. Indeed, as the only true substance and only true cause, created beings are no more than God's “shadows” or “images.” (While “particular minds” deliberate and choose, and so possess a kind of agency, they lack real power and are thus no more than images of divine agency. Because they lack not only power but also consciousness and will, bodies are even further removed from real agency and hence are, as Edwards says, mere shadows of being.) As the only true substance and only true cause, God is the “head” of the system of beings, its “chief part,” an absolute sovereign whose power and perfection are so great that “all other beings are as nothing to him, and all other excellency…as nothing and less than nothing,…in comparison of his” (End of Creation, 1765; Edwards 1957–, vol. 8, 451). “The whole system of created beings in comparison of him is as the light dust of the balance” (“Miscellanies,” no. 1208; Edwards 1957–, vol. 23, 133). ‘Being in general,’ then, refers to the system of beings — primarily to God but to “particular beings,” too, in so far as they depend upon and more or less adequately reflect him.

The claim that God is the only real substance, the “proper entity” of things, has led to accusations of pantheism. Students of Edwards have responded by insisting on a distinction in Edwards between God and creatures. The distinction is real but insufficient to refute charges of pantheism. For, historically, pantheisms do not identify the divine with nature as such but, rather, with nature's substance or essence or inner being or power. Natural phenomena aren't identical with the divine. They are its modes or properties or parts. Edwards clearly believes that God is the world's real substance. However, the sense of his assertion is very different from that of the pantheists. In claiming that God is the world's substance Edwards means that God's decrees are the only cause of an entity's being and characteristics. He isn't a pantheist because the relation between God and the world is construed as a relation between a creative volition and its immediate effects. Edwards' model is not a whole and its parts, or a substance (a bearer of properties) and its properties, or an essence and its accidents, but agent causality.

2.4 God's End in Creation

Edwards never doubted that God's end is himself. Since true virtue consists in benevolence to being and “complacence” or delight in moral excellence, and since God is the “chief part” of being and the fount of all excellence, a truly virtuous agent “must necessarily have a supreme love to God, both of benevolence and complacence” (True Virtue, 1765; Edwards 1957–, vol. 8, 551). It follows that God's rectitude and holiness “chiefly consists in a respect or regard to himself, infinitely above his regard to all other beings” and that, as a consequence, his works must be “so wrought as to show this supreme respect to himself” (End of Creation, 1765; Edwards 1957–, vol. 8, 422). God's ultimate aim in all his works must therefore be himself. Edwards concludes that he creates the world for his own glory. But Edwards also believed that because the essence of goodness is to communicate good for it own sake, “happiness is the end of the creation” (“Miscellanies,” no. 3; Edwards 1957–, vol. 13, 199).

End of Creation reconciles these claims. God's glory is defined as “the emanation and true external expression of God's internal glory and fullness.” It includes (1) “the exercise of God's perfections to produce a proper effect,” (2) “the manifestation of his internal glory to created understandings,” (3) “the communication of the infinite fullness of God to the creature,” and (4) “the creature's high esteem of God, love to God, and complacence and joy in God; and the proper exercises and expressions of these” (End of Creation, 1765; Edwards 1957–, vol. 8, 527).

There is no ontological distinction between the first and third “parts” of God's glory since the principal effect of God's exercising his perfections is “his fullness communicated.” Furthermore, the third part includes the second and fourth. For God's internal fullness or glory is the “fullness of his understanding consisting in his knowledge” of himself “and the fullness of his will consisting in his virtue and happiness.” His “external glory…consists in the communication of these,” i. e., in bringing it about that “particular minds” know and love God, and delight in him. The four “parts” are thus “one thing, in a variety of views and relations” (End of Creation, 1765; Edwards 1957–, vol. 8, 527).

In pursuing his own glory, God thus takes both himself and the creature's good as ultimate aims. Happiness consists in the knowledge and love of God, and joy in him. The creature's happiness is an ultimate end because it is included in God's ultimate end, namely, the communication of his internal glory “ad extra;” rather than being a means to God's glory, it is part of it.

