Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Bayesian Epistemology

Probability Laws

There are many different versions of the probability laws. Probability can be defined over sentences or over sets; it can be defined as conditional or unconditional. This article assumes the following laws of unconditional probability defined over sentences:

(A1) All probabilities are between zero and one -- that is, for any sentence S: 0 ≤ P(S) ≤ 1.

(A2) Logical truths have probability one -- that is, for any logical truth L: P(L) = 1.

(A3) Where S and T, are mutually exclusive, the probability of S or T (ST) is the sum of their individual probabilities -- that is: P(ST) = P(S) + P(T).

Using these laws, it is possible to derive as theorems many of the standards truths of probability -- for example, that the probability of a sentence and its negation sum to one -- in other words: P(~S) = 1 − P(S).

(A3) is referred to as the Principle of Finite Additivity, because it involves only finite sums. Most mathematical treatments of probability require an extension of (A3) to cover countably infinite sums. The result is a Principle of Countable Additivity. The standard way of stating this axiom involves translating the axioms into set theory, where countably infinite unions (corresponding to infinite disjunctions) are defined. The relation to (A3) is clearer if one simply extends the ordinary notion of sentence to include infinitely long expressions formed in accordance with the formation rules of the language -- thus allowing for the possibility of infinite disjunctions:

(A4) Where S1, S2, … is a countably infinite sequence of mutually exclusive sentences: P(S1S2 ∨ … ) = P(S1) + P(S2) + … .

The discussion of the probability axioms in the text assumes only Finite Additivity, because it is only Axioms (A1)-(A3) that can be given a Dutch Book justification.

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