An apparent consequence is that God must create a world to display his glory. End of Creation contends both that God's perfections include “a propensity of nature to diffuse of his own fullness” and that it isn't “possible for him to be hindered in the exercise of his goodness and his other perfections in their proper effect.” (End of Creation, 1765; Edwards 1957–, vol. 8, 447) It follows that God must diffuse his own fullness, i. e., God must create. Edwards also appears committed to the claim that God necessarily creates this world (call it w*). God necessarily does what is “fittest and best.” It is thus necessarily true that God creates the best possible world. Now God has created w*. Hence, w* is the best possible world. ‘Being the best possible world’ is an essential property of whatever world has it, however. It is therefore necessarily true that w* is the best possible world. It follows that it is necessarily true that God creates w*.

Whether Edwards was aware of these consequences is uncertain. The two most common objections to them, however, — that they imply that there isn't any real contingency and that God isn't free — would not have troubled him. For Edwards thought that our world displays neither contra-causal freedom nor real indeterminacy. He also believed that moral agency and freedom are compatible with metaphysical necessity. God can only do what is “fittest and best.” He is nevertheless free in the sense that he is aware of alternatives (the array of possible worlds), has the ability (i. e., the power and “skill”) to actualize any of them, is neither forced, constrained nor influenced by any other being, and does precisely what he wishes. Edwards believes that this is the only kind of freedom that is either relevant to moral agency or worth having.

3. Value Theory

3.1 Ethics

True virtue aims at the good of being in general and therefore also prizes the disposition that promotes it. Truly virtuous people thus love two things — being and benevolence. They not only value benevolence because it promotes the general good, however; they also “relish” or delight in it for its own sake. Hence, while virtue “most essentially consists in benevolence to being” (True Virtue, 1765; Edwards 1957–, vol. 8, 540), in a wider sense it includes not only benevolence but also “complacence” in benevolence's intrinsic excellence or beauty.

God, though, “is infinitely the greatest being,” and “infinitely the most beautiful and excellent.” True virtue thus principally consists “in a supreme love to God, both of benevolence and complacence” (True Virtue, 1765; Edwards 1957–, vol. 8, 550-51). It follows that “a determination of mind to union and benevolence to a particular person or private system [whether one's self, one's family, one's nation, or even humanity], which is but a small part of the universal system of being…is not of the nature of true virtue” unless it is dependent on or “subordinate to, benevolence to Being in general” (True Virtue, 1765; Edwards 1957–, vol. 8, 554).

One of the principal concerns of Shaftesbury, Hutcheson, et al., was to refute the contention that action is always motivated by self-love. Edwards' attitude toward these attempts is ambivalent. On the one hand, he denies that the truly benevolent are motivated by self-love. On the other, Edwards argues (against, e.g., Hutcheson) that most conscientious and other regarding behavior is, indeed, a form of self-love and that, in any case, acts motivated by rational self-love, conscience, or natural other regarding instincts such as parental affection or pity aren't genuinely virtuous.

Conscience, for instance, is the product of a power of placing ourselves in the situation of others (which is needed for any sort of mutual understanding), a sense of the natural fitness of certain responses (injury and punishment or disapproval, benefit and reward or approval), and self-love. Placing ourselves in the situation of those we have injured, we recognize that being treated in that way would not merely anger us but seem unfitting or undeserved, and that we are therefore inconsistent in approving of our treating others in ways we would not wish to be treated ourselves. The result is a sense of “inconsistence” or “self-opposition” between feelings of approval and disapproval toward the same action. This makes us “uneasy” since “self-love implies an inclination to feel and act as one with ourselves” (True Virtue, 1765; Edwards 1957–, vol. 8, 589).

What, though, about instinctual other regarding impulses such as parental affection, “mutual affection between the sexes” (as distinct from simple sexual attraction), and pity? Edwards is inclined to think that all except pity are forms of self-love. The important point, however, is that even if they aren't, actions motivated by them aren't truly virtuous. To see why consider pity. If truly virtuous actions are motivated by benevolence to being in general, then actions motivated by other regarded impulses which are ultimately directed to “some particular persons or private system” aren't truly virtuous (True Virtue, 1765; Edwards 1957–, vol. 8, 601). Now pity is directed to those in extreme distress whose suffering appears undeserved or excessive. Its object is therefore restricted to only part of being in general. Furthermore, since instinctual affections aren't “dependent” on “general benevolence,” they are in potential conflict with it. Pity, for example, may motivate a judge to act unjustly.

We should not conclude that pity or other instinctual affections, or even rational self-love, are bad. Since they tend toward “the preservation of mankind and their comfortably subsisting in the world,” things would be much worse without them (True Virtue, 1765; Edwards 1957–, vol. 8, 600). Edwards point (like Kant's) is merely that their goodness isn't a truly moral goodness. The implication is nonetheless clear. Natural virtues are either tainted with self-love or fail to extend to being in general. They are therefore counterfeits or simulacra of true virtue. While they prompt us to promote the good of others, and to condemn vice, they fall infinitely “short of the extent of true virtuous benevolence, both in…nature and object” (True Virtue, 1765; Edwards 1957–, vol. 8, 609). Edwards concludes that true virtue is a supernatural gift.

3.2 Aesthetics

In Edwards' view, beauty or “excellency” “consists in the similarness of one being to another — not merely equality and proportion, but any kind of similarness….This is an universal definition of excellency: The consent of being to being…” (“The Mind,” no. 1; Edwards 1957–, vol. 6, 336). One who loves others, for instance, or actively desires their welfare, “agrees” with them or “consents” to them. Love's scope can be narrower or wider, however. Agreement or consent is “comprehensive” or “universal” only when directed towards being in general. Only true benevolence, therefore, is truly beautiful.

“Secondary” beauty is a mere “image” or “resemblance” of true beauty. It consists in “symmetry,” “harmony,” or “proportion,” or “as Mr. Hutcheson” says, in “agreement of different things in form, manner, quantity, and visible end or design,” i.e., in “regularity.” The beauty of well-ordered societies, of “wisdom…consisting in the united tendency of thoughts, ideas, and particular volitions to one general purpose,” of the natural fitness of actions and circumstances (having made a promise, for example, and keeping it), “of a building, of a flower, or of the rainbow” are examples (True Virtue, 1765; Edwards 1957–, vol. 8, 561-62).

Since God's benevolence alone is perfect, he is the only thing that is (truly) beautiful without qualification. The fitness of God's dispensations, the harmony of his providential design, and so on, also exhibit the highest degree of secondary beauty. God is thus “infinitely the most beautiful and excellent,” the measure of both primary and secondary beauty. Moreover, he is the “foundation and fountain of all beauty.” “All the beauty to be found throughout the whole creation is…the reflection of the diffused beams of that being who hath an infinite fullness of brightness and glory” (True Virtue, 1765; Edwards 1957–, vol. 8, 550-51). And God's world is indeed saturated with beauty — not only the “harmony of sounds, and the beauties of nature” (which bear the greatest resemblance to true or primary beauty, and to which Edwards was especially sensitive) but also (and primarily) the beauty of the Gospel, of God's providential work in history, and of the saints (the elect). The saints alone, however, can discern true beauty.

4. Epistemology

4.1 A Sense of the Heart

Because their hearts have been regenerated by the indwelling of the Holy Spirit, the saints love being in general. Their love is the basis of a new “spiritual sense” whose “immediate object” is “the beauty of holiness” — a “new simple idea” that can't “be produced by exalting, varying or compounding” ideas “which they had before,” and that truly “represents” divine reality (Religious Affections, 1746 and True Virtue, 1765; Edwards 1957–, vol. 2, 205, 260, and vol. 8, 622).

Edwards sometimes identifies true beauty with the pleasure that holy things evoke in people with spiritual “frames” or “tempers” or with the tendency they have to evoke it. At other times he identifies it with the consent of being to being, i.e., with true benevolence or holiness. His view appears to be this. True beauty is identical with benevolence or agreement in somewhat the same way in which water is identical with H2O or heat with molecular motion. But benevolence is also the objective basis of a dispositional property, namely, a tendency to produce a new simple idea in the savingly converted. This idea is a delight or pleasure in being's consent to being which somehow “represents” or is a “perception” of it. Edwards' account of true beauty thus resembles some accounts of color or extension. Spiritual delight is a simple idea or sensation like our ideas of color or extension. The dispositional property is a power objects have to produce these ideas in our understandings. Benevolence is the objective configuration underlying this power and corresponds to the microstructure of bodies that underlie their tendency to excite ideas of color or extension in minds like ours. Like simple ideas of redness, say, or extension, the new spiritual sensation “represents” or is a “perception” of its object. Just as ‘red’ or ‘extension’ can refer to the idea, the power, or the physical configuration that is the basis of the power, so “true beauty” can refer to the spiritual sensation, to the relevant dispositional property, or to benevolence.

Edwards calls the new mode of spiritual understanding a “sense” because the apprehension of spiritual beauty is (1) non-inferential and (2) involuntary, and Edwards, like Hutcheson, associates sensation with immediacy and passivity. (3) It also involves relish or delight, and Edwards followed Locke and Hutcheson in thinking that, like a feeling of tactual pressure or an impression of redness, being pleased or pained is a kind of sensation or perception. Finally, (4) the new mode of understanding is the source of a new simple idea, and Edwards shared Locke's and Hutcheson's conviction that simple ideas come “from experience.”

The saints alone are in an epistemic position to discern truths of religion that are dependent on the “excellency of divine things”. For example, a conviction of Christ's sufficiency as a mediator depends on an apprehension of his beauty and excellency. Or, again, one must see the beauty of holiness to appreciate the “hatefulness of sin,” and thus be convinced of the justice of divine punishment and our inability to make restitution. The new sense also helps us grasp the truth of the gospel scheme as a whole. A conviction of its truth is an immediate inference from a perception of the beauty or splendor of what it depicts, namely, “God and Jesus Christ…the work of redemption, and the ways and works of God” (A Divine and Supernatural Light, 1734; Edwards 1957–, vol. 17, 413).

Edwards' defense of the objectivity of the new spiritual sense has four steps. (1) Benevolence agrees with the nature of things. The world is an interconnected system of minds and ideas in which the only true substance and cause is an infinite and omnipotent love. Human benevolence is thus an appropriate or fitting response to reality. (2) Benevolence is pleased by benevolence; it relishes it, or delights in it, for its own sake. Since benevolence is an appropriate response to reality, so too is benevolence's delight in benevolence. (3) But a delight in benevolence just is a perception of its spiritual beauty. It follows that (4) the redeemed's spiritual perceptions are veridical — “representations” of something “besides what [is] in [their] own minds” (True Virtue, 1765; Edwards 1957–, vol. 8, 622).

4.2 Sanctified Reason

Edwards thinks that reason can prove that God exists, establish many of his attributes, discern our obligations to him, and mount a probable case for the credibility of scripture. But he also believes that grace is needed both to help the natural principles “against those things that tend to stupefy [them] and to hinder [their] free exercise,” and to sanctify “the reasoning faculty and” assist “it to see the clear evidence there is of the truth of religion in rational arguments” (“Miscellanies,” nos. 626, 628; Edwards 1957–, vol. 18, 155, 156f).

His view is briefly this. “Actual ideas” are ideas that are lively, clear, and distinct. Thought has a tendency to substitute “signs” (i. e., words or images) for actual ideas. While this tendency is useful and normally quite harmless, it impedes reasoning when “we are at a loss concerning a connection or consequence [between ideas], or have a new inference to draw, or would see the force of some new argument” (“Miscellanies,” no. 782; Edwards 1957–, vol. 18, 457). Since accurate reasoning about a subject matter requires attending to actual ideas of it, one can't accurately reason about religion if one lack the relevant actual ideas. To have an actual idea of God, for example, one must have actual ideas of the ideas that compose it. But most of us don't. Those parts of the idea of God that everyone has (ideas of knowledge, power, and justice, for instance) either aren't attended to or, if they are, fail to elicit the appropriate affective reaction. In addition, we can't fully understand ideas of affections which we haven't experienced and so can't properly understand God's benevolence if we aren't benevolent ourselves. And without the simple idea of true beauty, one can understand neither God's holiness nor the facts that depend on it.

True benevolence remedies these deficiencies. Because the desires of the truly benevolent are properly ordered, they attend to ideas of religion and are suitably affected by the ideas of God's attributes and activities that everyone has. (They fear his wrath, for example, and are grateful for his benefits.) Furthermore, they understand God's benevolence because their own benevolence mirrors it. Finally, the truly benevolent delight in the benevolence in which holiness consists, i.e., they “perceive” or “taste” or “relish” its beauty. Edwards' claim, then, is that to reason accurately about God one must have an actual idea of him, and to have that one must be truly benevolent. Right reasoning about religious matters requires right affections.

Edwards is an evidentialist. Rational religious beliefs are either properly basic or rest on good evidence. A belief that the gospel scheme exhibits true beauty is an example of the former. But most religious beliefs depend on evidence. Sometimes this evidence includes the idea of true beauty. Even when it does not, however, the right affections are needed to appreciate its force. In either case, only those with properly disposed hearts can read the evidence correctly.

5. The History of Redemption

The trustees of the College of New Jersey invited Edwards to become its third president in 1753. In his reply Edwards gave a number of reasons why he hesitated to accept their offer. Among these was the fear that doing so would interfere with the completion of “a great work” which he had long contemplated “which I call a History of the Work of Redemption, a body of divinity in an entire new method, being thrown into the form of an history; considering the affair of Christian theology, as the whole of it, in each part, stands in reference to the great work of redemption by Jesus Christ…” (Edwards 1957–, vol. 16, 727f). Although Edwards' project was aborted by his untimely death, it would undoubtedly have been based on a sermon series delivered in 1739 which traces the work of redemption “from the fall of man to the end of the world.” The proposed history would have been the culmination of the project begun in True Virtue and End of Creation. For creation and providence are subordinate to a redemption which is itself subordinate only to God's glory. The history of redemption is “the summum and ultimum of all the divine operations and decrees,” the manifestation of God's internal glory in time (Edwards 1957–, vol. 16, 728). Edwards' History would also have provided a fitting climax to his intellectual career as a whole. For it is in his work of redemption that God's sovereignty, holiness, and splendor are most fully displayed.

It is doubtful, however, that Edwards' work would have anticipated modern historiography as some claim. For one thing, the sermon series is essentially a doctrinal work. (The section on Christ's earthly ministry, for instance, is a discussion of the incarnation and atonement, not a life of Jesus.) For another, Edwards' sources include not only biblical and “profane” histories but biblical prophecy as well. Finally, Edwards doesn't restrict himself to natural causes in explaining events but also appeals to divine decrees and typology.

Whatever novelty the sermon series possesses is literary and theological. It partly consists in the rich skein of images Edwards uses to connect the events of redemption history. These include the model of a river and its tributaries, a tree and its branches, the construction of a building, the conduct of war, and “a wheel,” or “a machine composed of wheels” with its reminiscences both of Ezekiel's vision of the divine throne chariot and of clockwork (“Images of Divine Things,” no. 89; Edwards 1957–, vol. 11, 86). It also consists in Edwards' extension of typology, the practice of interpreting things, persons, or events (the “type”) as symbols or prefigurations of future realities (the “antitype”). Protestant divines had tended to restrict typology to figures, actions, and objects in the Old Testament which in their view shadowed forth Christ as their antitype. Edwards interprets the New Testament typologically as well, arguing that relevant passages prefigure events in the church's later history. Most radically, Edwards construes nature typologically. (Whether this constitutes a step towards Emerson and Thoreau, as some claim, is a moot point.) Finally, Edwards' emphasis on the objective side of God's act of redemption is comparatively rare in a Puritanism which tended to stress the redemption's application to individual souls. (The subjective side is extensively treated in a number of works of the 1730s and 1740s, however, the most important of which is Religious Affections.)


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Berkeley, George | Cambridge Platonists | free will | Locke, John | Malebranche, Nicolas | occasionalism | omniscience | religious experience | Scottish Philosophy: in the 18th Century